Robert Kilwardby

First published Tue Apr 17, 2012; substantive revision Thu Jul 8, 2021

Robert Kilwardby (ca. 1215–1279) was a Dominican Provincial and later Archbishop of Canterbury, who started his academic career around 1231 at the University of Paris. As a Master of Arts he is one of the first to comment on the newly available Aristotelian logical works, commentaries whose influence is generally recognized. His is also a widely read introduction to the sciences, the De ortu scientiarum. He is however mostly associated with Augustinian thought, especially on the plurality of substantial forms and the active nature of perception, and through his involvement in the controversy surrounding the Prohibitions in 1277 of thirty articles on logic, grammar, and natural philosophy. He was promoted to Cardinal and died soon after arriving at the Papal Court of Viterbo, in 1279.

1. Life and works

Robert Kilwardby was an Englishman born either in Leicestershire or in Yorkshire, probably, in 1215. He started his university studies in Paris around 1231, becoming a Master of Arts around 1237. He taught there until 1245, when he moved back to England, at which time he entered into the Dominican Order. This marked the beginning of a rather successful ecclesiastic career. At Oxford (from ca. 1254 onwards), he studied and taught theology until 1261, when he was elected Prior Provincial of the English Dominicans. In 1269 he participated in the Dominican General Chapter in Paris where he, together with Thomas Aquinas (and other members), was responsible for analyzing the process of Bartholomew of Tours (MOPH I, 155). During this period he was also involved in a polemic about the nature of poverty with the Franciscans, after sending a letter on this topic to the novices of his Dominican Order. Kilwardby’s letter is now lost, so our knowledge of this dispute comes from a response by the Franciscan John Pecham, who rebuts Kilwardby’s claims, while citing extensively from the Dominican’s text. Pecham’s hostility towards Kilwardby would continue later on, when he accuses Kilwardby of stealing documents—the register and the records of the See and objects from the See of Canterbury—after Kilwardby’s departure from the See of Canterbury. Kilwardby was nominated Archbishop of Canterbury in 1272. Two of his acts as Archbishop were the coronation of Edward I, at Westminster Abbey, on the 19th of August 1274 and the issuing of the Prohibitions of Oxford on the 18th of March 1277 (see Silva 2012).

Kilwardby’s participation in this last event is at the same time the source of his fame and disgrace. The episode itself consisted in the issuing of a list of 30 denounced articles focusing on the subjects of grammar (4), logic (10), and natural philosophy (16). Despite constituting a major episode of academic censorship in the medieval period, there are two formal points which should not be overlooked: first, the prohibitory rather than condemnatory nature of the list—Kilwardby was explicit that these articles were to be prohibited for being primarily philosophical mistakes and only secondarily against Christian dogma. Anyone found guilty of defending and disseminating these mistakes was, if a Master, to be removed from his teaching position, and if not yet a Master, never to become one and to be expelled from the university. Second, this list was not the result of the Archbishop’s visit to the University of Oxford and a subsequent ill-will towards it, but rather it expressed the consensus of all the regent and non-regent Masters of the University, if the official documents are to be believed.

