Quantum Field Theory

First published Thu Jun 22, 2006; substantive revision Mon Aug 10, 2020

Quantum Field Theory (QFT) is the mathematical and conceptual framework for contemporary elementary particle physics. It is also a framework used in other areas of theoretical physics, such as condensed matter physics and statistical mechanics. In a rather informal sense QFT is the extension of quantum mechanics (QM), dealing with particles, over to fields, i.e., systems with an infinite number of degrees of freedom. (See the entry on quantum mechanics.) In the last decade QFT has become a more widely discussed topic in philosophy of science, with questions ranging from methodology and semantics to ontology. QFT taken seriously in its metaphysical implications seems to give a picture of the world which is at variance with central classical conceptions of particles and fields, and even with some features of QM.

The following sketches how QFT describes fundamental physics and what the status of QFT is among other theories of physics. Since there is a strong emphasis on those aspects of the theory that are particularly important for interpretive inquiries, it does not replace an introduction to QFT as such. One main group of target readers are philosophers who want to get a first impression of some issues that may be of interest for their own work, another target group are physicists who are interested in a philosophical view upon QFT.

1. What is QFT?

In contrast to many other physical theories there is no canonical definition of what QFT is. Instead one can formulate a number of totally different explications, all of which have their merits and limits. One reason for this diversity is the fact that QFT has grown successively in a very complex way. Another reason is that the interpretation of QFT is particularly obscure, so that even the spectrum of options is not clear. Possibly the best and most comprehensive understanding of QFT is gained by dwelling on its relation to other physical theories, foremost with respect to QM, but also with respect to classical electrodynamics, Special Relativity Theory (SRT) and Solid State Physics or more generally Statistical Physics. However, the connection between QFT and these theories is also complex and cannot be neatly described step by step.

If one thinks of QM as the modern theory of one particle (or, perhaps, very few particles), one can then think of QFT as an extension of QM for the analysis of systems with many particles—and therefore with a large number of degrees of freedom. In this respect going from QM to QFT is not inevitable but rather beneficial for pragmatic reasons. However, a general threshold is crossed when it comes to fields, like the electromagnetic field, which are not merely difficult but impossible to deal with in the frame of QM. Thus the transition from QM to QFT allows treatment of both particles and fields within a uniform theoretical framework. (As an aside, focusing on the number of particles, or degrees of freedom respectively, explains why the famous renormalization group methods can be applied in QFT as well as in Statistical Physics. The reason is simply that both disciplines study systems with a large or an infinite number of degrees of freedom, either because one deals with fields, as does QFT, or because one studies the thermodynamic limit, a very useful artifice in Statistical Physics.) Moreover, issues regarding the number of particles under consideration yield yet another reason why we need to extend QM. Neither QM nor its immediate relativistic extension with the Klein-Gordon and Dirac equations can describe systems with a variable number of particles. However, obviously this is essential for a theory that is supposed to describe scattering processes, where particles of one kind are destroyed while others are created.

One gets a very different kind of access to what QFT is when focusing on its relation to QM and SRT. Historically, QFT resulted from the successful reconciliation of QM and SRT. In order to understand the initial problem one has to realize that QM is not only in a potential conflict with SRT, more exactly: the locality postulate of SRT, because of the famous EPR correlations of entangled quantum systems. There is also a manifest contradiction between QM and SRT on the level of the dynamics. The Schrödinger equation, i.e., the fundamental law for the temporal evolution of the quantum mechanical state function, cannot possibly obey the relativistic requirement that all physical laws of nature be invariant under Lorentz transformations. The Klein-Gordon and Dirac equations, resulting from the search for relativistic analogues of the Schrödinger equation in the 1920s, do respect the requirement of Lorentz invariance. Nevertheless, ultimately they are not satisfactory because they do not permit a description of fields in a principled quantum-mechanical way.

Fortunately, for various phenomena it is legitimate to neglect the postulates of SRT, namely when the relevant velocities are small in relation to the speed of light and when the kinetic energies of the particles are small compared to their mass energies \(mc^2\). And this is the reason why non-relativistic QM, although it cannot be the correct theory in the end, has its empirical successes. But it can never be the appropriate framework for electromagnetic phenomena because electrodynamics, which prominently encompasses a description of the behavior of light, is already relativistically invariant and therefore incompatible with non-relativistic QM. Relativistic scattering experiments are another context in which QM fails. Since the involved particles often travel close to the speed of light, relativistic effects can no longer be neglected. For that reason high-energy scattering experiments can only be correctly confronted by QFT.

Unfortunately, the catchy characterization of QFT as the successful merging of QM and SRT has its limits. On the one hand, as already mentioned above, there also is a relativistic QM, with the Klein-Gordon- and the Dirac-equation among their most famous results. On the other hand, and this may come as a surprise, it is possible to formulate a non-relativistic version of QFT (see Bain 2011). The nature of QFT thus cannot simply be that it reconciles QM with the requirement of relativistic invariance. Consequently, for a discriminating criterion it is more appropriate to say that only QFT, and not QM, allows describing systems with an infinite number of degrees of freedom, i.e., fields (and systems in the thermodynamic limit). According to this line of reasoning, QM would be the modern (as opposed to classical) theory of particles and QFT the modern theory of particles and fields. Unfortunately however, and this shall be the last turn, even this gloss is not untarnished. There is a widely discussed no-go theorem by Malament (1996) with the following proposed interpretation: Even the quantum mechanics of one single particle can only be consonant with the locality principle of special relativity theory in the framework of a field theory, such as QFT. Hence ultimately, the characterization of QFT, on the one hand, as the quantum physical description of systems with an infinite number of degrees of freedom, and on the other hand, as the only way of reconciling QM with special relativity theory, are intimately connected with one another.

theory diagram

Figure 1.

The diagram depicts the relations between different theories, where Non-Relativistic Quantum Field Theory is not a historical theory but rather an ex post construction that is illuminating for conceptual purposes. Theoretically, [(i), (ii), (iii)], [(ii), (i), (iii)] and [(ii), (iii), (i)] are three possible ways to get from Classical Mechanics to Relativistic Quantum Field Theory. But note that this is meant as a conceptual decomposition; history didn’t go all these steps separately. On the one hand, by good luck, so to say, Maxwell’s equations of classical electrodynamics were relativistically covariant from inception. The successful quantization of that theory lead directly to the early Relativistic Quantum Field Theories. On the other hand, some would argue (e.g., Malament 1996) that the only way to reconcile QM and SRT is in terms of a field theory, so that (ii) and (iii) would coincide. Note that the steps (i), (ii) and (iii), i.e., quantization, transition to an infinite number of degrees of freedom, and reconciliation with SRT, are all ontologically relevant. In other words, by these steps the nature of the physical entities the theories talk about may change fundamentally. See Huggett 2003 for an alternative three-dimensional “map of theories”.

Further Reading on QFT and Philosophy of QFT. Mandl and Shaw (2010), Peskin and Schroeder (1995), Weinberg (1995) and Weinberg (1996) are standard textbooks on QFT. Teller (1995) and Auyang (1995) are the first systematic monographs on the philosophy of QFT. The anthologies Brown and Harré (1988), Cao (1999) and Kuhlmann et al. (2002) are anthologies with contributions by physicists and philosophers (of physics), the last of which focuses on ontological issues. The literature on the philosophy of QFT has increased significantly in the last decade. Besides several papers there are a few new monographs, Cao (2010), Kuhlmann (2010), Ruetsche (2011) and Duncan (2012) and a special issue (May 2011) of Studies in History and Philosophy of Modern Physics. Bain (2011), Huggett (2000), Ruetsche (2002) and Swanson (2017) provide article length discussions on a number of issues in the philosophy of QFT.

See also the following supplementary document:

The History of QFT.

2. The Basic Structure of the Conventional Formulation

2.1 The Lagrangian Formulation of QFT

The crucial step towards quantum field theory is in some respects analogous to the corresponding quantization in quantum mechanics, namely by imposing commutation relations, which leads to operator valued quantum fields. The starting point is the classical Lagrangian formulation of mechanics, which is a so-called analytical formulation as opposed to the standard version of Newtonian mechanics. A generalized notion of momentum (the conjugate or canonical momentum) is defined by setting \(p = \partial L/\partial\dot{q}\), where \(L(q, \dot{q})\) is the Lagrange function, or Lagrangian. Here \(\dot{q}\equiv dq/dt\). The Lagrangian defines the theory, so it has no a-priori definition. The special case of the Newtonian theory is described by \(L = T - V\) (\(T\) is the Newtonian kinetic energy and \(V\) the potential). This fact can be motivated by looking at the special case of a Lagrange function with a potential \(V\) which depends only on the position so that (using Cartesian coordinates) \(\partial L/\partial\dot{x} = (\partial/\partial\dot{x})(m\dot{x}^2 /2) = m\dot{x} = p_x\). Under these conditions the generalized momentum coincides with the Newtonian mechanical momentum. In classical Lagrangian field theory one associates with the given field \(\phi\) a second field, namely the conjugate field

\[\tag{2.1} \pi = \partial \mathcal{L}/\partial\dot{\phi} \]

where \(\mathcal{L}\) is a Lagrangian density. The field \(\phi\) and its conjugate field \(\pi\) are the direct analogues of the canonical coordinate \(q\) and the generalized (canonical or conjugate) momentum \(p\) in classical mechanics of point particles.

In both cases, QM and QFT, requiring that the canonical variables satisfy certain commutation relations implies that the basic quantities become operator valued. From a physical point of view this shift implies a restriction of possible measurement values for physical quantities some (but not all) of which can have their values only in discrete steps now. In QFT the canonical commutation relations for a field \(\phi\) and the corresponding conjugate field \(\pi\) are

\[\begin{align} \tag{2.2} [\phi(\mathbf{x},t), \pi(\mathbf{y},t)] &= i\delta^3 (\mathbf{x} - \mathbf{y}) \\ [\phi(\mathbf{x},t), \phi(\mathbf{y},t)] &= [\pi(\mathbf{x},t), \pi(\mathbf{y},t)] = 0. \end{align}\]

Note these are equal-time commutation relations, i.e., these commutators refer to fields at the same time. It is not obvious that the equal-time commutation relations are Lorentz invariant but one can formulate a manifestly covariant form of the canonical commutation relations. The relations above apply to a bosonic field, like the Klein-Gordon field or the electromagnetic field. For a fermionic field, like the Dirac field for electrons, one has to use anticommutation relations.

While there are close analogies between quantization in QM and in QFT there are also important differences. Whereas the commutation relations in QM refer to a quantum object with three degrees of freedom, so that one has a set of 15 equations, the commutation relations in QFT do in fact comprise an infinite number of equations, namely for each of the infinitely many space-time 4-tuples \((\mathbf{x},t)\) there is a new set of commutation relations. This infinite number of degrees of freedom embodies the field character of QFT.

