Religious Diversity (Pluralism)

First published Tue May 25, 2004; substantive revision Mon Nov 2, 2020

With respect to many, if not most issues, there exist significant differences of opinion among individuals who seem to be equally knowledgeable and sincere. Individuals who apparently have access to the same information and are equally interested in the truth do in fact affirm incompatible perspectives on, for instance, significant social, political, and economic issues. Such diversity of opinion, though, is nowhere more evident than in the area of religious thought. On almost every religious issue there are honest, knowledgeable people who hold significantly diverse, often incompatible beliefs.

Religious diversity of this sort can fruitfully be explored in many ways —for instance, from psychological, anthropological, or historical perspectives. The current discussion, however, will concern itself primarily with those key issues surrounding religious diversity with which philosophers, especially analytic philosophers of religion, are most concerned at present. Specifically, our discussion will focus primarily on the following questions: How pervasive is religious diversity? Does the reality of this diversity require a response? Can a person who acknowledges religious diversity remain justified in claiming just one perspective to be correct? If so, is it morally justifiable to attempt to convert others to a different perspective? Can it justifiably be claimed that only one religion offers a path into the eternal presence of God? How should religious diversity be approached in public education? The answers to such questions are not simply academic; they have practical implications. They increasingly have great impact on how we treat others, both personally and corporately.

The main goal of this discussion, it is important to note, is not to support a given perspective on these issues. It is to clarify the issues and explore differing perspectives.

1. The Pervasiveness of Religious Diversity

Most religions are theistic in the sense that they posit the existence of a personal Supreme Being (God) or set of personal deities, although within some belief systems normally labeled religions—for example, Buddhism—there is no belief in such a being. Monotheistic religions such as Judaism, Christianity, and Islam agree that there is a sole God. Polytheistic religions such as Taoism, Japanese Shinto, and Chinese folk religion hold that there are multiple deities (gods). While Hinduism typically recognizes many gods and goddesses, it is not polytheistic. Those varieties of Hinduism that count these many deities as aspects of a single God can be considered monotheistic. Other strands of Hinduism are henotheistic, worshiping one deity but recognizing many others. While much of what follows is applicable to any theistic religion, the focus will be on the diversity issues that arise predominately in those religions that believe in a sole personal Supreme Being (God).

While there is obviously widespread diversity of thought among these monotheistic religions (theistic systems) on such issues as the God’s nature and character, the relationship between divine control and human freedom, the extent to which God unilaterally intervenes in our world, and how God would have us live, it is being increasingly recognized that widespread diversity of thought on all these issues also exists just as clearly, and in exactly the same sense, within basic theistic systems. For example, within Christianity, believers differ significantly on the nature of God. Some see God as all-controlling, others as self-limiting, and still others as incapable of unilaterally controlling any aspect of reality. Some believe God to have infallible knowledge only of all that has occurred or is occurring, others claim God also has knowledge of all that will actually occur, while those who believe God possesses middle knowledge add that God knows all that would actually occur in any possible context. Some believe the moral principles stipulated by God for correct human behavior flow from God’s nature or character and thus that such principles determine God’s behavior, while others believe that God acts in accordance with a different set of moral rules than those moral rules given to humans; that for God what is right is simply whatever God does. Some believe that only those who have consciously “given their lives to Christ” will spend eternity in God’s presence. Others believe that many who have never even heard the name of Jesus will enter God’s presence, while others yet do not even believe subjective immortality (a conscious afterlife) to be a reality. Muslims also differ significantly among themselves on these same divine attributes (Aijaz 2015). Consider, for example, the wide variety of Muslim perspectives on such issues as the autonomy of the individual when interpreting the Qur’an, how best to apply core Islamic values to modern life, and the status of women. We find equally pervasive, significant intra-system diversity in Hinduism (Sharma 2011) and Judaism (Shatz 2011).

Moreover, there is also an increasing awareness that the practical import of intra-theistic diversity is just as significant as is that of inter-theistic diversity. For most Christians, for instance, the practical significance of retaining or modifying beliefs about God’s power or knowledge is just as great as retaining or modifying the belief that Christianity is a better theistic explanatory hypothesis than Islam. In fact, as Dennis Potter points out, whether there are actually differing inter-theistic perspectives on a given issues often depends on which intra-theistic perspectives we are considering (Potter 2013). So both types of diversity will be given equal attention in our discussion

2. Possible Responses to Religious Diversity

One obvious response to religious diversity of any form is to maintain that since there exists no divine reality—since the referent in all religious truth claims related to the divine is nonexistent—all such claims should be considered false. Another possible response, sometimes put forth by religious relativists, is that there is no singular truth when considering mutually incompatible religious claims about reality; more than one of the conflicting sets of specific truth-claims can be correct concurrently (Runzo 1988, 351–357). However, most current discussions of religious diversity presuppose a realist theory of truth—that there is a truth to the matter.

Unfortunately there is no standard way to categorize responses to the diversity of perspectives on religious truth claims. Religious exclusivism and religious pluralism appear in most categorizations, but not always with the same meanings. Religious inclusivism also sometime appears, but primarily in discussions about sufficient conditions for spending eternity with God, as it does in the discussion below (section 8) on the Eternal Destiny of Humankind. Accordingly, our general discussion of religious truth claims will focus on three basic categories: religious exclusivism, religious non-exclusivism, and religious pluralism. For our purposes, individuals are religious exclusivists when they believe that their perspective on some disputed inter-theistic truth claim—for example, that Allah is the true God—or some disputed intra-theistic truth claim—for example, that the Christian God cannot control free human choice—to be the truth or at least closer to the truth than any other competing religious perspective on this issue.[1] Individuals are religious non-exclusivists with respect to a disputed religious truth claim when they deny that any given religious perspective on this claim is superior to all other competing religious perspectives on this issue. Finally, individuals are religious pluralists with respect to a given inter-theistic or intra-theistic truth claim when they maintain not only (as non-exclusivists) that no single religious perspective is superior to all others but also make a positive claim about the truth of the matter. The nature of this claim depends on the type of issue in question. If the issue is one on which it is possible that the perspectives of more than one religion or variant thereof could be true—for example, the sufficient conditions for spending eternity in God’s presence—pluralists claim that the religious perspectives of more than one basic theistic system or variant thereof can justifiably be considered equally close to the truth (Marbaniang 2010). If the issue is one on which there can be only one actual truth to the matter, but we have no objective means of determining exactly what that truth is—for example, the actual nature of God—pluralists claim that the perspectives of more than one basic theistic system or variant thereof can justifiably be considered to reflect some aspect of this truth (Byrne 2011, 36–7).[2]

3. Religious Diversity and Epistemic Obligation

No philosopher denies that the awareness (realization) of seeming religious diversity sometimes does in fact have an impact on exclusivists—from causing minor uneasiness to significantly reducing their level of confidence in the truth of certain beliefs to precipitating belief abandonment. This is simply an empirical claim about psychological states and behaviors (Alston 1988, 442–446; Plantinga 2000, 189).