The proximity to the Condemnations of Paris, issued just eleven days earlier, gave rise to substantial speculation about the relation between these two episodes of censorship. However, no proof of connection between them has been presented, nor does it seem that Kilwardby was acting under Papal orders. The direct targets of these propositions are still to be identified. Nevertheless, already in Kilwardby’s time, some of the propositions in naturalibus were interpreted as aimed at the teaching of Thomas Aquinas, namely those propositions related to his doctrine of the unicity of substantial form. The first reaction came in a letter written by Peter of Conflans, a disciple of Aquinas, to which Kilwardby replies in a detailed manner. (Peter’s letter has not survived but passages are quoted by Kilwardby.) Kilwardby’s answer constitutes the clearest expression of his theory of the plurality of substantial forms in human beings and perhaps the first explicit defense of such a theory. A more institutional reaction took place when the General Chapter of the Order, to which both Aquinas and Kilwardby belonged, met in Milan (1278) and decided to send a commission in order to investigate and punish those who blackened the writings of Thomas Aquinas scandalizing the order (in scandalum ordinis). The results of this commission are unknown. The next Chapter, held in Paris, repeated the recommendation and urged the praise of Thomas’ works. Meanwhile, Pope Nicholas III appointed Kilwardby to the post of Cardinal of Porto and S. Rufina in 1278, which allowed him to move from England to Italy. This nomination can be understood either as an attempt to protect Kilwardby from his own Order or as a way of stopping Kilwardby’s actions against Thomas and Thomism. The Oxford Prohibitions were later interpreted as a campaign against Thomism (Callus 1955), but this interpretation has been challenged (Wilshire 1964). A conciliatory approach could be that in the Prohibitions Kilwardby was criticizing a presumed interpretation of Aristotle that made Aristotle’s doctrine incompatible with his own reading of Augustine. Kilwardby died in 1279, soon after his arrival at the Papal court in Viterbo, where he lies buried. (For more bibliographical details, see Sommer-Seckendorff, 1937; see also Silva 2011; and Silva 2020.)

Two final remarks about Kilwardby’s life and thought. First, although he came to be known as a polemicist, the leitmotif of his work was to harmonize/reconcile Aristotle and Augustine—a certain understanding of Aristotle with a certain understanding of Augustine, that is. Second, his life’s work seems to move against the mainstream of the century he lived in. Most authors had adopted the new Aristotelian philosophy that new translations of known works and especially recently discovered ones (to the Latin West, that is) just made available. Many an author, challenged by these texts, changed their philosophical alliances from traditional Augustinian thought to a more modern and progressive Aristotelianism, “spiced up” by its Arabic commentators. Kilwardby, however, started his career by being a faithful Aristotelian, as his commentaries (mostly on logic) on the works of the Greek philosopher testify. It is only after he had been for some time a Master of Arts at the University of Paris that his philosophical views changed to become more and more influenced by Augustine. If one were to define Kilwardby’s philosophical commitments, it would be more correct to say that he was originally an Aristotelian and converted to Augustinianism without ever ceasing to be an interpreter of Aristotle. Once we keep in mind that he remained an Aristotelian throughout his career—of an eclectic type, it must be said—his thought becomes easier to understand because we are not drawing him against an anti-Aristotelian background that doesn’t fit the theoretical framework he developed during his academic career.

A complete list of works by Kilwardby includes texts on logic, grammar, theology, and natural philosophy. These texts vary greatly in terms of the influence they exerted on later thought, with the logical commentaries occupying a place of relevance. Kilwardby’s works are spread over three main periods: the Parisian period between 1237 and 1245; the middle period, around 1245–1250; and the Oxonian period from 1250 to 1279.

In the Parisian period Kilwardby wrote mainly logical commentaries, among which should be counted those included in the Course on the Logica Vetus (Lewry 1978): on the Isagoge, Praedicamenta, Perihermeneias, Liber Sex Principiorum, and Liber divisionum Boethii. The edition of the whole course was started by the late Patrick Osmund Lewry and is currently being completed by Alessandro Conti (University of L’Aquila, Italy).[1] The commentary on the Isagoge has been the object of a comparative study by David Piché (2002), and the commentary on the Categories is available on-line in a provisory edition by Alessandro Conti. Kilwardby also wrote commentaries on Aristotle’s Prior and Posterior Analytics (the former published under the name of Giles of Rome), as well as the commentaries In librum topycorum (partialy edited by Weijers, 1995; the attribution of this work still remains uncertain), De Sophistici Elenchi, In Priscianus Minor, and Notulae libri Prisciani De accentibus (ed. Lewry, 1988). The commentary on the Prior Analytics was recently edited and translated by Paul Thom and John Scott—having received careful examination in Thom 2007—and the Commentary on the Posterior Analytics has received a provisory critical edition in an unpublished PhD dissertation by Debora Cannone (2003–2004) and more recently examined in Thom 2019. The commentary on the Priscianus Minor remains unedited, but has been examined by Irène Rosier (1994), who transcribes the most relevant passages. Kilwardby is also the author of a Commentary on the Old and New Ethics; the edition of this commentary, which was started by Lewry and continued by Anthony Celano (Stonehill College), is now forthcoming.[2]