It is important to realize that the operator valued field \(\phi(\mathbf{x},t)\) in QFT is not analogous to the wavefunction \(\psi(\mathbf{x},t)\) in QM, i.e., the quantum mechanical state in its position representation. While the wavefunction in QM is acted upon by observables/operators, in QFT it is the (operator valued) field itself which acts on the space of states. In a certain sense the single particle wave functions have been transformed, via their reinterpretation as operator valued quantum fields, into observables. This step is sometimes called ‘second quantization’ because the single particle wave equations in relativistic QM already came about by a quantization procedure, e.g., in the case of the Klein-Gordon equation by replacing position and momentum by the corresponding quantum mechanical operators. Afterwards the solutions to these single particle wave equations, which are states in relativistic QM, are considered as classical fields, which can be subjected to the canonical quantization procedure of QFT. The term ‘second quantization’ has often been criticized partly because it blurs the important fact that the single particle wave function \(\phi\) in relativistic QM and the operator valued quantum field \(\phi\) are fundamentally different kinds of entities despite their connection in the context of discovery.

In conclusion, it must be emphasized that both in QM and QFT states and observables are equally important. However, to some extent their roles are switched. While states in QM can have a concrete spatio-temporal meaning in terms of probabilities for position measurements, in QFT states are abstract entities and it is the quantum field operators that seem to allow for a spatio-temporal interpretation. See the section on the field interpretation of QFT for a critical discussion.

2.2 Interaction

Up to this point, the aim was to develop a free field theory. Doing so does not only neglect interaction with other particles (fields), it is even unrealistic for one free particle because it interacts with the field that it generates itself. For the description of interactions—such as scattering in particle colliders—we need certain extensions and modifications of the formalism. The immediate contact between scattering experiments and QFT is given by the scattering or S-matrix which contains all the relevant predictive information about, e.g., scattering cross sections. There are many schemes to calculate the S-matrix, among which one introduces the Hamiltonian formalism. The Hamiltonian density can be derived from the Lagrangian density by means of a Legendre transformation.

To discuss interactions it is convenient to introduce a new representation, the interaction picture, which is an alternative to the Schrödinger and the Heisenberg picture. For the interaction picture one splits up the Hamiltonian, which is the generator of time-translations, into two parts \(H = H_0 + H_{\textit{int}}\), where \(H_0\) describes the free system, i.e., without interaction. It is solved exactly, and gets absorbed in a re-definition of the fields. Then \(H_{\textit{int}}\) is the interaction part of the Hamiltonian, or short the ‘interaction Hamiltonian.’ Using the interaction picture is advantageous because the equations of motion as well as, under certain conditions, the commutation relations are the same for interacting fields as for free fields. Therefore, various results that were established for free fields can still be used in the case of interacting fields. The central instrument for the description of scattering is again the S-matrix, which expresses the connection between in and out states by specifying the transition amplitudes. In QED, for instance, a state \(|\textit{in}\rangle\) describes one particular configuration of electrons, positrons and photons, i.e., it describes how many of these particles there are and which momenta, spins and polarizations they have before the interaction. The S-matrix supplies the transition amplitude that this state goes over to a particular \(|\textit{out}\rangle\) state, e.g., that a particular counter responds after the interaction. The transition amplitude is squared to form a probability, and such probabilities are checked in experiments.

The canonical formalism of QFT as introduced in the previous section is only applicable in the case of free fields since the inclusion of interaction leads to infinities (see the historical part). Since little of realistic models can be solved exactly, perturbation theory makes up a large part of most publications on QFT. The importance of perturbative methods is understandable realizing that they establish the immediate contact between theory and experiment. Although the techniques of perturbation theory have become ever more sophisticated it is somewhat disturbing that perturbative methods are difficult to avoid. Some have argued this is a matter of principle. (And on the other hand, physicists have been astonishingly creative in developing “toy models— that can be solved exactly, precisely to escape perturbation theory.) One reason for unease is that perturbation theory is felt to be rather a matter of (highly sophisticated) craftsmanship than of understanding nature. Accordingly, the corpus of perturbative methods plays a small role in philosophical investigations of QFT. Two recent exceptions are Fraser (2018) and Passon (2019). What does matter, however, is in which sense the consideration of realistic interactions affects the general framework of QFT. An overview about perturbation theory is given in section 4.1 (“Perturbation Theory—Philosophy and Examples”) of Peskin & Schroeder (1995).

2.3 Gauge Invariance

Some theories, in particular those of current particle physics, are distinguished by being gauge invariant, which means that gauge transformations of certain terms do not change any observable quantities. A gauge transformation is a local symmetry transformation, with parameters that are smooth functions of the position \(\mathbf{x}\) and time \(t\). Requiring gauge invariance provides an elegant and systematic way of introducing models for interacting fields. Moreover, gauge invariance plays an important role in selecting theories. The prime example of an intrinsically gauge invariant theory is electrodynamics. In the potential formulation of Maxwell’s equations one introduces the vector potential \(\mathbf{A}\) and the scalar potential \(\phi\), which are linked to the magnetic field \(\mathbf{B}(\mathbf{x},t)\) and the electric field \(\mathbf{E}(\mathbf{x},t)\) by

\[\begin{align} \tag{2.3} \mathbf{B} &= \nabla \times \mathbf{A} \\ \mathbf{E} &= -(\partial \mathbf{A}/\partial t) - \nabla \phi \end{align}\]

or covariantly

\[ \tag{2.4} F^{\mu \nu} = \partial^{\mu}A^{\nu} - \partial^{\nu}A^{\mu} \]

where \(F^{\mu \nu}\) is the electromagnetic field tensor and \(A^{\mu} = (\phi , \mathbf{A})\) the 4-vector potential. The important point in the present context is that given the identification (2.3), or (2.4), there remains a certain flexibility or freedom in the choice of \(\mathbf{A}\) and \(\phi\), or \(A^{\mu}\). In order to see that, consider the so-called gauge transformations

\[\begin{align} \tag{2.5} \mathbf{A} &\rightarrow \mathbf{A} - \nabla \psi \\ \phi &\rightarrow \phi + \partial \chi /\partial t \end{align}\]

or covariantly

\[\tag{2.6} A^{\mu} \rightarrow A^{\mu} + \partial^{\mu}\chi \]

where \(\chi\) is a scalar function (of space and time or of space-time) which can be chosen arbitrarily. Inserting the transformed potential(s) into equation(s) (2.3), or (2.4), one can see that the electric field \(\mathbf{E}\) and the magnetic field \(\mathbf{B}\), or covariantly the electromagnetic field tensor \(F^{\mu \nu}\), are not affected by a gauge transformation of the potential(s). Since only the electric field \(\mathbf{E}\) and the magnetic field \(\mathbf{B}\), and quantities constructed from them, are observable, whereas the vector potential itself is not, nothing physical seems to be changed by a gauge transformation because it leaves \(\mathbf{E}\) and \(\mathbf{B}\) unaltered. Note that gauge invariance is a kind of symmetry that does not come about by space-time transformations.

In order to link the notion of gauge invariance to the Lagrangian formulation of QFT one needs a more general form of gauge transformations which applies to the field operator \(\phi\) and which is supplied by

\[\begin{align} \tag{2.7} \phi &\rightarrow e^{-i\Lambda}\phi \\ \phi^* &\rightarrow e^{i\Lambda}\phi^* \end{align}\]

where \(\Lambda\) is an arbitrary real constant. Equations (2.7) describe a global gauge transformation whereas a local gauge transformation

\[\tag{2.8} \phi(x) \rightarrow e^{-i\alpha(x)}\phi(x) \]

varies with \(x\).

It turned out that requiring invariance under local gauge transformations supplies a systematic way for finding the equations describing fundamental interactions. For instance, starting with the Lagrangian for a free electron, the requirement of local gauge invariance can only be fulfilled by introducing additional terms, namely those for the electromagnetic field. Gauge invariance can be captured by certain symmetry groups: \(\mathrm{U}(1)\) for electromagnetic, \(\mathrm{SU}(2)\otimes\mathrm{U}(1)\) for electroweak and \(\mathrm{SU}(3)\) for strong interaction. This has become an important basis for unification programs, as is the analogy to general relativity where a local gauge symmetry (general covariance) leads to the Einstein-Hilbert theory of the gravitational field. Moreover, gauge invariant quantum field theories are generically renormalizable. (There are many renormalizable theories, but finding theories with massive vector fields was stopped for decades before gauge theories and the Higgs mechanism came into the fore.) All this can be taken to show that a mathematically rich framework, with surplus structures, can be very valuable in the construction of theories.

Auyang (1995) emphasizes the general conceptual significance of invariance principles; Redhead (2002) and Martin (2002) focus specifically on gauge symmetries. Healey (2007) and Lyre (2004 and 2012) discuss the ontological significance of gauge theories, among other things concerning the Aharanov-Bohm effect and ontic structural realism.

2.4 Effective Field Theories and Renormalization

In the 1970s a program emerged in which the theories of the standard model of elementary particle physics are considered as effective field theories (EFTs) which have a common quantum field theoretical framework. EFTs describe relevant phenomena only in a certain domain since the Lagrangian contains only those terms that describe particles which are relevant for the respective range of energy. EFTs are inherently approximative and change with the range of energy considered. EFTs are only applicable on a certain energy scale, i.e., they only describe phenomena in a certain range of energy. Influences from higher energy processes contribute to average values but they cannot be described in detail. This procedure has no severe consequences since the details of low-energy theories are largely decoupled from higher energy processes. Both domains are only connected by altered coupling constants and the renormalization group describes how the coupling constants depend on the energy.

The main idea of EFTs is that theories, i.e., in particular the Lagrangians, depend on the energy of the phenomena which are analysed. The physics changes by switching to a different energy scale, e.g., new particles can be created if a certain energy threshold is exceeded. The dependence of theories on the energy scale distinguishes QFT from, e.g., Newton’s theory of gravitation where the same law applies to an apple as well as to the moon. Nevertheless, laws from different energy scales are not completely independent of each other. A central aspect of considerations about this dependence are the consequences of higher energy processes on the low-energy scale.

On this background a new attitude towards renormalization developed in the 1970s, which revitalizes earlier ideas that divergences result from neglecting unknown processes of higher energies. Low-energy behavior is thus affected by higher energy processes. Since higher energies correspond to smaller distances this dependence is to be expected from an atomistic point of view. According to the reductionist program the dynamics of constituents on the microlevel should determine processes on the macrolevel, i.e., here the low-energy processes. However, as, for instance hydrodynamics shows, in practice theories from different levels are not quite as closely connected because a law which is applicable on the macrolevel can be largely independent of microlevel details. For this reason analogies with statistical mechanics play an important role in the discussion about EFTs. The basic idea of this new story about renormalization is that the influences of higher energy processes are localizable in a few structural properties which can be captured by an adjustment of parameters. “In this picture, the presence of infinities in quantum field theory is neither a disaster, nor an asset. It is simply a reminder of a practical limitation—we do not know what happens at distances much smaller than those we can look at directly” (Georgi 1989: 456). This new attitude supports the view that renormalization is the appropriate answer to the change of fundamental interactions when the QFT is applied to processes on different energy scales. The price one has to pay is that EFTs are only valid in a limited domain and should be considered as approximations to better theories on higher energy scales. This prompts the important question whether there is a last fundamental theory in this tower of EFTs which supersede each other with rising energies. Some people conjecture that this deeper theory could be a string theory, i.e., a theory which is not a field theory any more. Or should one ultimately expect from physics theories that they are only valid as approximations and in a limited domain? Hartmann (2001) and Castellani (2002) discuss the fate of reductionism vis-à-vis EFTs. Williams (2019) argues that EFTs by no means undermine a realist interpretation of QFT, provided one adopts a more refined notion of scientific realism. Wallace (2011) and Fraser (2011) discuss what the successful application of renormalization methods in quantum statistical mechanics means for their role in QFT, reaching very different conclusions. Egg et al. (2017) review that debate by comparing it to Bohmian QFT.