How should, though, exclusivists coming to an awareness of religious diversity—the awareness that seemingly sincere, knowledgeable individuals differ with them on an issue of religious significance—respond to the reality of such diversity? How should, for instance, the devout Hindu or Christian who comes to realize that others who seem as knowledgeable and devout hold incompatible religious perspectives respond? Or how should Christians who believe the Bible clearly portrays a God with total control over all aspects of reality respond to the realization that other seemingly sincere, devout, “Bible-believing” Christians see the Bible as clearly portraying a God who has chosen not to control what occurs in those contexts in which humans have been granted meaningful moral freedom? Can exclusivists justifiably disregard such diversity? If not, are exclusivists under some obligation to attempt to resolve such epistemic conflicts—engage in belief assessment (or reassessment) with openness to possible revision? Or would it at least be a good idea to do so?

Within the relevant “epistemology of disagreement literature,” we find significantly different responses. There are, of course, religious individuals (and groups) who believe it is inappropriate to subject religious beliefs to assessment of any sort. Certain individuals (sometimes called fideists) have argued, for instance, that religious beliefs are not of a type properly subjected to rational assessment and/or that assessing such beliefs demonstrates a lack of faith (Peterson et al. 2013, 65–69). But few philosophers currently hold this position. Most maintain that exclusivists have at least the right to assess their beliefs in the face of religious diversity.

There continues, however, to be significant debate on whether exclusivists are under an obligation to engage in such belief assessment. Some philosophers agree with Robert McKim that “disagreement about an issue or area of inquiry provides reason to think that each side has an obligation to examine beliefs about the issue” (McKim 2001, 140). The underlying assumption here is that when perspectives on any issue, be they personal, social, economic, political, or religious, have important consequences for that person or others, then individuals are under an obligation to find the truth of the matter—to maximize truth. Individuals, in this case religious exclusivists, can only attempt to maximize truth or avoid error in the face of diverse claims, it is argued, if they attempt to resolve the conflict.

The contention here, it must be emphasized, is not that such resolution is always possible or that exclusivists must necessarily give up their belief if no resolution is forthcoming. Discussion concerning those issues is yet to come. The claim, rather, is only that the exclusivist is obligated at the very least to assess the evidence for and against the beliefs in question and to try to “get a sense of the appeal and of the concern of those who advocate them” (McKim 2001, 146).

Others philosophers disagree. For example, Alvin Plantinga acknowledges that if proponents of a specific religious perspective have no reason to doubt that those with whom they disagree really are on equal epistemic footing, then they are under a prima facie obligation to attempt to resolve the conflict. However, Plantinga denies that Christian exclusivists need ever acknowledge that they are facing true epistemic parity—need ever admit that they actually are differing with true epistemic peers. Although Christian exclusivists, we are told, may grant that those with whom they are in disagreement have not violated any epistemic duty and may know of no arguments that would convince others of their wrongness while maintaining their rightness, exclusivists are likely to believe that they “have been epistemically favored in some way.” They might believe, for instance, that they have been graced by ‘the Internal Witness of the Holy Spirit’; or

… perhaps he [they] think the Holy Spirit preserves the Christian church from serious error, at least with respect to the fundamentals of Christian belief; or perhaps [they think] that [they have] been converted by divine grace, so that [they] now see what was once obscure to [them]—a blessing not so far bestowed upon the dissenters (Plantinga 1997, 296).

Moreover, if any beliefs of this type are true, Plantinga contends, then Christian exclusivists are quite probably “in a better position, epistemically speaking,” than those who reject the exclusivistic belief in question. Therefore, since it cannot be demonstrated that Christian belief of this sort is very likely false, Christian believers remain justified in maintaining that the proponents of other religious perspectives are not actually on an equal epistemic footing. The same, Plantinga acknowledges, might well be true for exclusivists in other religious belief systems (Plantinga 1997, 296). [3]

The strength of this line of reasoning depends in part on the debatable issue of who shoulders the burden of proof on the question of equal epistemic footing. Those siding with Plantinga argue in essence that unless exclusivists must acknowledge on epistemic grounds that are (or should be) accepted by all rational people that those holding incompatible beliefs are actually on equal footing, exclusivists can justifiably deny that this is so and thus need not engage in belief assessment (Kim 2011). Those supporting obligatory belief assessment argue that exclusivists are the ones who shoulder the burden of proof. Unless it can be demonstrated on epistemic grounds that are (or should be) accepted by all rational people that proponents of the competing perspectives are not actually on equal epistemic footing, exclusivists must consider their challengers on equal epistemic footing and are thus obligated to engage in belief assessment (Basinger 2002, 26–27). Or, to state this important distinction another way, it is Plantinga’s contention that we need not acknowledge that those with whom we disagree are actually on equal epistemic footing unless it can be demonstrated objectively that they are equally knowledgeable and sincere, while his critics maintain that we must acknowledge that those with whom we disagree are on equal epistemic footing unless we have an objective means of demonstrating that we are in fact more knowledgeable and/or sincere than they. Most philosophers of religion side with the critics in this case and thus assume that actual peer conflict cannot be denied (Byrne 2011, 30).

Another influential type of challenge to obligatory belief assessment in the face of religious diversity has been raised by Jerome Gellman. The focus of his challenge centers on what he identifies as rock bottom beliefs. Such beliefs, as Gellman defines them, are the epistemic givens in a religious belief system—the assumed, foundational truths upon which all else is built. Gellman grants that if a religious belief affirmed by an exclusivist is not rock bottom (is not a foundational assumption), then it may well be subject to obligatory belief assessment in the face of religious diversity. However, he argues, since belief assessment only makes sense when one isn’t certain that the belief in question is true, and since rock bottom religious beliefs are among the foundational truths—the basic, assumed truths—in an exclusivist’s epistemic system, no assessment is necessary. Rather, when exclusivists encounter a challenge to such a belief—for example, a challenge to their rock bottom belief in God’s ultimate control over all earthly affairs—they can, utilizing the G. E. Moore switch, justifiably maintain that because their rock bottom belief is true, the competing belief can justifiably be rejected (Gellman 1993, 345–364; Gellman 1998, 229–235).

Furthermore, Gellman has added, even if we grant that rock bottom beliefs are at times open to belief assessment, exclusivists need not engage in such assessment in the face of religious diversity unless they find that the awareness of such diversity is causing them to lose significant confidence in their own perspective. In the absence of this type of internal conflict, they “may rationally invoke [their] unreflective religious belief to defeat opposing religious claims, without having to consider the question any further” (Gellman 2000, 403).

It would seem, though, that even those who are sympathetic to Gellman’s general line of reasoning would want to limit its scope. Many religious beliefs held by exclusivists have practical consequences. That is, exclusivist beliefs are not isolated cognitive assumptions; they motivate behavior. For instance, there are many theists worldwide who not only still believe that men have some sort of God-given, inherent authority over women, or that certain ethnic groups have God-given superiority, or that certain sexual orientations are perversions of God’s ideal, or that humans have God-given authority over the rest of nature, or that God desires heretics to be silenced, they also act on these beliefs. However, it seems safe to assume that most exclusivists, including Gellman, believe that some of these actions are morally wrong and ought to be stopped to the extent possible. In such cases, it is difficult to imagine many exclusivists maintaining that those who hold the beliefs on which these acts are based have no need to reassess these beliefs unless they personally feel a need to do so. It seems, rather, that most exclusivists would want those holding such beliefs to at the very least engage in significant belief reassessment, even if they don’t at present personally feel a need to do so.