From the same period, and previously thought to be Kilwardby’s but now generally regarded as unauthentic, are the In Priscianus Maior and the Sophismata grammaticalia. Also the authorship of In Donati artem maiorem III (ed. Schmücker, 1984) and Sophismata logicalia is now highly disputable.[3] The commentaries on the Physics and on the Metaphysics that were identified by Gál (1953) are now securely attributed to Geoffrey of Aspall (Macrae 1968).

In the period around 1245–1250, when he was moving from Paris to Oxford, Kilwardby wrote the encyclopaedic treatise De ortu scientiarum (ed. Judy, 1976), a treatise on the nature of time (De tempore), and a work on perception entitled De spiritu fantastico (both works were edited by Lewry, 1987).

During the Oxford period (after 1250) Kilwardby wrote an array of disparate works: De natura relationis, Quaestiones in quattuor libros Sententiarum, De 43 questionibus, and Epistola ad Petrum de Confleto. All these works have been edited, even if not all in a critical edition. From the same period are also some minor theological works such as De confessione, De necessitate Incarnationis, De conscientia et de synderesi, the Tabulae super originalia patrum, the Arbor consanguinitatis et affinitatis, and some sermons—the Sermo in capite ieiunii and the Sermo in dominica in Passione. The two sermons have been edited, as well as the work on the necessity of the Incarnation. Worth mentioning is a letter expressing some criticism over Franciscan poverty (Epistola ad novitios de excellentia Ordine Praedicatorum), which survives in John Pecham’s answer (Tractatus contra fratrem Robertum Kilwardby), edited in Pecham’s Tractatus tres de paupertate.

Early lists of works, such as the Stams Catalogue, attribute to Kilwardby the De unitate formarum, De physica, and De metaphysica, whereas Nicholas Trivet mentions the treatise De universali. This latter work is possibly a reference to a passage in Kilwardby’s Notule Libri Posteriorum—“Hec est pars in qua Aristotiles determinat de uniuersali” (Cannone 2002, 132)—which might have circulated isolated from the rest of the work. In the same way, the work De unitate formarum clearly is the last (7th) article of Kilwardby’s answer to a letter sent to him by Peter of Conflans, and it is found alone in some manuscripts.

Recent years have exhibited an increased interest in Kilwardby’s thought and this has been accompanied by substantial editorial work, even if much remains to be done. The texts from the middle and later periods are almost all edited. With the edition of his commentaries on the Prior and Posterior Analytics, as well as on the Ethics, only the commentaries of the old logic and the grammatical works remain unpublished. Recent work by Mora-Márquez, Thom, Hansen, Conti, Silva and Thörnqvist to name just a few (see Bibliography), has focused on logical aspects of Kilwardby’s thought in relation to some of his philosophical interlocutors, such as John Pagus, Nicholas of Paris, and Albert the Great. In this article I will focus on a cursory presentation of Kilwardby’s main philosophical doctrines. A fuller account of these, with exception to 5.2.4, 6, and 7, can be found in Silva 2007, 2008, 2009, 2010, 2011, 2012, 2013, and 2020.

2. The Theory of the soul and the plurality of substantial forms

A human being is a composite of two substances, the body and the soul (DOS 316). The soul is the act and form of the whole (totius) human body (NLPor 8, P 38vb), and it is present wholly in every part of the body (in qualibet parte corporis tota). To be present wholly in every part does not require simplicity, as absence of composition, but spirituality (that is, immateriality) (E 6, 47–48).