3. Beyond the Standard Model

The “standard model of elementary particle physics” is sometimes used almost synonymously with QFT. However, there is a crucial difference. While the standard model is a theory with a fixed ontology (understood in a prephilosophical sense), i.e., three fundamental forces and a certain number of elementary particles, QFT is rather a frame, the applicability of which is open. Thus while quantum chromodynamics (or ‘QED’) is a part of the standard model, it is an instance of a quantum field theory, or short “a quantum field theory” and not a part of QFT. This section deals with only some particularly important proposals that go beyond the standard model, but which do not necessarily break up the basic framework of QFT.

3.1 Quantum Gravity

The standard model of particle physics covers the electromagnetic, the weak and the strong interaction. However, the fourth fundamental force in nature, gravitation, has defied quantization so far. Although numerous attempts have been made in the last 80 years, and in particular very recently, there is no commonly accepted solution up to the present day. One basic problem is that the mass, length and time scales quantum gravity theories are dealing with are so extremely small that it is almost impossible to test the different proposals.

The most important extant versions of quantum gravity theories are canonical quantum gravity, loop theory and string theory. Canonical quantum gravity approaches leave the basic structure of QFT untouched and just extend the realm of QFT by quantizing gravity. Other approaches try to reconcile quantum theory and general relativity theory not by supplementing the reach of QFT but rather by changing QFT itself. String theory, for instance, proposes a completely new view concerning the most fundamental building blocks: It does not merely incorporate gravitation but it formulates a new theory that describes all four interactions in a unified way, namely in terms of strings (see next subsection).

While quantum gravity theories are very complicated and even more remote from classical thinking than QM, SRT and GRT, it is not so difficult to see why gravitation is far more difficult to deal with than the other three forces. Electromagnetic, weak and strong force all act in a given space-time. In contrast, gravitation is, according to GRT, not an interaction that takes place in time, but gravitational forces are identified with the curvature of space-time itself. Thus quantizing gravitation could amount to quantizing space-time, and it is not at all clear what that could mean. One controversial proposal is to deprive space-time of its fundamental status by showing how it “emerges ” in some non-spatio-temporal theory. The “emergence” of space-time then means that there are certain derived terms in the new theory that have some formal features commonly associated with space-time. See Kiefer (2007) for physical details, Rickles (2008) for an accessible and conceptually reflected introduction to quantum gravity and Wüthrich (2005) for a philosophical evaluation of the alleged need to quantize the gravitational field. Also, see the entry on quantum gravity.

3.2 String Theory

String theory is one of the most promising candidates for bridging the gap between QFT and general relativity theory by supplying a unified theory of all natural forces, including gravitation. The basic idea of string theory is not to take particles as fundamental objects but strings that are very small but extended in one dimension. This assumption has the pivotal consequence that strings interact on an extended distance and not at a point. This difference between string theory and standard QFT is essential because it is the reason why string theory also encompasses the gravitational force which is very difficult to deal with in the framework of QFT.

It is so hard to reconcile gravitation with QFT because the typical length scale of the gravitational force is very small, namely at Planck scale, so that the quantum field theoretical assumption of point-like interaction leads to untreatable infinities. To put it another way, gravitation becomes significant (in particular in comparison to strong interaction) exactly where QFT is most severely endangered by infinite quantities. The extended interaction of strings brings it about that such infinities can be avoided. In contrast to the entities in standard quantum physics strings are not characterized by quantum numbers but only by their geometrical and dynamical properties. Nevertheless, “macroscopically” strings look like quantum particles with quantum numbers. A basic geometrical distinction is the one between open strings, i.e., strings with two ends, and closed strings which are like bracelets. The central dynamical property of strings is their mode of excitation, i.e., how they vibrate.

Reservations about string theory are mostly due to the lack of testability since it seems that there are no empirical consequences which could be tested by the methods which are, at least up to now, available to us. The reason for this “problem” is that the length scale of strings is in the average the same as the one of quantum gravity, namely the Planck length of approximately \(10^{-33}\) centimeters which lies far beyond the accessibility of feasible particle experiments. But there are also other peculiar features of string theory which might be hard to swallow. One of them is the fact that preferred models of string theory need space-time with 10, 11 or even 26 dimensions. In order to explain the appearance of only four space-time dimensions string theory assumes that the other dimensions are somehow folded away or “compactified” so that they are no longer visible. An intuitive idea can be gained by thinking of a macaroni which is a tube, i.e., a two-dimensional piece of pasta rolled together, but which looks from the distance like a one-dimensional string.

Due to the problems of string theory, many physicists have abandoned it, but not all. Some think that, among the numerous alternative proposals for reconciling quantum physics and general relativity theory, string theory is still the best candidate, with “loop quantum gravity” as its strongest rival (see the entry on quantum gravity). Correspondingly, string theory has also received some attention within the philosophy of physics community in recent years. Probably the first philosophical investigation of string theory is Weingard (2001) in Callender & Huggett (2001), an anthology with further related articles. Dawid (2003) (see Other Internet Resources below) argues that string theory has significant consequences for the philosophical debate about realism, namely that it speaks against the plausibility of anti-realistic positions. Also see Dawid (2009). Johansson and Matsubara (2011) assess string theory from various different methodological perspectives, reaching conclusions in disagreement with Dawid (2009). Standard introductory monographs on string theory are Polchinski (2000) and Kaku (1999). Greene (1999) is a very successful popular introduction. An interactive website with a nice elementary introduction is ‘Stringtheory.com’ (see the Other Internet Resources section below).

4. Axiomatic Reformulations of QFT and their Interpretive Significance

There are three main motives for reformulating conventional QFT. The first motive is operationalism, the second one mathematical rigour and the third one finding a way to deal with the availability of inequivalent Hilbert space representations for systems with an infinite number of degrees of freedom, such as fields. While in principle the three motives are independent of one another there are multiple interconnections in their actual implementation. One way in which the three motives are connected is the following: In QFT the quests for operationalism and mathematical rigour seem to go hand in hand, i.e., the best means to achieve one is also the best way to achieve the other. Moreover, it leads to an algebraic formulation that avoids privileging one amoung various available inequivalent representations, which tacitly happens in conventional QFT.

4.1 Motive One: Operationalism

The first motive–operationalism–is not so higly valued any more today, and for good reasons (see entry on Operationalism). Nevertheless, it was, not only in physics, very strong in and around the 1950s, when axiomatic reformulations of QFT entered the scene. Accordingly, the impact of operationalism must not by overlooked. Already in the 1930s the problem of perturbative infinities (see Supplement “The History of QFT”) as well as the potentially heuristic status of the Lagrangian formulation of QFT stimulated the search for concise and ideally axiomatic reformulations. About a dacade later it became clear that operationalism and mathematical rigour may go hand in hand, because the setting of conventional QFT—where quantum fields are basic, with field values being assigned to points in spacetime—is both mathematically ill-defined and in conflict with the “operational” idea that the core elements of an empirical theory should be observable quantities, which can be measured by means of certain physical operations.

The mathematical aspect of the problem is that a field at a point, \(\phi (x)\), is not an operator on a Hilbert space. The physical counterpart of the problem is that it would require an infinite amount of energy to measure a field at a point of space-time. One way to handle this situation—and one of the starting points for axiomatic reformulations of QFT—is not to consider fields at a point but instead fields which are smeared out in the vicinity of that point using certain functions, so-called test functions. The result is a smeared field \(\phi (f) = \int \phi (x) f(x) dx\) with supp\((f)\subset \mathcal{O}\), where supp(\(f\)) is the support of the test function \(f\) and \(\mathcal{O}\) is a bounded open region in Minkowski space-time. In Wightman’s field axiomatics from the early 1950s, the basic entities are then polynomial algebras \(P(\mathcal{O})\) of smeared fields, i.e., sums of products of smeared fields in finite space-time regions \(\mathcal{O}\). Thus it replaces the mapping \(x \rightarrow \phi (x)\) in the conventional formulation of QFT by \(\mathcal{O} \rightarrow P(\mathcal{O})\).

From an operationalist perspective equally troublesome as point-like quantities are global quantities, like total charge, total energy or total momentum of a field. They are unobservable since their measurement would have to take place in the whole universe. Accordingly, quantities which refer to infinitely extended regions of space-time should not appear among the observables of the theory, as they do in the standard formulation of QFT. In the discussion of such “parochial observables” below we will see that it is not so clear in the end whether this is really a good argument (see Ruetsche 2011 and Feintzeig 2018). In any case, however, it has been important in the formation of axiomatic reformulations of QFT.

Another operationalist reason for favouring algebraic formulations derives from the fact that two quantum fields are physically equivalent when they generate the same algebras of local observables. Such equivalent quantum field theories belong to the same so-called Borchers class which entails that they lead to the same \(S\)-matrix. As Haag (1996) stresses, fields are only an instrument in order to “coordinatize” observables, more precisely: sets of observables, with respect to different finite space-time regions. The choice of a particular field system is to a certain degree conventional, namely as long as it belongs to the same Borchers class. Thus it is more appropriate to consider these algebras, rather than quantum fields, as the fundamental entities in QFT. The resulting operationalistic view of QFT is that it is a statistical theory about local measurement outcomes, expressed in terms of local algebras of observables. Thus, it is no surprise that Haag’s (1996) famous textbook on “Algebraic QFT”, the most successful axiomatic reformulation, bears the title “Local Quantum Physics.”

4.2 Motive Two: Mathematical Rigour

So far, we focussed on the operationalist motives for reformulating QFT and some of its consequences. Now we will distinguish different, partly competing ways of implementing these general ideas. The second motive—mathematical rigour—consists foremost in the quest towards a concise axiomatic formulation, instead of the grab bag of conventional QFT, with its numerous mathematically dubious, even though successful, approximation techniques. This quest comprises three parts, namely, first, the choice of those entities upon which the axioms are to be imposed, second, the choice of appropriate axioms, and, third, the proof that one has actually achieved an axiomatic reformulation of conventional QFT, which can reproduce all the established empirical and theoretical successes. While axiomatic approaches are clear and sharp on the first two counts, their success is more limited with respect to the third. In general, one can say there are valuable successes with respect to very general theoretical insights, such as the connection of spin and statistics as well as non-localizability, while the weak point is the lack of realistic models for interacting quantum field theories. Since the fundamental entities in axiomatic reformulations of QFT are algebras (of smeared field operators or of observables) instead of quantum fields, reformulating QFT in algebraic terms and in axiomatic terms are enterprises with a large factual overlap. However, only one attempt to reformulate QFT axiomatically bears the name “Algebraic Quantum Field Theory,” because it is here that the algebraic structure of the fundamental entities was first fully realized and is explicity at the centre. However, trying to do this in a strictly axiomatic way, one only gets ‘reformulations’ which are not as rich as standard QFT. As Haag (1996) concedes, the “algebraic approach […] has given us a frame and a language not a theory.”