4. Religious Diversity and Justified Belief

Some philosophers/theologians assume that belief assessment, when conducted properly, can often resolve epistemic peer conflict (Byrne 2011, 31; Aijaz 2017). But what if we assume that while the consideration of criteria such as self-consistency and comprehensiveness can rule out certain options, there exists no set of criteria that will allow us to resolve most religious epistemic disputes (either between or within religious perspectives) in a neutral, nonquestion-begging fashion (Peterson et al. 2013, 69–74)? In what epistemic position does this then place the exclusivist? Or to use the phrasing preferred in the current “epistemology of disagreement” debates, to what extent, if any, is it reasonable for exclusivists to retain their exclusivistic beliefs when it is acknowledged that epistemic peers disagree?[4]

The answer, as some see it, is that exclusivists can no longer justifiably maintain that their exclusivistic beliefs are true. J.L. Schellenberg, for example, argues that because no more than one among a set of incompatible truth claims can be true, disputants in a debate over such claims are justified in continuing to maintain that their claim is true only if they possess nonquestion-begging justification — justification based on assumptions and lines of reasoning acceptable to both parties — for believing the incompatible claim of any competitor to be false. However, since disputants in no religious conflicts possess such justification, disputants cannot be justified “in holding their own claim to be true.” Or, As Schellenberg states this conclusion in another context, we must conclude that in the absence of objective, nonquestion-begging justification, none of the disputants in religious conflicts “has justification for supposing the others’ claims false” (Schellenberg 2000, 213). David Silver comes to a similar conclusion: “[Exclusivists] should provide independent evidence for the claim that they have a special source of religious knowledge ... or they should relinquish their exclusivist religious beliefs” (Silver 2001, 11).

In more recent discussions, this perspective is sometimes labeled “(strong) Conciliationism” (Christensen 2007, 2016; Feldman 2006) or the “Equal Weight View” (Cohen 2013). When exclusivists and their epistemic peers disagree and exclusivists can offer no independent reasons that establish their position, then exclusivists should acknowledge that their perspective has no greater epistemic weight than those of their epistemic competitors and either suspend judgment or abandon their exclusivistic position and grant equal epistemic status to all the self-consistent, comprehensive perspectives in play.

Others have not gone this far, arguing rather that while exclusivists need not abandon religious belief in the face of unresolved conflict, they must, or at least be willing to, hold their exclusive religious beliefs more tentatively (with less confidence). Philip Quinn argues, for instance, that acknowledged epistemic parity necessarily has a negative (epistemically humbling) impact on the level of justification for any religious belief system. Such parity does not necessarily reduce justification below a level sufficient for rational acceptability. But for those proponents of a religion who are “sufficiently aware of religious diversity, the justification that the [religion] receives from its sources is a good deal less than would be the case were there no such diversity” (Quinn 2005a, 137). James Kraft agrees, arguing that when individuals acknowledge that those with whom they disagree are equivalently informed and capable and have made no obvious mistakes in reasoning, their confidence in their perspective is rightly reduced (Kraft 2007)

The tentativeness this reduction in confidence produces, McKim tells us, does not entail never-ending inquiry. What it means, rather, is that in the face of unresolved religious diversity, a person should be open to the possibility “that one or more of the [alternatives] may be correct … that the position one had thought to be correct may be wrong [while] one of the other positions may be right” (McKim 2001, 154–55). Joseph Runzo and Gary Gutting agree. According to Runzo, “all faith commitments must be held with the humbling recognition that they can be misguided, for our knowledge is never sure” (Runzo 1993, 236). Gutting argues that only interim, not decisive assent is justified in the face of unresolved diversity and that “those who give merely interim assent must recognize the equal value, as an essential element in the continuing discussion, of beliefs contrary to theirs” (Gutting 1982, 108). Moreover, argues McKim, such tentativeness in the face of diversity has an important payoff. It can lead to deep tolerance: the allowance “that those with whom you disagree are people whom it is worthwhile to approach with rational arguments” (McKim 2001, 178) And personal tolerance of this sort, we are told, may well lead to a more tolerant and open society that will permit and even encourage a diversity of opinion on all issues, including opinions on religious matters. [Whether this is in fact the case will be considered in detail in Section 6.]

William Alston represents an even more charitable response to exclusivism. His perspective is based on what he sees as a crucial distinction between two types of epistemic disputes: those in which “it is clear what would constitute non-circular grounds for supposing one of the contestants to be superior to the others” and those in which it is not. In the former case—in those cases in which there is a commonly accepted “procedure for settling disputes”—it isn’t clear, he acknowledges, that it is rational for individuals to continue to maintain that their position is superior (Alston 1988, 442–443).

However, as Alston sees it, there exists no such common ground for settling basic epistemic disputes over religious truth claims, and this, he contends, alters the situation drastically. It still remains true, he grants, that the reality of religious diversity diminishes justification. But the fact that “we are at a loss to specify [common ground]” means, he argues, that with respect to those religious perspectives that are self-consistent, it is not “irrational for one to remain an exclusivist”—not irrational for proponents of any religious perspective to continue to hold that their perspective is true. That is, as Alston sees it, given the absence of common ground for resolving disputes, the proponent of any self-consistent religious perspective can justifiably continue to believe this perspective to be true “despite not being able to show that it is epistemically superior to the competition” (Alston 1988, 443–446). Stated differently yet, Alston grants that objective evidence is necessary for justified belief when the debated issue is one for which such evidence is available. But when objective evidence is not available—as is the case for most important religious contentions—it cannot be required for justified belief.

In fact, at one point he goes even further. Because there exists at present no neutral ground for adjudicating religious epistemic conflicts, it is not only the case, Alston argues, that exclusivists are justified (rational) in continuing to consider their own perspective superior. Since we do not even know in most cases what a non-circular reason for demonstrating superiority would look like, the “only rational course” for exclusivists “is to sit tight” with the beliefs “which [have] served so well in guiding [their] activity in the world.” Or, to generalize this point, Alston speaks for those who maintain that, given the absence of common ground for adjudicating disputes concerning self-consistent religious perspectives, it is not rational for exclusivists to stop maintaining that their system is superior (Alston 1988, 444).[5]

Philip Quinn represents yet another, increasingly popular approach. While he agrees with Alston that in the face of diversity exclusivists may well be justified in continuing to “sit tight”—in continuing to maintain that their religious perspective is true—he denies that this is the only rational course of action available (Quinn 2000, 235–246). The basis for this position is his distinction between a pre-Kantian and a Kantian understanding of religious belief. To have a pre-Kantian understanding of religious belief is to assume that we have (or at least can have) access to the truth as it really is. It is to believe, for instance, that we do (or at least can in principle) know what God is really like. To have a Kantian understanding of religious belief is to assume that although there is a literal noumenal reality, our understanding of this reality (and thus our truth claims about this reality) will of necessity be relative to the cultural/social/psychological lenses through which our conceptualization of this noumenal reality is processed. It is to believe, for instance, that although there is a divine reality about which we can make truth claims, our understanding of (and thus our truth claims about) this divine reality will necessarily to some extent be conditioned by the ways in which our environment (our culture in the broadest sense) has shaped our categories of thought (Quinn 2000, 241–242).