According to Kilwardby, the human soul is a composite of three forms (potentiae): vegetative, sensitive, and intellective. The vegetative and sensitive are qualified as the principles of life because through them the being performs the operations of life. Like most of his contemporaries, Kilwardby claims a double origin for the parts of the human soul: the vegetative and sensitive result from natural generation, that is, they are educed from the active potentiality of matter, whereas the intellective soul is created directly by God. It is created as the perfection of the human body and as a hoc aliquid (E 5; QLIIS 138, 370), that is, an individual in the genus of substance. The intellective soul is a spiritual substance of the rational kind, but is not a person because it is part of another thing—a human being (QLIII1S 8, 36). The soul constitutes a person only when united with the body in an actual existing human being (QLIII1S 10, 52). A human being is constituted by the rational soul and the body (E 7, 51).

This difference in genesis explains the different nature of the intellective form with respect to the other forms: whereas the vegetative and the sensitive forms are defined as acts of the body, the intellective form is the actuality of no part of the body and so is the act of the sensitive body in the sense of being its perfection: it is the completion of the process of development, by making it a full member of the human species. The relation of the intellective form to the body is that of the sailor to the ship (sicut nauta navi), but this union is accidental only from the point of view of its operations—such as in understanding, where the intellective soul does not need bodily organs (DOS 56)—but not from the point of view of the essence of the intellective soul (DOS 53).

An essential feature of the intellective soul is its natural desire and inclination (appetitus et inclinatio naturalis) to be united to a body capable of sensation (as it “hates” being separated from it; DOS 358). The intellective soul can exist without the body, but it is not created to exist without it, as it has, on the contrary, a natural inclination to be united with it. It is this ‘unibility’ that differentiates it from the angelic intellective soul (in the same way as the human body is differentiated from the bodies of other animals; QLIIS 7, 26). In Kilwardby’s own words, “the [human] soul is born to move and to perfect the body, and in this way it differs from an angel” (see also QLIIS 6; in this he follows Bonaventure). The intellective soul is the specific (completive) difference in both, but it differs in species: whereas the human intellective soul is created to be united with a body, the angelic intellective soul is non-united with a body (QLIIS 6, 23–24; 7, 26). This unibility (unibilitas) or aptitude to be united with the body is not an accidental feature but something essential to the human intellective soul (QLIIS 7, 27).

The utmost justification for this unibility is the intellective soul’s natural capacity to know everything—an application of the Aristotelian principle that human beings desire to know everything. The rational soul is born (nata est) to know things in a twofold manner. The intellect can turn itself to the eternal, superior reasons, but can also turn its attention both to the images of sensible things received through the senses and abstracted from the phantasms (DSF 25; QLIII2S 24, 84). In so far as knowledge of material things depends on the use of the senses, the intellective soul can only fulfill its perfection by means of its union with the body (QLIIS 8, 32).

Once infused by God, the intellective form connects the previous forms inherent in the body of the embryo (vegetative and sensitive) and constitutes with them a human rational soul, “in much the same way as a quadrangle, which in fact contains two triangles would become a pentagon, if a triangle were added to one of its sides” (D43Q 34, 37; see also E 5, 42). The addition of the new triangle to the existing quadrangle—composite of two triangles—does not cause the corruption of the existing figures, but rather complements and completes them. In the case of the soul, it means that the vegetative and sensitive potentiae continue to be responsible for their operations after the infusion of the completive intellective potentia. The result is the thesis of a pluarlity of forms in the human soul.

Kilwardby’s theory of the soul is formulated around the central conceptions of unity and composition, rather than those of unicity and simplicity. According to Kilwardby, “all composite things have unity, even though they do not have simplicity” (E 6, 47), meaning that complexity is not incompatible with unity, only with simplicity. What is required in addition is only a principle strong enough to justify the unity. He thinks to have found it in what we could call ‘the principle of ordination’: a substance can be composite and nevertheless one when the essentially different parts are ordered to each other (ad invicem), from the less to the more complete. A human being has “one form which is not simple (simplex) but a composite of many [potentiae] having a natural order to each other” (E 7, 53).[4] These forms are organized in a hierarchical structure so that there is one which is the perfection of the whole composite. In the case of human beings, that last completive form is the intellective soul.