Wightman’s “field axiomatics”, already mentioned above, is–besides AQFT–one of the two most prominent proposals, for an axiomatisation of QFT. Both originated in the 1950s and influenced each other in their formation. In Wightman’s field axiomatics, the entities upon which the axioms are imposed are smeared field operators, in fact polynomial algebras \(P(\mathcal{O})\) thereof. The crucial axioms are covariance, microcausality (spacelike separated field operators required to either commute or anticommute), and spectrum condition (positive energy in all Lorentz frames, so that the vacuum is a stable ground state). One shortcoming of this approach is that field operators are gauge-dependent and thereby arguably not qualified as directly representing physical quantities. Moreover, the use of unbounded field operators makes Wightman’s approach mathematically cumbersome.

In contrast, Algebraic Quantum Field Theory (AQFT)—the most successful attempt to reformulate QFT axiomatically—employs only bounded operators. It builds upon work in the 1940s by Gelfand, Neumark, and in particular Segal, who tried to describe quantum physics in terms of \(C\)*-algebras [section 4.1. in the entry Quantum Theory and Mathematical Rigour has a more detailed account]. The notion of a \(C\)*-algebra generalizes the notion of the algebra \(\mathcal{B(H)}\) of all bounded operators on a Hilbert space \(\mathcal{H}\), which is also the most important example for a \(C\)*-algebra. In fact, it can be shown that any \(C\)*-algebra is isomorphic to a (norm-closed, self-adjoint) algebra of bounded operators on a Hilbert space. The boundedness (and self-adjointness) of the operators is the reason why \(C\)*-algebras are considered as ideal for representing physical observables. The ‘C’ indicates that one is dealing with a complex vector space and the ‘*’ refers to the operation that maps an element \(A\) of an algebra to its involution (or adjoint) \(A\)*, which generalizes the conjugate complex of complex numbers to operators. This involution is needed in order to define the crucial norm property of \(C\)*-algebras, which is of central importance for the proof of the above isomorphism claim.

AQFT takes so-called nets of algebras as basic for the mathematical description of quantum systems, i.e., the mapping \(\mathcal{O}\rightarrow\mathcal{A}(\mathcal{O})\) from finite space-time regions to algebras of local observables. The insight behind this apporoach is that the net structure of algebras, i.e., the very way how algebras of local observables are linked to space-time regions, supplies observables with physical significance. In this rather abstract setting, physical states are identified as positive, linear, normalized functionals which map elements of local algebras to real numbers. States can thus be understood as assignments of expectation values to observables. Via the so-called Gelfand-Neumark-Segal construction, one can recover the concrete Hilbert space representations in the conventional formalism. Thus, “all the Hilbert spaces we will ever need are hidden inside the algebra itself” (Halvorson & Müger 2007, section 7).

AQFT then imposes a whole list of axioms on the abstract algebraic structure, namely relativistic axioms (in particular locality and covariance), general physical assumptions (e.g., the spectrum condition), and finally some technical assumptions concerning the mathematical formulation. The principle of (Einstein) causality is the main relativistic ingredient of AQFT: All observables of a local algebra connected with a space-time region \(\mathcal{O}\) are required to commute with all observables of another algebra which is associated with a space-time region \(\mathcal{O}'\) that is space-like separated from \(\mathcal{O}\). As a reformulation of QFT, AQFT is expected to reproduce the main features of QFT, like the existence of antiparticles, internal quantum numbers, the relation of spin and statistics, etc. That this aim could not be achieved on a purely axiomatic basis is partly due to the fact that the connection between the respective key concepts of AQFT and QFT, i.e., algebras of observables and quantum fields, is not sufficiently clear. One main link are superselection rules, which put restrictions on the set of all observables and allow for classification schemes in terms of permanent or essential properties.

Today, many philosophers of physics who work on QFT rest most of their considerations on AQFT. This predominance of AQFT for foundational studies about QFT becomes problematic, however, when AQFT is seen as a physical theory in competition to Conventional QFT (CQFT). Wallace (2006, 2011) even urges that, seen from today, CQFT succeeded, whereas AQFT failed, so that “to be lured away from the Standard Model by [AQFT] is sheer madness” (Wallace 2011:124). Contra Wallace, Fraser (2011) questions Wallace’s crucial point in defense of CQFT, namely that the application of renormalization group techniques in QFT finally solved the problem of ultraviolet divergences that troubled CQFT in the 1950s. The empirical success of renormalization in CQFT leaves the physical reasons for this success in the dark, argues Fraser, unlike in condensed matter physics, where its success is due to the fact that matter is discrete at atomic length scales.

Ultimately, the most reasonable position may be a liberal one, according to which neither of the three, AQFT, Wightman’s field axiomatics and CQFT, should be regarded as rival research programs, only one of which can and should survive (Kuhlmann 2010b, Swanson 2017). Wightman’s Axiomatic QFT is fruitful in the construction of concrete models, AQFT is advantageous for ontological considerations because it clearly separates fundamental and derived entities, and CQFT is very good for actual calculations of the high energy physicist.

The monographs Haag (1996) and Horuzhy (1990) and the articles Haag & Kastler (1964), Roberts (1990), Buchholz (1998) are introductions to AQFT. Halvorson & Müger (2007), Ruetsche (2011) and Ruetsche (2012a,b) are tailored for philosophers of physics, where the first emphasizes technical and the latter interpretive issues. Streater & Wightman (1964) is an early pioneering monograph on axiomatic QFT. Bratteli & Robinson (1997) is a classic on the mathematical theory of operator algebras, emphasising physical applications. Philosophical studies on AQFT can be found, among many others, in Baker (2009), Baker & Halvorson (2010), Earman & Fraser (2006), Fraser (2008, 2009, 2011), Feintzeig (2018), Feintzeig et al. (2019), Feintzeig and Weatherall (2019), Kronz & Lupher (2005), Kuhlmann (2010a, 2010b), Lupher (2018), Miller (2018), Rédei & Valente (2010), and Ruetsche (2002, 2003, 2006, 2011).

4.3 Motive Three: Dealing with Inequivalent Representations

The third important problem for standard QFT which prompted reformulations is the existence of inequivalent representations. In the context of quantum mechanics, Schrödinger, Dirac, Jordan and von Neumann realized that Heisenberg’s matrix mechanics and Schrödinger’s wave mechanics are just two (unitarily) equivalent representations of the same underlying abstract structure, i.e., an abstract Hilbert space \(\mathcal{H}\) and linear operators acting on this space. We are merely dealing with two different ways for representing the same physical reality, and it is possible to switch between these different representations by means of a unitary transformation, i.e., an operation that is analogous to an innocuous rotation of the frame of reference. Representations of some given algebra or group are sets of mathematical objects, like numbers, rotations or more abstract transformations (e.g., differential operators) together with a binary operation (e.g., addition or multiplication) that combines any two elements of the algebra or group, such that the structure of the algebra or group to be represented is preserved. This means that the combination of any two elements in the representation space, say \(a\) and \(b\), leads to a third element which corresponds to the element that results when you combine the elements corresponding to \(a\) and \(b\) in the algebra or group that is represented. In 1931 von Neumann gave a detailed proof (of a conjecture by Stone) that the canonical commutation relations (CCRs) for position coordinates and their conjugate momentum coordinates in configuration space fix the representation of these two sets of operators in Hilbert space up to unitary equivalence (von Neumann’s uniqueness theorem). This means that the specification of the purely algebraic CCRs suffices to describe a particular physical system.

In quantum field theory, however, von Neumann’s uniqueness theorem loses its validity since here one is dealing with an infinite number of degrees of freedom. Now one is confronted with a multitude of unitarily inequivalent representations (UIRs) of the CCRs and it is not obvious what this means physically and how one should cope with it. Since the troublesome inequivalent representations of the CCRs that arise in QFT are all irreducible their inequivalence is not due to the fact that some are reducible while others are not (a representation is reducible if there is an invariant subrepresentation, i.e., a subset which alone represent the CCRs already). Since unitarily inequivalent representations seem to describe different physical states of affairs it would no longer be legitimate to simply choose the most convenient representation, just like choosing the most convenient frame of reference. In principle all but one of the UIRs could be physically irrelevant, i.e., mathematical artefacts of a redundant formalism. However, it seems that at least some irreducible representations of the CCRs are inequivalent and physically relevant.

These considerations motivate the algebraic point of view that algebras of observables rather than observables themselves in a particular representation should be taken as the basic entities in the mathematical description of QFT, so that the above-mentioned problems are to some degree avoided from the outset. However, obviously this cannot just be the end of the story. Even if UIRs are not basic, it is still necessary to say what the availability of different UIRs means, physically and thereby ontologically.

4.4 Algebras, Inequivalent Representations, and the Physical-Content Question

One of the most fundamental interpretative obstacles concerning QFT is the question which formalism to consider and to then identify which parts of the respective formalism carry the physical content, and which parts are surplus structure, from an ontological point of view. Roughly, one may distingush “Hilbert space conservatists” and “algebraic imperialists” (Arageorgis 1995 and Ruetsche 2002 coined these terms). While Hilbert space conservativism seems to be the default position, often adopted without further justification, algebraic imperialism usually comes with an explicit justification.

Hilbert space conservatism dismisses the availability of a plethora of UIRs as a mathematical artifact with no physical relevance. In contrast, algebraic imperialism argues that instead of choosing a particular Hilbert space representation, one should stay on the abstract algebraic level. Haag & Kastler (1964) try to give an operationalist justification for their claim that no diverging physical content is encoded by the different unitarily inequivalent representations. The core point of the argument is that the topology used to distinguish these representations as different, namely the uniform operator topology or “norm topology”, is inappropriately fine-grained (where a topology defines what is meant by the neighborhood of an element). Therefore, it classifies representations as inequivalent, which are in fact empirically and therefore “physically equivalent.” The whole argument depends decisively on a theorem by Fell (1960), according to which a finite number of measurements, performed with some inaccuracy, can never distinguish unitarily inequivalent representations. They are “weakly equivalent,” a notion introduced by Fell (1960), using a weak operator topology. Invoking Fell’s theorem and equating weak equivalence and physical equivalence, Haag & Kastler (1964) reason that the “relevant object is the abstract algebra and not the representation. The selection of a particular (faithful) representation is a matter of convenience without physical implications. It may provide a more or less handy analytical apparatus.”