Alston, Quinn contends, is essentially working off of a pre-Kantian model of religious belief when he encourages religious exclusivists to sit tight in the face of peer conflict since, in the absence of any objective basis for determining which perspective is right, the exclusivist has no sufficient reason not to do so. Quinn does not deny that this pre-Kantian approach is justifiable and thus does not deny that someone who follows Alston’s advice to sit tight is rational in doing so. However, Quinn believes that “it should not be taken for granted that any of the [contending perspectives] in its present form is correct.” Hence, he believes it is equally justifiable for an exclusivist to adopt a Kantian approach to religious belief. Specifically, he believes it is equally justifiable for an exclusivist to assume that whatever any of us can know about the truth of the matter will never be a description of religious reality that is free of significant cultural/social/psychological conditioning. Accordingly, it is also rational, he maintains, for exclusivists encountering diverse truth claims to “seek a more inclusivist or pluralistic understanding of their own faith” by modifying their beliefs to bring them “into line with such an understanding” (Quinn 2000, 242).

In short, as Quinn sees it, those who hold a position such as Alston’s have left us, at least implicitly, with a false dilemma: either we find common ground on which we can objectively determine which religious perspective is the truth or we sit tight with what we have. However, Quinn holds that, once we realize it is perfectly reasonable for a person to assume that the proponent of no religious perspective has (or even could have) an accurate understanding of divine reality as it really is, another rational alternative appears. We then see that it is also perfectly rational for people to begin to revise their own phenomenological perspective on the truth in a way that will allow for greater overlap with the phenomenological perspectives of others.

The approach to conflicting religious perspectives Quinn outlines has in fact become increasingly popular in exclusivistic circles. Consider, for example, the ongoing debate among Christians over how God brought the rest of reality into existence. Some still claim the Bible clearly teaches that God created the “heavens and the earth” in six twenty-four hour periods about ten thousand years ago. Others still maintain that the fact that “a day is to the Lord as a thousand years” (Psalms 90:4) means that while God is directly responsible for what the Bible says was created each “day,” it is most reasonable to believe that the time frame for each instance of creative activity could well have been millions, or even billions, of years. And then there are those who still hold that God’s direct creative activity consisted primarily of orchestrating the “Big Bang.” However, more recently, many Christians have taken a more Kantian approach. Based on their assumption that we may well not have access, even through Scripture, to exactly how God was involved in the creative process, they have modified what is to be considered essential to Christianity on this issue. Rather than affirming any of the specific explanations of how God created all else, they affirm a more general contention compatible with each of these specific explanations: that God is in some manner directly responsible for the existence of all else. They have, in Quinn’s terms, thinned their core theologies in a way that reconciles the divergent perspectives. [We will see in sections below that this emphasis on working toward common belief is sometimes cited as a way to minimize differing perspectives on the eternal destiny of humans (Section 7) and to approach diversity of thought on controversial issues in education (Section 8).]

Everyone realizes, though, that moving toward a thinner theology can resolve the epistemic tension produced by religious diversity only to a certain extent. Let’s assume that it is perfectly reasonable, and possibly even preferable, for exclusivists to thin their theologies in an attempt to minimize that core of truths that must be accepted to remain proponents of the specific theological perspectives in question, to be an exclusivist—even a strongly Kantian exclusivist—is still to believe that one’s religious perspectives on some religious beliefs are superior in the sense that they are in some important way closer to the truth than are the competing perspectives of others. Accordingly, while thinning their theology may be a rational choice that can minimize conflict for exclusivists, no one is arguing that a certain amount of epistemic conflict will not remain.

Finally, we find at the far end of the spectrum those who deny that acknowledged peer conflict does in fact require exclusivists to abandon their exclusivism or even reduce confidence in their exclusivistic perspectives. The key to this position is a distinction between personal (private) evidence and public evidence (evidence available to all persons involved in the dispute). It is granted that individuals will often find themselves in epistemic disputes with persons who are epistemic peers in the sense that they are (1) equally intelligent, thoughtful, and free from obvious bias and (2) equally familiar with all the relevant public evidence. But it is normally acknowledged that the final judgments made by participants in such disputes are not made solely on this public evidence. Such judgments are based also on personal beliefs to which only each participant has access. Jennifer Lackey notes, for instance, that individuals in an epistemic dispute have greater access to the reliability of their own belief-forming faculties than do their epistemic competitors (Lackey 2010). Ernest Sosa talks of a gulf between the private and public domains (Sosa 2010). Peter van Inwagen speaks of “incommunicable insight that the others, for all their merits, lack” (van Inwagen 1996). And the weight of this private evidence, it is argued, can make it reasonable for individuals to retain their beliefs (including exclusivistic religious beliefs) with the same level of confidence, even in the face of acknowledged peer disagreement in the public sense.

Some critics, of course, will maintain that this is primarily a verbal victory. The question, remember, is whether exclusivists who acknowledges that epistemic peers hold incompatible perspectives can continue to justifiably maintain with full confidence that their perspective is superior. And it will seem to some that to claim that participants in epistemic disputes have access to relevant personal evidence not available to their epistemic competitors is in fact simply to acknowledge that the dispute is really not among true epistemic peers in the sense originally intended—that is, in the sense that all parties are assessing the same body of evidence.

5. Religious Diversity and Apologetics

Let us assume that exclusivists are justified in retaining their exclusivistic belief in the face of religious diversity. Ought they stop there or can they justifiably go further? Can they justifiably try to convince others of their rightness—can they justifiably try to convert others to their perspective? And if so, are they in any sense obligated to do so?

Most who believe that such proselytization is not justified challenge the moral character of exclusivists who attempts to convince those with whom they differ to accept their perspective as the sole truth. For instance, Wilfred Cantwell Smith argues that “except at the cost of insensitivity or delinquency, it is morally not possible actually to go out into the world and say to devout, intelligent fellow human beings [that] we believe that we know God and we are right; you believe that you know God, and you are totally wrong” (Smith 1976, 14). And when Runzo claims that exclusivism can be “highly presumptive” and “morally repugnant” (Runzo 1988, 348) or John Hick maintains that exclusivists often manifest a sort of arbitrariness or arrogance (Hick 1989, 235), they too appear to be challenging the moral character of those who attempt to convert others to their perspective.

Not surprisingly, most exclusivists deny that it is insensitive or arrogant or presumptive for exclusivists to attempt to convince others that the exclusivistic perspective is alone the correct one. Since we are justified in believing our position to be superior to others—closer to the truth—it is difficult to see, exclusivists argue, how our attempts to convince others that they should agree can be considered arrogant or presumptive or insensitive, especially if we believe that it is important for the welfare of those we are attempting to convert that they do so. Moreover, exclusivists continue, while it is surely true that some conversion is attempted for what we would all agree are morally inappropriate reasons—for instance, for financial gain or to gain power over others—there is little empirical evidence that exclusivists in general have these motives. It is probably true, rather, that many, if not most, exclusivists who proselytize do so primarily because they believe they have what others need and are willing (sometimes at great personal cost) to share it with them.