Before continuing the examination of Kilwardby’s theory of the human soul, some terminological remarks are in order: Kilwardby uses the term potentiae mostly to refer to the vegetative, sensitive, and intellective souls. There are some exceptions, where he uses formae and even formae substantiales, but the rule is potentiae. For the most part, I leave the term ‘potentia’ un-translated because the options are problematic: ‘power’ should be used to translate ‘virtus’ in the sense of ‘faculty’ (for example, memory is a power of the soul); ‘potency’ should be avoided in order not to confuse it with potentiality, as in active potency; ‘soul’ is misleading because most (if not all) pluralists claimed that there is only one soul in any individual human being—the disagreement between them and unitarians is about whether there is one or many potentiae in a individual human soul rather than whether there is one or many souls in a individual human being; ‘form’ is a too general term—however, for the sake of simplicity I sometimes shall use it, namely in the context of the debate over unicity versus the plurality of substantial forms as that is the traditional designation of the debate. I thoroughly use the term ‘unicity’ to refer to the view according to which the soul is simple, being only one form. Unity is often used in scholarship, but I find it problematic because pluralists—such as Kilwardby—also argue for the unity of the soul, as said above, only disagreeing about its simple (versus composite) nature. Finally, I use ‘intellective’ soul/form (potentia intellectiva) to refer to the specifically human part of the soul; the rational soul (anima rationalis) refers to the whole human soul—which includes the vegetative and sensitive forms. Kilwardby adopts this distinction for the most part, but there are passages—especially in E 5 and QLIIS 8—where he uses rational (rationalis) and intellective (intellectiva) interchangeably.

One of the most important passages in which Kilwardby carefully discusses the human soul is E 5. Here he presents what he takes to be the three more important theories of the human soul, its substantial nature, and its potentiae. I focus on the first of these theories, which is the one he most vehemently criticizes, and on the third, which is his own. They can be displayed in the following way:

(1) According to the first theory, the human rational soul is a substance that is simple in its essence, in other words it has no parts. It is the same essence that vegetates, senses, and understands. The problem Kilwardby identifies in this theory is that the vegetative, sensitive and intellective potentiae are found in different kinds of beings: the vegetative is found without the others in plants, the sensitive without the intellective in non-rational animals, and the intellective without the other two in spiritual beings. But, if that is the case, how do they come to be one and a same simple essence in humans? The only way to sustain such a thesis would be to argue that these potentiae are equivocally said of humans and other beings; but that is manifestly false: if the objects and operations of the powers are the same, the powers and the potentiae in which they are rooted must also be the same. For example, in both humans and other living things the operations of the vegetative part of the soul are to take nourishment, generate, and grow. Therefore, the vegetative potentiae is the same in all living things and the sensitive is the same in all animals (E 5, 35–6). The problem is that if all three parts of the soul constitute one and the same simple essence, then

plants would be endowed with an intellective part of the soul.[5]

If that were the case, they would have intellective souls without having appropriated bodies; so

a perfection exists without that which it is supposed to perfect by existing.

That is, for Kilwardby, manifestly false. A further problem with this simplicity of the essence concerns the coming into being of the soul. If the three potentiae—vegetative, sensitive, and intellective—constitute a simple essence, then they must come into being either

all in the same way, that is, (x′) by creation or (x″) generation; or
each in different ways, that is, by creation in human beings and by generation in plants and animals.

Kilwardby simply rejects (y) because it asserts the existence of a naturally generated intellective soul in plants and animals.

If (x′), then the souls of plants and animals are created out of nothing, which means they cannot be corrupted.

If (x″), then the human soul is ex traduce (hereditary), whence corruptible.

Both lead to absurd consequences and must therefore be dismissed. Instead, Kilwardby argues for the double origin of the potentiae of the soul, which implies that they must be essentially distinct.