Arageorgis (1995), Ruetsche (2003, 2011), Lupher & Kronz (2005), and most recently, Lupher (2018) attack algebraic imperialists for using Fell’s theorem in order to denigrate UIRs. Ruetsche’s most important point is that UIRs do real explanatory work in physics, e.g., in quantum statistical mechanics (see Bratteli & Robinson 1997 and Ruetsche 2003) and in particular when it comes to spontaneous symmetry breaking. The coexistence of UIRs can be readily understood by looking at ferromagnetism for infinite spin chains (see Ruetsche 2006). At high temperatures the atomic dipoles in ferromagnetic substances fluctuate randomly. Below a certain temperature the atomic dipoles tend to align to each other in some direction. Since the basic laws governing this phenomenon are rotationally symmetrical, no direction is preferred. Thus once the dipoles have “chosen” one particular direction, the symmetry is broken. Since there is a different ground state for each direction of magnetization, one needs different Hilbert space representations—each containing a unique ground state—in order to describe symmetry breaking systems. Correspondingly, one has to employ inequivalent representations.

Already Lupher & Kronz (2005) point out that an attractive alternative to the strict \(C^{\ast}\)-algebraic imperialism is to extend the physical content to von Neumann algebras, the elements of which are generated by representations of algebra \(\mathcal{A}\). Lupher (2018) analyzes the algebraic imperialists’ use of Fell’s theorem in detail and points out that there are important representations in the algebraic approach to which Fell’s theorem does not apply, in particular many \(W^{\ast}\)-algebras, the abstract counterparts of von Neumann algebras. Moreover, he argues that it is a \(W^{\ast}\)-algebra, namely the bidual \(\mathcal{A}^{\ast \ast}\), which is the appropriate locus of physical content for the algebraic imperialist, to which Lupher subscribes in the form of what he dubs “bidualism.” One crucial advantage of taking the \(W^{\ast}\)-algebra \(\mathcal{A}^{\ast \ast}\) is that it is larger than the \(C^{\ast}\)-algebra \(\mathcal{A}\). In particular it also contains what Ruetsche (2011) calls “parochial observables” (or the abstract counterparts thereof), such as net magnetization and particle number. Also against Ruetsche, Feintzeig (2018) argues that not only the universalist (or bidualist) but also \(C^{\ast}\)-algebraic imperialism has access to “parochial observables,” since it has additional tools to represent such observables by means of idealizations from the observables in the abstract algebra.

To conclude, it is difficult to say how the availability of UIRs should be interpreted in general. Clifton and Halvorson (2001b) propose seeing this as a form of complementarity. Ruetsche (2003) advocates a “Swiss army approach”, according to which the availability of UIRs shows that physical possibilities in different degrees must be included into our ontology. In addition, Ruetsche (2011: 119) argues that both Hilbert space conservatism and algebraic imperialism are extremist, or “pristine”, positions in the end. Accordingly, she advocates taking UIRs more seriously than in these extremist approaches. As we have just seen, however, recent adherents of algebraic imperialism and universalism/bidualism have accepted the challenge.

4.5 The Interpretive Impact of Accelerated Observers and Interacting Systems

One important interpretive issue where unitarily inequivalent representations (UIRs) play a crucial role is the Unruh effect: a uniformly accelerated observer in a Minkowski vacuum should detect a thermal bath of particles, the so-called Rindler quanta (Unruh 1976, Unruh & Wald 1984). The Unruh effect constitutes a severe challenge to a particle interpretation of QFT, because it seems that the very existence of the basic entities of an ontology should not depend on the state of motion of the detectors. Teller (1995: 110–113) tries to dispel this problem by pointing out that while the Minkowski vacuum has the definite value zero for the Minkowski number operator, the particle number is indefinite for the Rindler number operator, since one has a superposition of Rindler quanta states. This means that there are only propensities for detecting different numbers of Rindler quanta but no actual quanta. However, this move is problematic since it seems to suggest that quantum physical propensities in general don’t need to be taken fully for real.

Clifton and Halvorson (2001b) argue, contra Teller, that it is inapproriate to give priority to either the Minkowski or the Rindler perspective. Both are needed for a complete picture. The Minkowski as well as the Rindler representation are true descriptions of the world, namely in terms of objective propensities. Arageorgis, Earman and Ruetsche (2003) argue that Minkowski and Rindler (or Fulling) quantization do not constitute a satisfactory case of physically relevant UIRs. First, there are good reasons to doubt that the Rindler vacuum is a physically realizable state. Second, the authors argue, the unitary inequivalence in question merely stems from the fact that one representation is reducible and the other one irreducible: The restriction of the Minkowski vacuum to a Rindler wedge, i.e., what the Minkowski observer says about the Rindler wedge, leads to a mixed state (a thermodynamic KMS state) and therefore a reducible representation, whereas the Rindler vacuum is a pure state and thus corresponds to an irreducible representation. Therefore, the Unruh effect does not cause distress for the particle interpretation—which the authors see to be fighting a losing battle anyhow—because Rindler quanta are not real and the unitary inequivalence of the representations in question has nothing specific to do with conflicting particle ascriptions.

The occurrence of UIRs is also at the core of an analysis by Fraser (2008). She restricts her analysis to inertial observers but compares the particle notion for free and interacting systems. Fraser argues, first, that the representations for free and interacting systems are unavoidably unitarily inequivalent, and second, that the representation for an interacting system does not have the minimal properties that are needed for any particle interpretation—e.g. Teller’s (1995) quanta version—namely the countability condition (quanta are aggregable) and a relativistic energy condition. Note that for Fraser’s negative conclusion about the tenability of the particle (or quanta) interpretation for QFT there is no need to assume localizability.

Bain (2000) has a diverging assessment of the fact that only asymptotically free states, i.e., states very long before or after a scattering interaction, have a Fock representation that allows for an interpretation in terms of countable quanta. For Bain, the occurrence of UIRs without a particle (or quanta) interpretation for intervening times, i.e., close to scattering experiments, is irrelevant because the data that are collected from those experiments always refer to systems with negligible interactions. Bain concludes that although the inclusion of interactions does in fact lead to the break-down of the alleged duality of particles and fields it does not undermine the notion of particles (or fields) as such.

Fraser (2008) rates this as an unsuccessful “last ditch” attempt to save a quanta interpretation of QFT because it is ad hoc and can’t even show that at least something similar to the free field total number operator exists for finite times, i.e., between the asymptotically free states. Moreover, Fraser (2008) points out that, contrary to what some authors suggest, the main source of the impossibility to interpret interacting systems in terms of particles is not that many-particle states are inappropriately described in the Fock representation if one deals with interacting fields but rather that QFT obeys special relativity theory (also see Earman and Fraser (2006) and Miller (2018) on Haag’s theorem). As Fraser concludes, “[F]or a free system, special relativity and the linear field equation conspire to produce a quanta interpretation.” In his reply Bain (2011) points out that the reason why there is no total number operator in interacting relativistic quantum field theories is that this would require an absolute space-time structure, which in turn is not an appropriate requirement.

Baker (2009) points out that the main arguments against the particle interpretation—concerning non-localizability (e.g., Malament 1996) and failure for interacting systems (Fraser 2008)—may also be directed against the wave functional version of the field interpretation (see field interpretation (iii) above). Mathematically, Baker’s crucial point is that wave functional space is unitarily equivalent to Fock space, so that arguments against the particle interpretation that attack the choice of the Fock representation may carry over to the wave functional interpretation. First, a Minkowski and a Rindler observer may also detect different field configurations. Second, if the Fock space representation is not apt to describe interacting systems, then the unitarily equivalent wave functional representation is in no better situation: Interacting fields are unitarily inequivalent to free fields, too.

5. Further Philosophical Issues

5.1 Setting the Stage: Candidate Ontologies

Ontology is concerned with the most general features, entities and structures of being. One can pursue ontology in a very general sense or with respect to a particular theory or a particular part or aspect of the world. With respect to the ontology of QFT one is tempted to more or less dismiss ontological inquiries and to adopt the following straightforward view. There are two groups of fundamental fermionic matter constituents, two groups of bosonic force carriers and four (including gravitation) kinds of interactions. As satisfying as this answer might first appear, the ontological questions are, in a sense, not even touched. Saying that, for instance the down quark is a fundamental constituent of our material world is the starting point rather than the end of the (philosophical) search for an ontology of QFT. The main question is what kind of entity, e.g., the down quark is. The answer does not depend on whether we think of down quarks or muon neutrinos since the sought features are much more general than those ones which constitute the difference between down quarks or muon neutrinos. The relevant questions are of a different type. What are particles at all? Can quantum particles be legitimately understood as particles any more, even in the broadest sense, when we take, e.g., their localization properties into account? How can one spell out what a field is and can “quantum fields” in fact be understood as fields? Could it be more appropriate not to think of, e.g., quarks, as the most fundamental entities at all, but rather of properties or processes or events?

5.1.1 The Particle Interpretation

Many of the creators of QFT can be found in one of the two camps regarding the question whether particles or fields should be given priority in understanding QFT. While Dirac, the later Heisenberg, Feynman, and Wheeler opted in favor of particles, Pauli, the early Heisenberg, Tomonaga and Schwinger put fields first (see Landsman 1996). Today, there are a number of arguments which prepare the ground for a proper discussion beyond mere preferences. The Particle Concept

It seems almost impossible to talk about elementary particle physics, or QFT more generally, without thinking of particles which are accelerated and scattered in colliders. Nevertheless, it is this very interpretation which is confronted with the most fully developed counter-arguments. There still is the option to say that our classical concept of a particle is too narrow and that we have to loosen some of its constraints. After all, even in classical corpuscular theories of matter the concept of an (elementary) particle is not as unproblematic as one might expect. For instance, if the whole charge of a particle was contracted to a point, an infinite amount of energy would be stored in this particle since the repulsive forces become infinitely large when two charges with the same sign are brought together. The so-called self energy of a point particle is infinite.

Probably the most immediate trait of particles is their discreteness. Particles are countable or ‘aggregable’ entities in contrast to a liquid or a mass. Obviously this characteristic alone cannot constitute a sufficient condition for being a particle since there are other things which are countable as well without being particles, e.g., money or maxima and minima of the standing wave of a vibrating string. It seems that one also needs individuality, i.e., it must be possible to say that it is this or that particle which has been counted in order to account for the fundamental difference between ups and downs in a wave pattern and particles. Teller (1995) discusses a specific conception of individuality, primitive thisness, as well as other possible features of the particle concept in comparison to classical concepts of fields and waves, as well as in comparison to the concept of field quanta, which is the basis for the interpretation that Teller advocates. A critical discussion of Teller’s reasoning can be found in Seibt (2002). Moreover, there is an extensive debate on individuality of quantum objects in quantum mechanical systems of ‘identical particles’. Since this discussion concerns QM in the first place, and not QFT, any further details shall be omitted here. French and Krause (2006) offer a detailed analysis of the historical, philosophical and mathematical aspects of the connection between quantum statistics, identity and individuality. See Dieks and Lubberdink (2011) for a critical assessment of the debate. Also consult the entry on quantum theory: identity and individuality.

There is still another feature which is commonly taken to be pivotal for the particle concept, namely that particles are localizable in space. While it is clear from classical physics already that the requirement of localizability need not refer to point-like localization, we will see that even localizability in an arbitrarily large but still finite region can be a strong condition for quantum particles. Bain (2011) argues that the classical notions of localizability and countability are inappropriate requirements for particles if one is considering a relativistic theory such as QFT.