Are, though, exclusivists required to proselytize? Many exclusivistic religious systems do require proselytization, and most philosophers who believe that exclusivists are justified in retaining their exclusivistic beliefs in the face of religious diversity believe also that these exclusivists can justifiably feel obligated to attempt to “convert” their epistemic competitors. With very few exceptions, though, philosophers deny that exclusivists are under any general obligation to proselytize, regardless of whether the exclusivistic system in question demands or encourages such proselytization.[6]

6. Religious Diversity and Religious Tolerance

Religious intolerance, defined as the practice of keeping others from acting in accordance with their religious beliefs, is not new. However, there is concern world-wide over the increasing amount, and increasingly violent nature, of such behavior. Accordingly, there is understandably a renewed interest in fostering religiously tolerant environments in which individuals with differing religious perspectives can practice their faiths unencumbered.

A number of philosophers have turned their attention to the relationship between religious diversity and religious tolerance, with the main focus on whether acknowledgement of, and subsequent reflection on, religious diversity might lead to greater religious tolerance. The main argument supporting the claim that acknowledged diversity can foster tolerance was proposed by Philip Quinn (Quinn 2001, 57–80; 2002, 533–537; 2005a, 136–139). He maintained that (1) serious reflection on the undeniable reality of religious diversity will necessarily weaken people’s justification for believing that their religious perspective is superior to the perspectives of others and that (2) this weakened justification can, and hopefully will for some, lead to greater religious tolerance—for example, will lead to a more accepting, less confrontational attitude toward others.

Both of Quinn’s contentions have been challenged. The claim that reflection on the acknowledged reality of religious diversity reduces individuals’ justified confidence in the superiority of their position has been subject to at least two types of criticism. As noted earlier in our discussion of religious diversity and epistemic obligation (section 3), some philosophers agree with Alvin Plantinga that the proponents of a given religious perspective need not grant that their competitors are actually on an equal epistemic footing and are thus justified in continuing to maintain that their perspective is superior without further reflection (Plantinga 1997, 296).

Other philosophers do not deny that proponents of differing religious perspectives are on an equal epistemic footing or that reflection on these diverse perspectives might in some cases actually cause individuals to become less certain that their perspective is superior. They do deny, however, that there is any necessary epistemic connection between acknowledged diversity and a weakening of justified personal commitment. That is, they argue, proponents of a given religious perspective can acknowledge both that (1) those holding perspectives differing from their own are epistemic peers and that (2) they are not in a position to demonstrate objectively that their position is superior and yet can justifiably continue to maintain that (3) their perspective is, in fact, superior (Hasker 2008).

Quinn’s second contention—that weakened justification in the superiority of a perspective has the promising potential for fostering religious tolerance—has also been challenged. For instance, William Lane Craig, Robert McKim, and Keith Yandell have all argued that if individuals weaken their conviction that the specific teachings of their religion are correct, including the relevant moral teachings that prohibit intolerance, it might in turn actually make it more likely that they will engage in intolerant behavior as it may well deflate the very confidence in the relevant beliefs needed for inspiring tolerance (Craig 2008; McKim 2008; Yandell 2008).

Others, such as William Hasker, have questioned whether Quinn’s challenge to those who hold firmly to the superiority of their religious perspectives—that the reality of religious diversity requires that they hold their perspectives less firmly—will have the effect Quinn intended. It was his hope that those challenged in this fashion would “soften” their exclusivistic convictions and thus be less likely to engage in intolerant behavior. But might not just the opposite occur? Might not those told that the reality of religious diversity reduces their justified confidence in their beliefs feel threatened and thus, in an attempt to “stand up for the truths” they still firmly believe, become even more intolerant of those with other perspectives (Hasker 2008)?

Those sympathetic to Quinn’s position do not deny that some who find the justification for their religious beliefs challenged might for that reason find themselves with a weaker basis for refraining from intolerant behavior or become even more intolerant in defense of the beliefs they continue to hold firmly. But those sympathetic to Quinn’s “pathway from diversity to tolerance” maintain that acknowledged religious diversity can, and often does, foster in individuals (1) greater respect for their epistemic competitors and their positions and (2) a more flexible, inclusive understanding of their own position. And those who respect their competitors and have a more inclusive understanding of their own perspectives, they add, are less likely to engage in inappropriate intolerant religious behavior (Basinger 2008; Dormandy 2020).

7. Religious Diversity and the Eternal Destiny of Humankind

The discussion of religious diversity thus far has been framed in terms of truth claims (in terms of justified belief) because it is increasingly recognized by philosophers as the best way to access the most important questions that the reality of such diversity forces upon us. Historically, however, there has been one specific “diversity issue” with which philosophers of religion have been most concerned: the question of the eternal destiny of humankind, that is, the question of who can spend eternity in God’s presence—who can obtain salvation.

Those who are religious exclusivists on this question claim that those, and only those, who have met the criteria set forth by one religious perspective can spend eternity in God’s presence.[7] Adherents of other religious perspectives, it is acknowledged, can affirm truth related to some or many issues. But with respect to the question of salvation (one’s eternal destiny), a person must come to understand and adhere to the unique way. Or, to be more specific, as salvific exclusivists see it, the criteria for salvation specified by the one correct religious perspective are both epistemologically necessary in the sense that those seeking salvation must be aware of these conditions for salvation and ontologically necessary in the sense that these conditions must really be met (Peterson et al. 2013, 322).[8]

It is important to note, though, that not only Christians are salvific exclusivists. For example, just as Christian salvific exclusivists maintain that only those who respond appropriately to requirements set for in Christian belief can spend eternity in God’s presence, Muslim salvific exclusivists maintain that “whether a person is ‘saved’ or not is principally determined by whether he or she responded appropriately to Islamic belief” (Aijaz 2014, 194).

Also important to note is that differing, sometimes even conflicting, exclusivistic claims can exist within the same world religion. For instance, significant intra-Christian debate has centered historically on the eternal fate of young children who die. For some, the answer was (and still is) that all children who die are separated from God eternally. Others have believed that God “elects” some for heaven and allows the rest to spend eternity in hell, while still others have held that only the deceased children of believers are allowed to enter heaven or that salvation for children who die is tied to the sacrament of baptism. A more common belief today among Christians, though, is that all those who die in early childhood (or die having possessed only the mental capacities of young children) enter automatically into God’s eternal presence (Basinger 1992, 4).

But what of those “adults” who die having never been aware of the salvific conditions of the one true religion? Is it not clearly unjust for exclusivists to claim that they cannot spend eternity with God because they have not met the criteria for salvation stipulated by this religion? For salvific inclusivists, the answer is yes. Like exclusivists, inclusivists believe that eternal existence in God’s presence is only possible because of the salvific provisions noted in the one true religion. However, they do not maintain “that only the believers or practitioners of that religion, during their earthly lives, will be redeemed” (Benton 2020). Religious inclusivists allow that some adherents of other religions can be saved because of these provisions, even if the individuals in question haven’t made the personal commitments normally stipulated as necessary to appropriate these salvific provisions. Put in philosophical language, as inclusivists see it, particular salvific events may be ontologically necessary for salvation in the sense that salvation cannot occur without them but not epistemically necessary in the sense that one need not know about them to be saved or liberated (Moser 2011; Peterson et al. 2013, 334).