(2) According to this theory, the human soul is constituted by three substantial forms (tribus formis substancialibus) which differ essentially from one another; of these, two (vegetative and sensitive) are the result of the work of nature (opus nature)—by means of the potencies of elements and the original principles with which the matter of transmutable things is naturally endowed—and the intellective form is the result of divine creation. The three forms are present at the same time in the human embryo only after the intellective soul has been created and infused into the developing being, not before—and this is due to the need for an appropriate level of material organization that disposes the being to receive the intellective soul as its perfection (E 5, 44).

These forms make together one human soul, which is the form of the human body. Each of these forms can be considered either in respect to the body they vivify and in this sense (as essential determinations) none of them is the form of the others, or as constituting part of a soul that is the animating principle of a certain kind of life, the human life, and in this sense the intellective part is the form that complements the others (QLIII2S 63, 268). In the actual constitution of all natural things that comprise one natural whole, there are several dispositions that prepare for and are perfected by the last form, which completes the thing (QLIII2S 63, 269). In the case of human beings, the intellective form is the ‘completion of human life’ (D43Q 34), that is, that which makes that particular life to be a specifically human life. This is the theory Kilwardby takes to be in agreement with philosophical reason and Christian faith and the one to which he adheres.

Kilwardby is clear in showing that his criticism is aimed at the conception of the soul as a simple form, as he clearly advocates a view of the human being as composite of a plurality of essentially different forms. This view is not incompatible with their making one soul, which is the form of a living thing. In the same way as the body is a unity even though it is constituted by a plurality of parts—foot, hand, blood, bone—each having its own form—the human soul also is constituted by a plurality of parts and nevertheless is a unity. The parts of the body make one body by aggregation.

The human (rational) soul is, according to both Aristotle and Augustine (as Kilwardby claims), a substance composed of three essentially different parts—the vegetative, sensitive, and intellective—just as a definition having three differentiae is composed (E 5, 43). The unity of the soul is grounded in a hierarchy of forms, where some are incomplete and dispositional, while one is completive and perfective.

Each of these three forms has powers through which it performs the operations that are proper to it. Powers are defined by their actions, which in turn are defined by their objects. The powers of the soul—for example, memory or intellect—are active potentialities; once activated by an external agent they bring about their own actualities by way of their operations—for example, understanding in the case of the intellect. This conception of powers means that a human being performs different kinds of operations via different forms: a human being understands by means of a power belonging to the intellective form, not to the sensitive or vegetative forms (E 5, 43). Essentially different operations are rooted in powers belonging to essentially different forms; for example, perceiving requires bodily organs and understanding does not (QLIIS 8, 29; E 7, 51). As the result, human beings must be composite of essentially different forms.

Despite being composite in substance and powers, the soul is simple in existence in that it is not divisible and exists wholly in every part of the body (tota in qualibet parte corporis) (E 6, 46–48). There is, however, one type of unity mentioned in the beginning of this entry that needs to be addressed: the unity of being or substantial unity, the unity formed by the body and the soul, which is properly a human being.

Kilwardby subscribes to the principle according to which two actual things cannot make one thing in actuality. But this principle, he claims, does not apply to the body and soul because neither the intellective soul nor the sensitive body—that is, the body informed by the sensitive form—are one complete being. The sensitive body is not perfect and needs to be completed by the intellective form, and the intellective form is created to be the perfection of the sensitive body (E 5, 41).

Kilwardby has such a desire to substantiate this unity that he finds himself in an extremely difficult position when considering what happens to the soul and the whole of its potentiae at the death of the body. He sees no particular problem in arguing for the immortality of the intellective part of the soul, but he hesitates in what happens to the vegetative and sensitive forms in such a way that he ends up giving two opposite accounts, one aligned with Aristotle, the other with Augustine. On the one hand, according to the former, the vegetative and sensitive forms, operating only through the body, cannot remain after death; as they were naturally generated, they were created by God to be re-united with the resurrected body and the immortal intellective soul at the end of time. On the other hand, according to Augustine, the bond which unites all the potentiae of the soul is so strong that it cannot be broken with the separation from the body; the whole soul remains in the disembodied state, and the soul is able in this state to perform acts of imagination—not by receiving images of sense objects from sense experience but from the power of memory. He indicates no clear preference for either account although the Augustinian would seem more in tune with his general theory of the soul.