Eventually, there are some potential ingredients of the particle concept which are explicitly opposed to the corresponding (and therefore opposite) features of the field concept. Whereas it is a core characteristic of a field that it is a system with an infinite number of degrees of freedom, the very opposite holds for particles. A particle can for instance be referred to by the specification of the coordinates \(\mathbf{x}(t)\) that pertain, e.g., to its center of mass—presupposing impenetrability. A further feature of the particle concept is connected to the last point and again explicitly in opposition to the field concept. In a pure particle ontology the interaction between remote particles can only be understood as an action at a distance. In contrast to that, in a field ontology, or a combined ontology of particles and fields, local action is implemented by mediating fields. Finally, classical particles are massive and impenetrable, again in contrast to (classical) fields. Why QFT Seems to be About Particles

The easiest way to quantize the electromagnetic (or: radiation) field consists of two steps. First, one Fourier analyses the vector potential of the classical field into normal modes (using periodic boundary conditions) corresponding to an infinite but denumerable number of degrees of freedom. Second, since each mode is described independently by a harmonic oscillator equation, one can apply the harmonic oscillator treatment from non-relativistic quantum mechanics to each single mode. The result for the Hamiltonian of the radiation field is

\[\tag{5.1} H_{\text{rad}} = \sum_{\mathbf{k}} \sum_{r} \hslash \omega_{\mathbf{k}} (a_{r}^{\dagger}(\mathbf{k})\cdot a_r (\mathbf{k}) + 1/2), \]

where \(a_{r}^{\dagger}(\mathbf{k})\) and \(a_r (\mathbf{k})\) are operators which satisfy the following commutation relations

\[\begin{align} \tag{5.2} [a_r (\mathbf{k}), a_s^{\dagger}(\mathbf{k}')] &= \delta_{rs}\delta_{\mathbf{kk}'} \\ [a_r (\mathbf{k}), a_s (\mathbf{k}')] &= [a_{r}^{\dagger}(\mathbf{k}), a_{s}^{\dagger}(\mathbf{k}')] = 0. \end{align}\]

with the index \(r\) labeling the polarisation. These commutation relations imply that one is dealing with a bosonic field.

The operators \(a_{r}^{\dagger}(\mathbf{k})\) and \(a_r (\mathbf{k})\) have interesting physical interpretations as so-called particle creation and annihilation operators. In order to see this, one has to examine the eigenvalues of the operators

\[\tag{5.3} N_r (\mathbf{k}) = a_{r}^{\dagger}(\mathbf{k})\cdot a_r (\mathbf{k}) \]

which are the essential parts in \(H_{rad}\). Due to the commutation relations (5.2) one finds that the eigenvalues of \(N_r (\mathbf{k})\) are the integers \(n_r (\mathbf{k}) = 0, 1, 2,\ldots\) and the corresponding eigenfunctions (up to a normalisation factor) are

\[\tag{5.4} |n_r (\mathbf{k})\rangle = [a_{r}^{\dagger}(\mathbf{k})]^{n_r (\mathbf{k})}|0\rangle \]

where the right hand side means that \(a_{r}^{\dagger}(\mathbf{k})\) operates \(n_r (\mathbf{k})\) times on \(|0\rangle\), the state vector of the vacuum with no photons present. The interpretation of these results is parallel to the one of the harmonic oscillator. \(a_{r}^{\dagger}(\mathbf{k})\) is interpreted as the creation operator of a photon with momentum \(\hslash \mathbf{k}\) and energy \(\hslash \omega_{\mathbf{k}}\) (and a polarisation which depends on \(r\) and \(\mathbf{k})\). That is, equation (5.4) can be understood in the following way. One gets a state with \(n_r (\mathbf{k})\) photons of momentum \(\hslash \mathbf{k}\) and energy \(\hslash \omega_{\mathbf{k}}\) when the creation operator \(a_{r}^{\dagger}(\mathbf{k})\) operates \(n_r (\mathbf{k})\) times on the vacuum state \(|0\rangle\). Accordingly, \(N_r (\mathbf{k})\) is called the number operator and \(n_r (\mathbf{k})\) the ‘occupation number’ of the mode that is specified by \(\mathbf{k}\) and \(r\), i.e., this mode is occupied by \(n_r (\mathbf{k})\) photons. Note that Pauli’s exclusion principle is not violated since it only applies to fermions and not to bosons like photons. The corresponding interpretation for the annihilation operator \(a_r (\mathbf{k})\) is parallel: When it operates on a state with a given number of photons this number is lowered by one.

It is a widespread view that these results complete “the justification for interpreting \(N(k)\) as the number operator, and hence for the particle interpretation of the quantized theory” (Ryder 1996: 131). This is a rash judgement, however. For instance, the question of localizability is not even touched while it is certain that this is a pivotal criterion for something to be a particle. All that is established so far is that certain mathematical quantities in the formalism are discrete. However, countability is merely one feature of particles and not at all conclusive evidence for a particle interpretation of QFT yet. It is not clear at this stage whether we are in fact dealing with particles or with fundamentally different objects which only have this one feature of discreteness in common with particles.

Teller (1995) argues that the Fock space or “occupation number” representation does support a particle ontology in terms of field quanta since these can be counted or aggregated, although not numbered. The degree of excitation of a certain mode of the underlying field determines the number of objects, i.e., the particles in the sense of quanta. Labels for individual particles like in the Schrödinger many-particle formalism do not occur any more, which is the crucial deviation from the classical notion of particles. However, despite of this deviation, says Teller, quanta should be regarded as particles: Besides their countability another fact that supports seeing quanta as particles is that they have the same energies as classical particles. Teller has been criticized for drawing unduly far-reaching ontological conclusions from one particular representation, in particular since the Fock space representation cannot be appropriate in general because it is only valid for free particles (see, e.g., Fraser 2008). In order to avoid this problem Bain (2000) proposes an alternative quanta interpretation that rests on the notion of asymptotically free states in scattering theory. For a further discussion of the quanta interpretation see the subsection on inequivalent representations below.

The vacuum state \(|0\rangle\) is the energy ground state, i.e., the eigenstate of the energy operator with the lowest eigenvalue. It is a remarkable result in ordinary non-relativistic QM that the ground state energy of e.g., the harmonic oscillator is not zero in contrast to its analogue in classical mechanics. In addition to this, the relativistic vacuum of QFT has the even more striking feature that the expectation values for various quantities do not vanish, which prompts the question what it is that has these values or gives rise to them if the vacuum is taken to be the state with no particles present. If particles were the basic objects of QFT how can it be that there are physical phenomena even if nothing is there according to this very ontology? Eventually, studies of QFT in curved space-time indicate that the existence of a particle number operator might be a contingent property of the flat Minkowski space-time, because Poincaré symmetry is used to pick out a preferred representation of the canonical commutation relations which is equivalent to picking out a preferred vacuum state (see Wald 1994).

Before exploring whether other (potentially) necessary requirements for the applicability of the particle concept are fulfilled let us see what the alternatives are. Proceeding this way makes it easier to evaluate the force of the following arguments in a more balanced manner.

5.1.2 The Field Interpretation

Since various arguments seem to speak against a particle interpretation, the allegedly only alternative, namely a field interpretation, is often taken to be the appropriate ontology of QFT. So let us see what a physical field is and why QFT may be interpreted in this sense. A classical point particle can be described by its position \(\mathbf{x}(t)\) and its momentum \(\mathbf{p}(t)\), which change as the time \(t\) progresses. So there are six degrees of freedom for the motion of a point particle corresponding to the three coordinates of the particle’s position and three more coordinates for its momentum. In the case of a classical field one has an independent value for each single point \(\mathbf{x}\) in space, where this specification changes as time progresses. The field value \(\phi\) can be a scalar quantity, like temperature, a vectorial one as for the electromagnetic field, or a tensor, such as the stress tensor for a crystal. A field is therefore specified by a time-dependent mapping from each point of space to a field value \(\phi(\mathbf{x},t)\). Thus a field is a system with an infinite number of degrees of freedom, which may be restrained by some field equations. Whereas the intuitive notion of a field is that it is something transient and fundamentally different from matter, it can be shown that it is possible to ascribe energy and momentum to a pure field even in the absence of matter. This somewhat surprising fact shows how gradual the distinction between fields and matter can be.

The transition from a classical field theory to a quantum field theory is characterized by the occurrence of operator-valued quantum fields \(\hat{\phi}(\mathbf{x},t)\), and corresponding conjugate fields, for both of which certain canonical commutation relations hold. Thus there is an obvious formal analogy between classical and quantum fields: in both cases field values are attached to space-time points, where these values are specified by real numbers in the case of classical fields and operators in the case of quantum fields. That is, the mapping \(\mathbf{x} \mapsto \hat{\phi}(\mathbf{x},t)\) in QFT is analogous to the classical mapping \(\mathbf{x} \mapsto \phi(\mathbf{x},t)\). Due to this formal analogy it appears to be beyond any doubt that QFT is a field theory.

But is a systematic association of certain mathematical terms with all points in space-time really enough to establish a field theory in a proper physical sense? Is it not essential for a physical field theory that some kind of real physical properties are allocated to space-time points? This requirement seems not fulfilled in QFT, however. Teller (1995: ch. 5) argues that the expression quantum field is only justified on a “perverse reading” of the notion of a field, since no definite physical values whatsoever are assigned to space-time points. Instead, quantum field operators represent the whole spectrum of possible values so that they rather have the status of observables (Teller: “determinables”) or general solutions. Only a specific configuration, i.e., an ascription of definite values to the field observables at all points in space, can count as a proper physical field.

There are at least four proposals for a field interpretation of QFT, all of which respect the fact that the operator-valuedness of quantum fields impedes their direct reading as physical fields.

(i) Teller (1995) argues that definite physical quantities emerge when not only the quantum field operators but also the state of the system is taken into account. More specifically, for a given state \(|\psi \rangle\) one can calculate the expectation values \(\langle \psi |\phi(x)|\psi \rangle\) which yields an ascription of definite physical values to all points x in space and thus a configuration of the operator-valued quantum field that may be seen as a proper physical field. The main problem with proposal (i), and possibly with (ii), too, is that an expectation value is the average value of a whole sequence of measurements, so that it does not qualify as the physical property of any actual single field system, no matter whether this property is a pre-existing (or categorical) value or a propensity (or disposition).

(ii) The vacuum expectation value or VEV interpretation, advocated by Wayne (2002), exploits a theorem by Wightman (1956). According to this reconstruction theorem all the information that is encoded in quantum field operators can be equivalently described by an infinite hierarchy of \(n\)-point vacuum expectation values, namely the expectation values of all products of quantum field operators at \(n\) (in general different) space-time points, calculated for the vacuum state. Since this collection of vacuum expectation values comprises only definite physical values it qualifies as a proper field configuration, and, Wayne argues, due to Wightman’s theorem, so does the equivalent set of quantum field operators. Thus, and this is the upshot of Wayne’s argument, an ascription of quantum field operators to all space-time points does by itself constitute a field configuration, namely for the vacuum state, even if this is not the actual state.

But this is also a problem for the VEV interpretation: While it shows nicely that much more information is encoded in the quantum field operators than just unspecifically what could be measured, it still does not yield anything like an actual field configuration. While this last requirement is likely to be too strong in a quantum theoretical context anyway, the next proposal may come at least somewhat closer to it.