Probably the best known Christian proponent of this inclusivist perspective is Karl Rahner. Christianity, he argues, cannot recognize any other religion as providing the way to salvation. However, since God is love and desires everyone to be saved, God can apply the results of Jesus’s atoning death and resurrection to everyone, even to those who have never heard of Jesus and his death or have never acknowledged his lordship. Just as adherents to pre-Christian Judaism were able, through the redemptive acts of Jesus of which they were not aware, to enter God’s presence, so, too, is it possible for adherents of other religions to enter God’s presence, even though they are not aware of the necessary redemptive acts of Jesus that makes this possible (Peterson et al. 2013, 334–335).

Inclusivists, it should be noted, differ on the conditions such “anonymous Christians” must meet. Some stipulate, for instance, that those who have never heard “the gospel” still have both some innate knowledge of God and the freedom to establish a relationship with God and, therefore, that the eternal destiny of those in this category is dependent on the extent to which they commit as much as they know of themselves to as much as they know of God through, or even apart from, a religion other than Christianity. Other inclusivists don’t want to be as specific, maintaining only that, because God is just, there will surely be some adherents of other religions who will be in God’s presence because they have met some set of divine conditions they have it within their power to meet. But all agree these “anonymous Christians” are the recipients of supernatural grace.

Murtadha Mutahhari is a respected proponent of Muslim inclusivism. He maintains that non-Muslims are at a disadvantage because it is the Islamic Divine Law that leads people to God. Those who fully understand this law (Islam) but choose not to accept the truth will be damned. However, in accordance with Islamic jurisprudence, God will be merciful to those who seek the truth but from whom, through no fault of their own, the reality of Islam remains hidden. Such people cannot be called unbelievers; they are rather “dispositional Muslims” since it is possible to possess the requisite spirit of submission without being Muslim in name. These individuals will receive the divine grace necessary to achieve salvation from Hell (Mutahhari 2006; Legenhausen 1997). Others go so far as to question whether Muslims can justifiably be exclusivists (Aijaz 2014).

Salvific pluralists, however, find such reasoning no more convincing than that offered by exclusivists. Inclusivists are right, pluralists grant, to say that individuals need not necessarily know of or fulfill certain requirements normally specified in a given religion to attain salvation. But inclusivists, like exclusivists, are wrong to argue that this salvation is, itself, possible only because of certain conditions or events described in the one true religion. There is no one true religion and, therefore, no single path to eternal existence with God.

Why, though, ought we consider this pluralistic salvific hypothesis more plausible than that offered by the exclusivist or inclusivist? According to Hick, the most influential proponent of pluralism, three factors make a pluralistic perspective the only plausible option. First, and foremost, he argues, is the reality of transformation parity. An efficacious salvific process is not just other-world centered—does not simply give individuals a “ticket” to eternal existence with God. It begins “the transformation from self-centeredness to Reality-centeredness” in this life (Hick 1984, 229). That is, an efficacious salvific process changes lives in the sense that it begins to turn people from thinking about, and acting only to enhance, their own personal well-being to viewing themselves as responsible participants in a much greater, more expansive reality. In short, an efficacious salvific process makes its participants better people. And all the evidence we have, Hick maintains, shows that many religions are equally transformational, given any general standard for positive transformation we might want to consider (Hick 1989, chapter 3).

There continues to be debate, however, over whether the same basic personal transformation actually does occur within various religions—over whether there is real transformational parity. Few claim that there is a strong experiential basis for denying such transformational parity or that it can be demonstrated on other objective, nonquestion-begging grounds that such parity does not exist. However, proponents of many basic theistic systems claim that while transformational parity may appear to be the case, this is actually not so—that is, claim that the transformation within their systems actually is qualitatively different than that produced by allegiance to other systems. It is sometimes argued, for instance, that the transformation within other systems will not last, or at least that this transformation, while possibly real and even lasting for a given individual, is not what it could have been for that individual within the one true theistic system. And some exclusivists have argued that unless it can be demonstrated in an objective, nonquestion-begging sense that they are not justified in affirming a religious perspective that makes such claims (which even Hick does not attempt to demonstrate), they are justified in denying that such parity actually exists (Clark 1997, 303–320).

It can also be argued that focusing on transformational parity can be used as an argument against salvific pluralism. The basis for this claim is the fact that people making a “secular” (non-religious) commitment to some goal, value, or metaphysical perspective—be it concern for the environment or world hunger or emotional health—often appear to have their lives transformed in ways quite similar to the ways in which the lives of religious believers are transformed. They, too, appear to have changed from self-centeredness to a focus on reality outside of self. If this is so, however, then might it not be that the religious transformational parity we observe is simply a sub-set of the general transformational parity we find among individuals who commit themselves to any perspective on life that centers reality outside of self, and thus that it is just as plausible to assume that all religious transformational parity is the result of some form of internal conceptual realignment than the result of some form of connection with an external divine reality? And if this is the case, then transformational parity is at least weakened as support for any salvific perspective, whether pluralistic, inclusivistic, or exclusivistic.

Seeming transformational parity is not, however, Hick’s only reason for believing non-pluralistic salvific perspectives to be untenable. A credible perspective, he tells us, must account for the fact, “evident to ordinary people (even though not always taken into account by theologians) that in the great majority of cases—say 98 to 99 percent—the religion in which a person believes and to which he adheres depends upon where he was born” (Hick 1980, 44). Given this fact—given that “religious allegiance depends in the great majority of cases on the accident of birth”—it seems implausible to hold that “being born in our particular part of the world carries with it the privilege of knowing the full religious truth” (Hick 1997a, 287).

This contention, though, has also been challenged. No one denies that the admittedly high correlation between where and when individuals are born and the religious perspective they affirm is relevant and might in fact negatively affect an exclusivist’s confidence. But many exclusivists deny that a pluralistic explanation should be seen as the only plausible option. As they see it, exclusivists need not consider the high place-time/religious allegiance correlation in question in isolation from other relevant beliefs. For example, Christian exclusivists need not consider this correlation in isolation from their basic belief that the Bible is an authoritative source of truth and that the Bible teaches that only the Christian perspective contains a totally accurate view of reality. And it is justifiable, some maintain, for exclusivists to consider the plausibility of such relevant background beliefs to outweigh the seeming counterevidence posed by the correlation in question (Plantinga 2000, 187; Plantinga 1997, 198).

Finally, Hick argues, a credible religious hypothesis must account for the fact, of which “we have become irreversibly aware in the present century, as the result of anthropological, sociological, and psychological studies and the work of philosophy of language,” that there is no one universal and invariable pattern for the interpretation of human experience, but rather a range of significantly different patterns or conceptual schemes “which have developed within the major cultural streams.” When considered in this light, a “pluralistic theory becomes inevitable” (Hick 1984, 232).

While no one denies that culture shapes reality to some extent, it can again be argued that when comparing the plausibility of specific beliefs, we must consider not only these specific beliefs themselves but also the basic background beliefs in which they are embedded. Thus, even if we grant that a pluralistic response to the obvious shaping power of culture is preferable to any exclusivistic response when such shaping power is considered in isolation, it isn’t clear that exclusivists must acknowledge that Hick’s hypothesis is so strong that it renders implausible the whole set of basic background beliefs out of which the exclusivist’s response to the profound shaping influence of culture on religious belief arises. Hence, it isn’t clear that exclusivists can’t justifiably reject Hick’s contention that a pluralistic cultural/religious interpretation of reality must inevitably be considered superior.