Finally, it is obvious from his account in E 5 that Kilwardby is opposing contemporary theories of the soul of the time. In his letter to Kilwardby, soon after the Prohibitions, Peter of Conflans inquires about whether he is critical of the theory of the unity of forms (positio de unitate formarum) associated with the name of Thomas Aquinas. In the only place Kilwardby explicitly addresses the so-called theory of the unity of forms he describes it as holding that there is only one form that when it supervenes the existing composite corrupts all the existing forms and it performs by itself all the actions.

First, according to Kilwardby, such a theory claims that there is one last form which is the perfection of the composite; second, that all the other forms informing matter would be corrupted by this perfective form, hence, only one form would remain in the whole composite; third, that one and the same form is responsible for all the operations the being performs. Kilwardby argues against this theory—which resembles but is not to be identified with any of the theories presented in E 5—with an array of objections, of which the most relevant are:

  1. to have a perfection corrupting rather than perfecting that which it is supposed to perfect makes not only useless the work of nature in producing those forms, but it also leaves unaccounted for how the parts of the body remain the same if everything is corrupted down to prime matter[6];
  2. if the human composite is constituted only by prime matter (materia nuda) and the last form (intellective), then how can we account for transubstantiation, incarnation, and resurrection?
  3. if the same (intellective) form performs all the operations, it means that the intellective soul operates both through bodily organs (as in digesting and perceiving) and without bodily organs (as in understanding). Moreover, this constitutes, according to Kilwardby, a violation of the Aristotelian principle according to which the diversity of objects implies a diversity of powers which implies a diversity of forms.

Kilwardby concludes that such a position is incomprehensible and leads to major philosophical and theological difficulties; it should therefore be avoided.

3. Matter and seminal reasons

In a clear adoption of what is called universal hylemorphism, Kilwardby claims that everything that subsists on its own, apart from God, has two compositing principles, a quod est (matter) and a quo est (form) (DOS 256; 265; 268; QLIS 35, 90; QLIS 60, 171; QLIIS 14, 51–2).

Three main issues arise from Kilwardby’s treatment of matter:

the unity of matter,
the three kinds of matter, and
matter in spiritual substances.

In (i) the discussion about the unity of matter arises from the questions of whether spiritual beings have matter and whether this matter is in some way common to the matter of corporeal beings (univocally, i.e., whether it is matter in the same sense) (QLIIS 14–16; DOS, chapters 29–31). According to its editor, Albert Judy, DOS 31 is probably the result of a public disputation on the topic by Kilwardby or one that he attended and is here reporting. What is clear in any case is the relation between the views presented in this chapter and those of some of Kilwardby’s contemporaries, such as Roger Bacon, Albert the Great, and Bonaventure (see also Donati 2013). The nature of matter is of particular significance due to the role it played in the Prohibitions, with a number of articles being about the nature of privation, prime matter, body, and active potencies in matter (Silva 2020, chapter 2).

Kilwardby starts by distinguishing two ways of considering prime matter (materia omnino prima):

According to its being (secundum esse), that is, considered in its existence together (concreta) with form, matter is considered with respect to actual existing beings (actualiter exsistentibus). In this case matter is one or many according to the form(s) it receives: a plurality of individuals is the result of a plurality of forms informing matter (because form is the form of a concrete individual thing). As such there is not one matter in all things, but one or many according to the number of individuals. In the same way as there are no two individuals that are one and the same, matter cannot be one in all things. It can, however, be one within all (in omnibus) the individuals and species as one genus, that is, insofar as it is conjoined (concreta) with the most general form (forma generalissima), in the category of substance (DOS 277). In this sense, matter is one and the same in all things, corporeal and spiritual alike. Kilwardby explicitly identifies this view as being that of Averroes.
According to its essence (secundum essentiam), that is, considered in se and per se, abstracted from any form (DOS 272), there are two possible views:
according to the first, matter has an essential unity (unitas essentiae), being potential with respect to any form whatsoever. Form is the principle of distinction and diversity; thus, prime matter considered on its own, prior to the reception of any form, is simple and one because it lacks the distinction that arises from being united with form. The problem with this view, for Kilwardby, is that the reception of the specific forms requires the existence in matter of a certain formal disposition (which begs the question). One and the same matter cannot be indifferently receptive of both corporeal and spiritual forms.
According to the second view, there is a diversity of essence: matter is not one and the same in all things but diverse in different things. This diversity of essence remains even when all the forms that constitute any individual of one the kinds of being—spiritual, corporeal, and natural—are (in thought) removed. According to this theory, the essence of the prime matter, which constitutes any individual, has different grades of purity. Prime matter has substantially different parts, sharing an essence that is one by analogy.