(iii) In recent years the term wave functional interpretation has been established as the name for the default field interpretation of QFT. Correspondingly, it is the most widely discussed extant proposal; see, e.g., Huggett (2003), Halvorson and Müger (2007), Baker (2009) and Lupher (2010). In effect, it is not very different from proposal (i), and with further assumptions for (i) even identical. However, proposal (ii) phrases things differently and in a very appealing way. The basic idea is that quantized fields should be interpreted completely analogously to quantized one-particle states, just as both result analogously from imposing canonical commutation relations on the non-operator-valued classical quantities. In the case of a quantum mechanical particle, its state can be described by a wave function \(\psi\)(x), which maps positions to probability amplitudes, where \(|\psi(x)|^2\) can be interpreted as the probability for the particle to be measured at position \(x\). For a field, the analogue of positions are classical field configurations \(\phi(x)\), i.e., assignments of field values to points in space. And so, the analogy continues, just as a quantum particle is described by a wave function that maps positions to probabilities (or rather probability amplitudes) for the particle to be measured at \(x\), quantum fields can be understood in terms of wave functionals \(\psi[\phi(x)\)] that map functions to numbers, namely classical field configurations \(\phi(x)\) to probability amplitudes, where \(|\psi[\phi(x)]|^2\) can be interpreted as the probability for a given quantum field system to be found in configuration \(\phi(x)\) when measured. Thus just as a quantum state in ordinary single-particle QM can be interpreted as a superposition of classical localized particle states, the state of a quantum field system, so says the wave functional approach, can be interpreted as a superposition of classical field configurations. And what superpositions mean depends on one’s general interpretation of quantum probabilities (collapse with propensities, Bohmian hidden variables, branching Everettian many-worlds,…). In practice, however, QFT is hardly ever represented in wave functional space because usually there is little interest in measuring field configurations. Rather, one tries to measures ‘particle’ states and therefore works in Fock space.

(iv) For a modification of proposal (iii), indicated in Baker (2009: sec. 5) and explicitly formulated as an alternative interpretation by Lupher (2010), see the end of the section “Non-Localizability Theorems” below.

5.1.3 Ontic Structural Realism

The multitude of problems for particle as well as field interpretations prompted a number of alternative ontological approaches to QFT. Auyang (1995) and Dieks (2002) propose different versions of event ontologies. Seibt (2002) and Hättich (2004) defend process-ontological accounts of QFT, which are scrutinized in Kuhlmann (2002, 2010a: ch. 10). In recent years, however, ontic structural realism (OSR) has become the most fashionable ontological framework for modern physics. While so far the vast majority of studies concentrates on ordinary QM and General Relativity Theory, it seems to be commonly believed among advocates of OSR that their case is even stronger regarding QFT, in light of the paramount significance of symmetry groups (also see below)—hence the name group structural realism (Roberts 2010). Explicit arguments are few and far between, however.

One of the rare arguments in favor of OSR that deal specifically with QFT is due to Kantorovich (2003), who opts for a Platonic version of OSR; a position that is otherwise not very popular among OSRists. Kantorovich argues that directly after the big bang “the world was baryon-free, whereas the symmetry of grand unification existed as an abstract structure” (p. 673). Cao (1997b) points out that the best ontological access to QFT is gained by concentrating on structural properties rather than on any particular category of entities. Cao (2010) advocates a “constructive structural realism” on the basis of a detailed conceptual investigation of the formation of quantum chromodynamics. However, Kuhlmann (2011) shows that Cao’s position has little to do with what is usually taken to be ontic structural realism, and that it is not even clear whether it should at least be rated as an epistemic variant of structural realism.

The central significance of gauge theories in modern physics may support structural realism. Lyre (2004) offers a case study concerning the \(\mathrm{U}(1)\) gauge symmetry group, which characterizes QED. Recently Lyre (2012) has been advocating an intermediate form of OSR, which he calls “Extended OSR (ExtOSR)”, according to which there are not only relational structural properties but also structurally derived intrinsic properties, namely the invariants of structure: mass, spin, and charge. Lyre claims that only ExtOSR is in a position to account for gauge theories. Moreover, it can make sense of zero-value properties, such as the zero mass of photons.

Category theory could be a promising framework for OSR in general and QFT in particular, because the main reservation against the radical but also seemingly incoherent idea of relations without relata may depend on the common set theoretic framework. Bain (2013) offers a category theoretic formulation of such a radical OSR, Lam and Wütrich (2015) a critique and Eva (2016) a defense. See SEP entries on structural realism (4.2 on OSR and QFT) and on category theory.

5.1.4 Trope Ontology

Kuhlmann (2010a) proposes a Dispositional Trope Ontology (DTO) as the most appropriate ontological reading of the basic structure of QFT, in particular in its algebraic formulation, AQFT. The term ‘trope’ refers to a conception of properties that breaks with tradition by regarding properties as particulars rather than repeatables (or ‘universals’). This new conception of properties permits analyzing objects as pure bundles of properties/tropes without excluding the possibility of having different objects with (qualitatively but not numerically) exactly the same properties. One of Kuhlmann’s crucial points is that (A)QFT speaks in favor of a bundle conception of objects because the net structure of observable algebras alone (see section “Basic Ideas of AQFT” above) encodes the fundamental features of a given quantum field theory, e.g., its charge structure.

In the DTO approach, the essential properties/tropes of a trope bundle are then identified with the defining characteristics of a superselection sector, such as different kinds of charges, mass and spin. Since these properties cannot change by any state transition they guarantee the object’s identity over time. Superselection sectors are inequivalent irreducible representations of the algebra of all quasi-local observables. While the essential properties/tropes of an object are permanent, its non-essential ones may change. Since we are dealing with quantum physical systems many properties are dispositions (or propensities); hence the name dispositional trope ontology.

A trope bundle is not individuated via spatio-temporal co-localization but because of the particularity of its constitutive tropes. Morganti (2009) also advocates a trope-ontological reading of QFT, which refers directly to the classification scheme of the Standard Model.

5.2 Did Wigner Define the Particle Concept?

Wigner’s (1939) famous analysis of the Poincaré group is often assumed to provide a definition of elementary particles. The main idea of Wigner’s approach is the supposition that each irreducible (projective) representation of the relevant space-time symmetry group yields the state space of one kind of elementary physical system, where the prime example is an elementary particle which has the more restrictive property of being structureless. The physical justification for linking up irreducible representations with elementary systems is the requirement that “there must be no relativistically invariant distinction between the various states of the system” (Newton & Wigner 1949). In other words the state space of an elementary system shall have no internal structure with respect to relativistic transformations. Put more technically, the state space of an elementary system must not contain any relativistically invariant subspaces, i.e., it must be the state space of an irreducible representation of the relevant invariance group. If the state space of an elementary system had relativistically invariant subspaces then it would be appropriate to associate these subspaces with elementary systems. The requirement that a state space has to be relativistically invariant means that starting from any of its states it must be possible to get to all the other states by superposition of those states which result from relativistic transformations of the state one started with. The main part of Wigner’s analysis consists in finding and classifying all the irreducible representations of the Poincaré group. Doing that involves finding relativistically invariant quantities that serve to classify the irreducible representations. Wigner’s pioneering identification of types of particles with irreducible unitary representations of the Poincaré group has been exemplary until the present, as it is emphasized, e.g., in Buchholz (1994). For an alternative perspective focusing on “Wigner’s legacy” for ontic structural realism see Roberts (2011).

Regarding the question whether Wigner has supplied a definition of particles, one must say that although Wigner has in fact found a highly valuable and fruitful classification of particles, his analysis does not contribute very much to the question what a particle is and whether a given theory can be interpreted in terms of particles. What Wigner has given is rather a conditional answer. If relativistic quantum mechanics can be interpreted in terms of particles then the possible types of particles and their invariant properties can be determined via an analysis of the irreducible unitary representations of the Poincaré group. However, the question whether, and if yes in what sense, at least relativistic quantum mechanics can be interpreted as a particle theory at all is not addressed in Wigner’s analysis. For this reason the discussion of the particle interpretation of QFT is not finished with Wigner’s analysis as one might be tempted to say. For instance, the pivotal question of the localizability of particle states, to be discussed below, is still open. Moreover, once interactions are included, Wigner’s classification is no longer applicable (see Bain 2000). Kuhlmann (2010a: sec. 8.1.2) offers an accessible introduction to Wigner’s analysis and discusses its interpretive relevance.

5.3 Non-Localizability Theorems

The observed ‘particle traces’, e.g., on photographic plates of bubble chambers, seem to be a clear indication for the existence of particles. However, the theory which has been built on the basis of these scattering experiments, QFT, turns out to have considerable problems to account for the observed ‘particle trajectories’. Not only are sharp trajectories excluded by Heisenberg’s uncertainty relations for position and momentum coordinates, which hold for non-relativistic quantum mechanics already. More advanced examinations in AQFT show that ‘quantum particles’ which behave according to the principles of relativity theory cannot be localized in any bounded region of space-time, no matter how large, a result which excludes even tube-like trajectories. It thus appears to be impossible that our world is composed of particles when we assume that localizability is a necessary ingredient of the particle concept. So far there is no single unquestioned argument against the possibility of a particle interpretation of QFT but the problems are piling up. Reeh & Schlieder, Hegerfeldt, Malament and Redhead all gained mathematical results, or formalized their interpretation, which prove that certain sets of assumptions, which are taken to be essential for the particle concept, lead to contradictions.

The Reeh-Schlieder theorem (1961) is a central result in AQFT. It asserts that acting on the vacuum state \(\Omega\) with elements of the von Neumann observable algebra \(R(O)\) for open space-time region \(O\), one can approximate as closely as one likes any state in Hilbertspace \(\mathcal{H}\), in particular one that is very different from the vacuum in some space-like separated region \(O'\). The Reeh-Schlieder theorem is thus exploiting long distance correlations of the vacuum. Or one can express the result by saying that local measurements do not allow for a distinction between an N-particle state and the vacuum state. Redhead’s (1995a) take on the Reeh-Schlieder theorem is that local measurements can never decide whether one observes an N-particle state, since a projection operator \(P_{\Psi}\) which corresponds to an N-particle state \(\Psi\) can never be an element of a local algebra \(R(O)\). Clifton & Halvorson (2001) discuss what this means for the issue of entanglement. Halvorson (2001) shows that an alternative “Newton-Wigner” localization scheme fails to evade the problem of localization posed by the Reeh-Schlieder theorem.