Hick argues for salvific pluralism on what might best be called metaphysical or epistemological grounds. Other philosophers, however, have attempted to make a moral case for salvific pluralism (or at least against salvific exclusivism.) For instance, Kenneth Himma has argued that moral considerations require Christian salvific exclusivism to be rejected (Himma 2002, 1–33). It follows both from God’s perfection and conceptual truths about punishment, Himma maintains, that God would not punish individuals who are not morally culpable for their behavior. But those with non-Christian beliefs are generally not morally culpable for the fact that they hold these beliefs. Not only is it not the case that any objective line of reasoning demonstrates the Christian (or any other religious) path to salvation to be the correct one, religious traditions are, themselves, extremely elastic. That is, because of the shaping, foundational nature of basic religious belief, devout proponents of any given religion are capable of (in fact, usually simply find themselves) offering self-consistent responses to almost any challenge to their salvific perspective, no matter how strong or damaging this challenge might seem on the surface. Furthermore, sociological, psychological, and anthropological studies have confirmed that while one’s basic religious beliefs are not inevitable, they are quite often to a significant extent “beyond the direct volitional control of the believer” (Himma 2002, 18). So we must conclude, argues Himma, that it would not be morally just for the Christian God to deny salvation to devout people of other faiths.

Not surprisingly, many inclusivists and pluralists will find this basic line of reasoning persuasive. However, some (although not all) exclusivists reject the basic moral assumption on which Himma’s argument is based: that we are in a position to correctly identify some of the basic moral principles that guide God’s interaction with us as humans. Specifically, while many Christian exclusivists do believe that God’s behavior is guided by the same basic principles of justice and fairness that are so fundamental to our human moral thinking, this is not true for all. There is a strong Christian tradition that holds that God is under no obligation to treat any individual in what we would consider a just, fair fashion. God can do what God wants (including how God responds to those who haven’t affirmed Christian beliefs) for whatever purposes God has. What God does is right simply because God does it.[9] Even among those Christian exclusivists who come to acknowledge Himma’s basic point—that a just God cannot condemn those who aren’t culpable for their non-Christian beliefs—the response has normally not been to reject their overall exclusivistic perspective. It is often simply assumed, rather, that “God’s ways are above our ways” in some manner unfathomable to the human mind.

However, even if we were to agree with pluralists that both exclusivists and inclusivists are wrong to claim that the basis for true salvation can be found in only one religion, the question of what type of pluralistic hypothesis we ought to affirm remains. Hick, himself, favors what might be called a selective pluralism that centers on the world’s great religions. Hick has never denied that the major world religions—Christianity, Hinduism, Buddhism, Islam—make conflicting truth claims. In fact, he believes that “the differences of belief between (and within) the traditions are legion” and has often discussed these conflicts in great detail (Hick 1983, 487). His basic pluralistic claim, rather, is that such differences are best seen as differing ways in which differing cultures have conceived of and experienced the one ultimate divine Reality. Each major religious perspective “constitutes a valid context of salvation/liberation; but none constitutes the one and only such context” (Hick 1984, 229, 231).

Why, however, select only the paths offered by the world’s great religions as ways to salvation? For Hick, the answer lies in the fact that, unlike “Satanism, Nazism, the Order of the Solar Temple, etc.,” the world’s great religions offer paths that lead us away from “hatred, misery, aggression, unkindness, impatience, violence, and lack of self-control” to love, joy, peace, patience, kindness, goodness, faithfulness, gentleness, and self-control (Hick 1997b, 164). Some, though, see this sort of ethical standard for acceptable salvific perspectives to be as arbitrary as the standard for acceptable paths to salvation set forth by exclusivists or inclusivists (Meeker 2003, 5). In fact, some have questioned whether, given this rather specific ethical criterion for assessing the salvific adequacy of religions, Hick’s perspective should actually be considered pluralistic at all.

S. Mark Heim, for instance, argues that pluralists such as Hick are really inclusivists in disguise in that they advocate only one path to salvation—the transformation from self-centeredness to Reality-centeredness—and thus in essence deny that diverse religions have real, fundamental salvific differences. A better, more honest salvific pluralism, we are told, is to acknowledge that each religion has its own path to salvation that may be either similar to or different from that of other religions. That is, a more honest pluralistic perspective is to deny that the seemingly different salvific paths offered by various religious traditions are all just culturally distinct manifestations of the same fundamental path and maintain instead that salvific paths of various religions remain incompatible, but equally valid ways to achieve salvation. It is acknowledged that this is not to say, of course, that all the details of all the salvific paths are actually true since some of the relevant claims are inconsistent. But the appropriate response to this is not to claim there is one true path to salvation. It is rather to claim that many distinct paths, while remaining distinct, can lead to salvation (Heim 1995).

Critics, however, wonder whether part of this seeming disagreement is verbal in nature. Heim can appear to be bypassing the question of whether there is some sort of final, ultimate eschatological salvific state that the proponents of various religious perspectives will all experience, emphasizing rather that many distinct religious paths can liberate people (produce salvation) here and now (Peterson et al. 2013, 333). Hick, on the other hand, seems most concerned with the nature of salvific reality—with what it means to experience salvation—while not denying that there exist in this world distinct ways that remain distinct to access this ultimate reality.

8. Religious Diversity in Public Education

Public education in Western culture has always been to some extent a “melting pot.”[10] But the increasing number of students with non-Western cultural values and religious traditions is causing public school educators to grapple in new and sometimes uncomfortable ways with the challenges such diversity poses. Some of these challenges are practical—e.g., should Muslim girls be allowed to wear hijabs, should schools designate only Christian religious holy days as school holidays? The focus of this section, however, will be a pedagogical question of increasing interest in the philosophy of education: How ought the increasing religious diversity to which students are exposed affect public school curricula?

Most public school educators agree that increasing student understanding of diverse religious perspectives is important as this will have positive social outcomes. It is often argued, for instance, that helping students better understand the increasing diversity, including religious diversity, they face will better prepare them to live in a peaceful, productive manner with those with differing cultural and/or religious values (Kunzman 2006).

Many educators, however, want to go further. It is also important, they maintain, for students to clarify their feelings about other religions and their followers. Specifically, they want to foster a more empathetic understanding of other religious perspectives, an understanding that encourages students to appreciate the other religions from the perspective of an adherent of that religion (Kunzman 2006). While few challenge this as a valid goal, there is, though, continuing controversy over one common method by which educators attempt to engender this type of empathy in students. As some see it, while having students think about diverse religions is an important step past the mere dissemination of factual information toward empathetic understanding, having students directly experience these religions in some way—for instance, having students visit a local mosque or having a representative from a Hindu Temple share with students in a class—is also necessary (or at least very desirable). Not surprisingly, though, while no one denies that these forms of direct experience might broaden a student’s empathetic understanding of a religion, concerns have been raised.

First, some believe that having students experience a religion, even as “observers,” can test the limits of the separation of church and state. While the intent of having students attend a mosque or having a Buddhist talk with students is seldom to “promote” a religion, the line between “exposure” and intended or unintended promotion (and even proselytization), they maintain, is a fine one. This is especially the case given the widely varying communication skills and deeply embedded values and preconceptions of the teacher and/or the representatives of a given religion to whom students might be exposed. Second, there is growing ethical concern that to experience a religion as an observer might in some cases trivialize or demean the religion in question. Some Native Americans, for instance, are becoming increasingly concerned with the growing desire of “outsiders” to seek understanding of their religion(s) by watching or experiencing sacred ceremonies since such observation, they believe, can trivialize these ceremonies (Kasprisin 2003: 422).

