Model Theory: Core Ideas

It might be useful to informally illustrate some basic ideas underlying the Model-Theoretic Argument. The discussion to follow trades formal precision for intuitive accessibility. In logic, a theory is a set of sentences. We are going to consider what happens to the interpretation of 3 simple sentences that comprise our theory when we vary the way we refer to the individuals those sentences talk about and also vary how we classify those individuals. So, imagine that you and your four year old niece Maddy had been fortunate enough to have watched three elite sprinters at a training session some years ago —Usain Bolt, Justin Gatlin and Assafa Powell. Suppose we let the letter $$b$$ stand for Bolt, $$g$$ stand for Gatlin and $$p$$ stand for Powell. These letters are called individual constants. We will also need a single predicate letter $$J$$ representing the English predicate ‘is Jamaican’ to formulate our 3 sentence theory. In logic we distinguish between theories (sets of sentences) and the things those theories talk about (usually not sentences). The collection of items the theory talks about comprises the domain of abstract entities known as structures and what the theory says about those items receives an interpretation in the structure. An interpretation function assigns objects from the domain of a structure to individual constants such as our $$b$$, $$g$$ and $$p$$ and sets of objects (subsets of the domain) to monadic predicates such as our $$J$$. If we wish to express relations between objects such as one individual being faster than or taller than another (binary relations) or one individual standing between two others (ternary relations) we will need sets of ordered pairs (for the binary case) or ordered triples (for the ternary case) from the domain. Generally, $$n$$-place relations will require our interpretation function to supply $$n$$-tuples of objects from the domain as extensions for n-place predicates. By ‘extension’ of a predicate we simply mean the (sets of) things the predicate applies to.

We are going to focus on the simplest case. Our theory asserts that: (1) Bolt is Jamaican, (2) Powell is Jamaican, (3) Gatlin is not Jamaican. We shall write these sentences as (1) $$Jb$$, (2) $$Jp$$, (3) $$\neg Jg$$ respectively. This simple theory is true. When you inform Maddy of these facts you mean to refer to the man Usain Bolt when you use the name ‘Bolt’, to Assafa Powell by the name ‘Powell’ and to Justin Gatlin by ‘Gatlin’. You also mean to be describing the first two sprinters as Jamaican and the last as non-Jamaican when you use the predicate ‘is Jamaican’ in sentences (1), (2) and (3).

A structure in which $$b$$ denotes Bolt, $$p$$ denotes Powell and $$g$$ denotes Gatlin and in which the extension of $$J$$ is {Bolt, Powell} will make the sentences (1), (2) and (3) all true. Such a structure is said to be a model of the theory. Furthermore, as the model represents the names ‘Bolt’, ‘Powell’, ‘Gatlin’ as applying to exactly the right individuals and the predicate ‘is Jamaican’ as applying to just the right set of individuals we say the model is an intended model.

However, it is perfectly possible for a structure for a theory to make all its sentences true (and thus be a model of the theory) without that structure being an intended model. Suppose Maddy mistakes which particular individuals you are referring to when you use the names ‘Bolt’, ‘Powell’ and ‘Gatlin’. Perhaps these sprinters lined up in that order for one trial and now line up in a different order for the next trial. Suppose she is also misinformed about what ‘is Jamaican’ describes. Maybe she thinks it applies to a sprinter in the outside or middle lane and although that was the order for Bolt and Powell in the first trial, in the second one which is just about to start Gatlin and Bolt are in the outside and middle lanes.

Let us use $$M$$ to denote the intended model of the 3 sentence theory and use $$M^*$$ to denote Maddy’s non-standard model. Suppose we use the following notation to mean the individual constant $$b$$ refers to Bolt in the model $$M$$: $$|b|_M =$$ Bolt and so we also represent the facts that in $$M$$ the constant g refers to Gatlin and $$p$$ refers to Powell respectively as $$|g|_M =$$ Gatlin and $$|p|_M =$$ Powell. Suppose finally that we symbolize the interpretation of the predicate $$J$$ in $$M$$ by $$|J|_M =$$ {Bolt, Powell}.

We can now compute the truth-values of sentences such as $$Jb$$, $$Jg$$ and $$Jp$$ in the model $$M$$. Simple sentences such as these will turn out true in the model if the individual denoted by the individual constant in the model is included in the set of individuals comprising the extension of the predicate $$J$$ in the model. Since the individuals assigned to b and p are indeed included in the set that comprises the extension of $$J$$ in $$M$$, viz. {Bolt, Powell}, we have $$Jb$$ and $$Jp$$ coming out true in $$M$$. However since Gatlin is not included in the set {Bolt, Powell}, $$Jg$$ comes out false in $$M$$, whence $$\neg Jg$$ comes out true in $$M$$. This is exactly as it should be: Usain Bolt and Assafa Powell are both Jamaican sprinters but Justin Gatlin is an American rather than Jamaican sprinter. We represent these truths as: (i) $$|Jb|_M =$$ True, (ii) $$|Jg|_M =$$ False, (iii) $$|Jp|_M =$$ True.

Maddy’s model $$M^*$$ is a non-standard or unintended one. She thinks the name ‘Bolt’ refers to Gatlin, the name ‘Powell’ refers to Bolt and the name ‘Gatlin’refers to Powell. Furthermore she thinks the predicate ‘is Jamaican’ applies to Gatlin and Bolt but not to Powell. That is, we have that in $$M^*$$: $$|b|_{M^*} =$$ Gatlin, $$|g|_{M^*} =$$ Powell, $$|p|_{M^*} =$$ Bolt and for $$J$$ our sole predicate $$|J|_{M^*} =$$ {Gatlin, Bolt}.

In spite of her misunderstanding the intended referents for the sprinters’ names and the intended extension of the predicate ‘is Jamaican’, Maddy’s model $$M^*$$ assigns exactly the right truth-values for the 3 sentences above as readers can check for themselves. That is: (i) $$|Jb|_{M^*} =$$ True, (ii) $$|Jg|_{M^*} =$$ False, (iii) $$|Jp|_{M^*} =$$ True. The model $$M^*$$ is said to be a permuted model of $$M$$. It is as if the objects in the domain were systematically shuffled around whilst the labels were kept fixed, as Tim Button puts it [Button 2013; the example in the text here was inspired by Button’s Fig 2.1, p. 15].

Now consider a very different structure $$N$$ the domain of which consists only of the natural numbers 3, 4 and 5. We are going to interpret our simple sprinter theory in $$N$$. So suppose $$|b|_N = 3$$, $$|g|_N = 4$$, $$|p|_N = 5$$. Suppose also that our predicate $$J$$ is interpreted in $$N$$ so as to have the same extension in $$N$$ as the English predicate ‘is an odd number’, i.e. $$|J|_N =$$ {3,5}. Then, clearly $$N$$ is a model of our three sentence theory since we have (i) $$|Jb|_N =$$ True, (ii) $$|Jg|_N =$$ False, (iii) $$|Jp|_N =$$ True.