Malament (1996) formulates a no-go theorem to the effect that a relativistic quantum theory of a fixed number of particles predicts a zero probability for finding a particle in any spatial set, provided four conditions are satisfied, namely concerning translation covariance, energy, localizability and locality. The localizability condition is the essential ingredient of the particle concept: A particle—in contrast to a field—cannot be found in two disjoint spatial sets at the same time. The locality condition is the main relativistic part of Malament’s assumptions. It requires that the statistics for measurements in one space-time region must not depend on whether or not a measurement has been performed in a space-like related second space-time region. Malament’s proof has the weight of a no-go theorem provided that we accept his four conditions as natural assumptions for a particle interpretation. A relativistic quantum theory of a fixed number of particles, satisfying in particular the localizability and the locality condition, has to assume a world devoid of particles (or at least a world in which particles can never be detected) in order not to contradict itself. Malament’s no-go theorem thus seems to show that there is no middle ground between QM and QFT, i.e., no theory which deals with a fixed number of particles (like in QM) and which is relativistic (like QFT) without running into the localizability problem of the no-go theorem. One is forced towards QFT which, as Malament is convinced, can only be understood as a field theory. Nevertheless, whether or not a particle interpretation of QFT is in fact ruled out by Malament’s result is a point of debate. At least prima facie Malament’s no-go theorem alone cannot supply a final answer since it assumes a fixed number of particles, an assumption that is not valid in the case of QFT.

The results about non-localizability which have been explored above may appear to be not very astonishing in the light of the following facts about ordinary QM: Quantum mechanical wave functions (in position representation) are usually smeared out over all \(\Re^3\), so that everywhere in space there is a non-vanishing probability for finding a particle. This is even the case arbitrarily close after a sharp position measurement due to the instantaneous spreading of wave packets over all space. Note, however, that ordinary QM is non-relativistic. A conflict with SRT would thus not be very surprising although it is not yet clear whether the above-mentioned quantum mechanical phenomena can actually be exploited to allow for superluminal signalling. QFT, on the other side, has been designed to be in accordance with special relativity theory (SRT). The local behavior of phenomena is one of the leading principles upon which the theory was built. This makes non-localizability within the formalism of QFT a much severer problem for a particle interpretation.

Malament’s reasoning has come under attack in Fleming & Butterfield (1999) and Busch (1999). Both argue to the effect that there are alternatives to Malament’s conclusion. The main line of thought in both criticisms is that Malament’s ‘mathematical result’ might just as well be interpreted as evidence that the assumed concept of a sharp localization operator is flawed and has to be modified either by allowing for unsharp localization (Busch 1999) or for so-called “hyperplane dependent localization” (Fleming & Butterfield 1999). In Saunders (1995) a different conclusion from Malament’s (as well as from similar) results is drawn. Rather than granting Malament’s four conditions and deriving a problem for a particle interpretation Saunders takes Malament’s proof as further evidence that one can not hold on to all four conditions. According to Saunders it is the localizability condition which might not be a natural and necessary requirement on second thought. Stressing that “relativity requires the language of events, not of things” Saunders argues that the localizability condition loses its plausibility when it is applied to events: It makes no sense to postulate that the same event can not occur at two disjoint spatial sets at the same time. One can only require for the same kind of event not to occur at both places. For Saunders the particle interpretation as such is not at stake in Malament’s argument. The question is rather whether QFT speaks about things at all. Saunders considers Malament’s result to give a negative answer to this question. A kind of meta paper on Malament’s theorem is Halvorson & Clifton (2002). Various objections to the choice of Malament’s assumptions and his conclusion are considered and rebutted. Moreover, Halvorson and Clifton establish two further no-go theorems which preserve Malament’s theorem by weakening tacit assumptions and showing that the general conclusion still holds. One thing seems to be clear. Since Malament’s ‘mathematical result’ appears to allow for various different conclusions it cannot be taken as conclusive evidence against the tenability of a particle interpretation of QFT and the same applies to Redhead’s interpretation of the Reeh-Schlieder theorem. For a more detailed exposition and comparison of the Reeh-Schlieder theorem and Malament’s theorem see Kuhlmann (2010a: sec. 8.3).

Does the field interpretation also suffer from problems concerning non-localizability? In the section “Deficiencies of the Conventional Formulation of QFT” we already saw that, strictly speaking, field operators cannot be defined at points but need to be smeared out in the (finite and arbitrarily small) vicinity of points, giving rise to smeared field operators \(\hat{\phi}(f)\), which represent the weighted average field value in the respective region. This procedure leads to operator-valued distributions instead of operator-valued fields. The lack of field operators at points appears to be analogous to the lack of position operators in QFT, which troubles the particle interpretation. However, for position operators there is no remedy analogous to that for field operators: while even unsharply localized particle positions do not exist in QFT (see Halvorson and Clifton 2002, theorem 2), the existence of smeared field operators demonstrates that there are at least point-like field operators. On this basis Lupher (2010) proposes a “modified field ontology”.

5.4 The Role of Symmetries

Symmetries play a central role in QFT. In order to characterize a special symmetry one has to specify transformations T and features that remain unchanged during these transformations: invariants I. Symmetries are thus pairs \(\{\)T, I\(\}\). The basic idea is that the transformations change elements of the mathematical description (the Lagrangians for instance) whereas the empirical content of the theory is unchanged. There are space-time transformations and so-called internal transformations. Whereas space-time symmetries are universal, i. e., they are valid for all interactions, internal symmetries characterize special sorts of interaction (electromagnetic, weak or strong interaction). Symmetry transformations define properties of particles/quantum fields that are conserved if the symmetry is not broken. The invariance of a system defines a conservation law, e.g., if a system is invariant under translations the linear momentum is conserved, if it is invariant under rotation the angular momentum is conserved. Inner transformations, such as gauge transformations, are connected with more abstract properties.

Symmetries are not only defined for Lagrangians but they can also be found in empirical data and phenomenological descriptions. Symmetries can thus bridge the gap between descriptions which are close to empirical results (‘phenomenology’) and the more abstract general theory which is a most important reason for their heuristic force. If a conservation law is found one has some knowledge about the system even if details of the dynamics are unknown. The analysis of many high energy collision experiments led to the assumption of special conservation laws for abstract properties like baryon number or strangeness. Evaluating experiments in this way allowed for a classification of particles. This phenomenological classification was good enough to predict new particles which could be found in the experiments. Free places in the classification could be filled even if the dynamics of the theory (for example the Lagrangian of strong interaction) was yet unknown. As the history of QFT for strong interaction shows, symmetries found in the phenomenological description often lead to valuable constraints for the construction of the dynamical equations. Arguments from group theory played a decisive role in the unification of fundamental interactions. In addition, symmetries bring about substantial technical advantages. For example, by using gauge transformations one can bring the Lagrangian into a form which makes it easy to prove the renormalizability of the theory. See also the entry on symmetry and symmetry breaking.

In many cases symmetries are not only heuristically useful but supply some sort of ‘justification’ by being used in the beginning of a chain of explanation. To a remarkable degree the present theories of elementary particle interactions can be understood by deduction from general principles. Under these principles symmetry requirements play a crucial role in order to determine the Lagrangian. For example, the only Lorentz invariant and gauge invariant renormalizable Lagrangian for photons and electrons is precisely the original Dirac Lagrangian. In this way symmetry arguments acquire an explanatory power and help to minimize the unexplained basic assumptions of a theory. Heisenberg concludes that in order “to find the way to a real understanding of the spectrum of particles it will therefore be necessary to look for the fundamental symmetries and not for the fundamental particles.” (Blum et al. 1995: 507).

Since symmetry operations change the perspective of an observer but not the physics an analysis of the relevant symmetry group can yield very general information about those entities which are unchanged by transformations. Such an invariance under a symmetry group is a necessary (but not sufficient) requirement for something to belong to the ontology of the considered physical theory. Hermann Weyl propagated the idea that objectivity is associated with invariance (see, e.g., his authoritative work Weyl 1952: 132). Auyang (1995) stresses the connection between properties of physically relevant symmetry groups and ontological questions. Kosso argues that symmetries help to separate objective facts from the conventions of descriptions; see his article in Brading & Castellani (2003), an anthology containing numerous further philosophical studies about symmetries in physics.

Symmetries are typical examples of structures that show more continuity in scientific change than assumptions about objects. For that reason structural realists consider structures as “the best candidate for what is ‘true’ about a physical theory” (Redhead 1999: 34). Physical objects such as electrons are then taken to be similar to fiction that should not be taken seriously, in the end. In the epistemic variant of structural realism structure is all we know about nature whereas the objects which are related by structures might exist but they are not accessible to us. For the extreme ontic structural realist there is nothing but structures in the world (Ladyman 1998).

5.5 Taking Stock: Where do we Stand?

A particle interpretation of QFT answers most intuitively what happens in particle scattering experiments and why we seem to detect particle trajectories. Moreover, it would explain most naturally why particle talk appears almost unavoidable. However, the particle interpretation in particular is troubled by numerous serious problems. There are no-go theorems to the effect that, in a relativistic setting, quantum “particle” states cannot be localized in any finite region of space-time no matter how large it is. Besides localizability, another hard core requirement for the particle concept that seems to be violated in QFT is countability. First, many take the Unruh effect to indicate that the particle number is observer or context dependent. And second, interacting quantum field theories cannot be interpreted in terms of particles because their representations are unitarily inequivalent to Fock space (Haag’s theorem), which is the only known way to represent countable entities in systems with an infinite number of degrees of freedom.

At first sight the field interpretation seems to be much better off, considering that a field is not a localized entity and that it may vary continuously—so no requirements for localizability and countability. Accordingly, the field interpretation is often taken to be implied by the failure of the particle interpretation. However, on closer scrutiny the field interpretation itself is not above reproach. To begin with, since “quantum fields” are operator valued it is not clear in which sense QFT should be describing physical fields, i.e., as ascribing physical properties to points in space. In order to get determinate physical properties, or even just probabilities, one needs a quantum state. However, since quantum states as such are not spatio-temporally defined, it is questionable whether field values calculated with their help can still be viewed as local properties. The second serious challenge is that the arguably strongest field interpretation—the wave functional version—may be hit by similar problems as the particle interpretation, since wave functional space is unitarily equivalent to Fock space.

The occurrence of unitarily inequivalent representations (UIRs), which first seemed to cause problems specifically for the particle interpretation but which appears to carry over to the field interpretation, may well be a severe obstacle for any ontological interpretation of QFT. However, it is controversial whether the two most prominent examples, namely the Unruh effect and Haag’s theorem, really do cause the contended problems in the first place. Thus one of the crucial tasks for the philosophy of QFT is further unmasking the ontological significance of UIRs.

The two remaining contestants approach QFT in a way that breaks more radically with traditional ontologies than any of the proposed particle and field interpretations. Ontic Structural Realism (OSR) takes the paramount significance of symmetry groups to indicate that symmetry structures as such have an ontological primacy over objects. However, since most OSRists are decidedly against Platonism, it is not altogether clear how symmetry structures could be ontologically prior to objects if they only exist in concrete realizations, namely in those objects that exhibit these symmetries.

Dispositional Trope Ontology (DTO) deprives both particles and fields of their fundamental status, and proposes an ontology whose basic elements are properties understood as particulars, called ‘tropes’. One of the advantages of the DTO approach is its great generality concerning the nature of objects which it analyzes as bundles of (partly dispositional) properties/tropes: DTO is flexible enough to encompass both particle and field like features without being committed to either a particle or a field ontology.

In conclusion one has to recall that one reason why the ontological interpretation of QFT is so difficult is the fact that it is exceptionally unclear which parts of the formalism should be taken to represent anything physical in the first place. And it looks as if that problem will persist for quite some time.


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