Is it justifiable for the public school educator to go even further than the dissemination of accurate information and the attempted engendering of empathetic understanding? Specifically, ought an educator attempt to bring it about that all students affirm a core set of “appropriate” beliefs about other religions and their adherents?

It is clearly the case that almost all public school educators currently do attempt to bring it about that students hold certain beliefs related to pervasive human characteristics, such as race, gender, and disabling conditions. Students are encouraged, for instance, to continue to believe, or come to believe, that engaging in intolerant or discriminatory behavior is wrong and that they should affirm, or come to affirm, the inherent worth and rights of the disabled, those of other racial/ethnic backgrounds, etc. So if the desire is simply to also encourage students to believe it wrong to treat those of other religions in intolerant or discriminatory ways and to believe it right to accept those of other religions as persons with equal inherent value, few will object.

However, need teachers stop there? Might there not be other beliefs about religions and their adherents that public school educators can justifiably attempt to bring it about that all students accept? We can extrapolate from some work on religious diversity by Robert Wuthnow to introduce two beliefs that some might propose fit into this category. As Wuthnow sees it, the most appropriate response to the increasing religious diversity we face in the United States is what he labels “reflective pluralism” (Wuthnow 2005: 286–307). To engage in this sort of reflection, he tells us, is not simply to become better informed, or to strive to “live peacefully with those with whom one disagrees” (be tolerant), or even to attempt to develop an empathetic understanding of diverse religions. It is to engage intentionally and purposefully with “people and groups whose religious practices are fundamentally different from one’s own” (Wuthnow 2005: 289). And such engagement, as he understands it, includes both (1) the recognition that since all of our beliefs, including our religious beliefs, depend on a point of view “shaped by the culture in which we live,” we should not regard our “own position[s] as inherently superior” and (2) “a principled willingness to compromise” in the sense that we must be willing to move out of our social and emotional comfort levels “in order to arrive at a workable relationship with another person” (Wuthnow 2005: 292).

The benefit of this form of engagement, we are told, is not only that it can minimize the likelihood of the sorts of “religious tensions, conflicts, and violence [that] have been so much a part of human history” (Wuthnow 2005: 293). Such reflective engagement also allows us to focus on “the shared concerns for basic human dignity” found in the teachings of many of the world’s religions, which can furnish a basis for inter-religious cooperation to combat social ills and meet basic social needs (Wuthnow 2005: 294).

It is important to note that Wuthnow does not explicitly claim or deny that encouraging students in a public school setting to become reflective pluralists would be appropriate. But not only does he highlight two increasingly popular pluralistic claims about religions—(1) that the beliefs of many religions are equally valid expressions of faith, expressions that adherents of these religions should be allowed or even encouraged to maintain and (2) that religious believers of all faiths should identify and focus on what these religions have in common—he highlights what such pluralists often note as the main benefits of widespread affirmation of these beliefs: a reduction in violent religious conflicts and an increase in socially beneficial inter-religious cooperation. And these outcomes are clearly quite compatible with what we have seen to be a key reason why public school educators want to increase student understanding of other religions—namely, their desire to better prepare students to live in a peaceful, productive manner in social contexts that will increasingly be characterized by religious diversity. Accordingly, since it seems reasonable to believe that widespread acceptance of the validity of diverse religious perspectives and increased focus on the commonalities in diverse religions might well result in more peaceful, mutually beneficial interaction among followers of diverse religions, the question of whether public school teachers can justifiably attempt to bring it about that students affirm the beliefs in question appears worthy of exploration.

Let’s first consider the contention that many religions contain equally valid expressions of faith. Even if we make the debatable assumption that this is true, it won’t be clear to many that public school teachers could justifiably attempt to bring it about that their students believed this to be so. The problem is that various religions affirm conflicting doctrinal beliefs on significant issues. For example, while conservative Christians maintain that one must affirm certain beliefs about the saving power of Christ to spend eternity in God’s presence, conservative Muslims strongly deny this. Orthodox Christians and Muslims are taught not only that the sacred scriptures of other religions contain false beliefs; they are often encouraged to try to convert those of other religions to their religious perspective. And while many Muslims and Christians believe in a personal supernatural creator and personally immortality, some Buddhists deny both. This, however, means that an educator can justifiably attempt to convince students that all religions are equally valid expressions of faith only if she or he can justifiably attempt to convince conservative proponents of some of these religions that some of their core doctrinal beliefs need to be modified or rejected. To attempt to do this in a public school setting will be seen by many as violating the prohibition against both restricting the free exercise of religion and promoting a given religion (Basinger 2010)

Might it not, though, at least be justifiable for a public school educator to encourage students to respect the right of adherents to other religions to retain their current religious beliefs? If we interpret this as asking whether an educator can justifiably encourage students not to attempt to prohibit adherents to other religions from expressing and acting in accordance with their beliefs, a positive response is noncontroversial since this is only to say once again that educators should encourage students to be tolerant. However, to encourage respect for the religious beliefs of others often carries with it the explicit or implicit assumption that it is inappropriate, if not unethical, to attempt to convince adherents of one religion to convert to another. And for a public school educator to attempt to convince all students that it is wrong to proselytize will again be seen by some as placing this educator in the legally and morally questionable position of attempting to convince some students to reject or modify what for them is a very fundamental, core religious belief.

Perhaps, however, there is a different, less controversial option for those educators who want to do more than simply encourage tolerance of expression and empathetic understanding. Is it not at least justifiable for the public school teacher to attempt to point out the important common values affirmed by most of the world’s major religions, values that we can all accept and should all desire to see lived out? Is it not justifiable for an educator to point out, for instance, that most of the world’s major religions prohibit such things as killing, lying, stealing, dehumanizing racism, and sexual exploitation, and that these same religions encourage such things as helping those in need and treating adherents of other religions with respect. To do so, it has been argued, would not simply be of value within the classroom or community. Since religious convictions clearly influence social, political, and economic activity on a global scale, emphasizing the shared common values of religions has the potential to facilitate better global relationships. And to encourage such relationships is surely an appropriate goal of public education (Shingleton 2008).

Some, of course, will see any focus on “positive commonalities” as yet another thinly veiled attempt to encourage students to modify their current religious beliefs in ways that make such beliefs more accommodating of other religious perspectives. However, most see no legal or ethical reason why a teacher should not expose students to the “positive commonalities” in diverse religious perspectives, and many see this as a helpful step.

9. Conclusion

As we have seen, discussions of religious diversity lend themselves to no easy answers. The issues are many, the arguments complex, and the responses varied. It would be hard, though, to overstate the practical significance of this topic. While some (many) issues that philosophers discuss have practical implications for how we view ourselves and treat others, none is more relevant today than the question of religious diversity. Religious convictions have not only motivated impassioned behavior in the past—behavior that has affected significantly the lives of many—such convictions clearly continue to do so today. So continuing philosophical discussions of religious diversity that clarify issues and assess arguments have the potential to be of great practical value.


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