Whereas in DOS Kilwardby remains neutral to any of these views, in QLIIS 15 he seems to align himself with the view that the essential unity of matter is analogical, not numerically one. In E 2, however, Kilwardby approaches the question in slightly different terms, which can be explained by the fact that his motivation is different: whereas in DOS and QLIIS he intends to justify the distinction between corporeal and spiritual things, in E he wants to understand matter as that which underlies change. From that point of view, there are three kinds of prime matter:

absolute, pure, or naked prime matter (see also DNR 23, 51–52),
bodily prime matter, and
natural or physical prime matter.

APM has no form whatsoever and underlies (substat) all forms it receives: first the general forms, then the special forms. Even then, Kilwardby claims, matter is not nothing simpliciter, that is, lacking being but rather nothing actual (sed non ideo dicitur simpliciter nihil, sed nihil actuale: QLIS 79, 254). Naked prime matter receives first the form of the most general genus, substance, and through this form prime matter is divided into numerically distinct things (only form distinguishes; QLIIS 16, 60; DOS 208; 406). This is the matter common to spiritual and corporeal things.

Then, substance receives the form of corporeity, by means of which it becomes a body with dimensions and magnitude (DOS 246)—that is, matter gets extended and occupies space (DOS 340; NSLP 8, 55). This matter is BPM and is common to both celestial and terrestrial bodies. Regarding BPM, it is necessary that there be one matter that is the substrate of substantial change in the case of terrestrial bodies; or circular motion in the case of celestial bodies. This matter is the corporeal substance, that is, substance plus the form of corporeity (DOS 244–245). When something looses a substantial form, it is not annihilated but remains at least with dimensions and the form of corporeity (E 1, 21), as when a dead body is reduced to its state of being a mere aggregate of its components indicating its composition (cimbolum sue mixcionis) (E 5, 40; DOS 244). Finally, matter receives the specific differences of bodies and the passive and active qualities (DOS 248). This is PPM, the matter common to all simple and mixed bodies in the sublunary sphere, that is, those that are generable and corruptible.

Matter and form are the constitutive principles of a thing, but there are three principles of change: matter, form, and privation. According to Kilwardby, privation ‘is not pure nothing’ or even pure absence of form but the state of ‘actively’ lacking that something imperfect has with respect to fulfillment (E 3, 31)—and only in this way can privation be understood as a principle of change. Privation is the state of a potentiality that does not have the perfection that is owed to it (E 3, 30). In that sense, privation is associated with active potency.[7]

Kilwardby argues that PPM is naturally endowed/pregnant (gravida) with active potencies that, once set in motion by the action of an external agent, co-operate in change and become fully actual.[8] An active potency “is called potency because it is ordained to actuality and active because it is something of a form” (E 3, 30). Matter strives for form and the action of striving entails the existence already of something of form, which is the active potency. Potentiality is therefore taken not as mere receptivity of form but as an active appetite for (full) actuality. An active potency is a form in an incomplete state because it was born to make itself actual (nata est facere se in actu).[9]

The existence of matter endowed with forms in an inchoate state is necessary, according to Kilwardby, in order to distinguish generation from creation as well as to assure that generation is a natural (and not violent) change—since an active potency is an internal principle of motion. Another of the applications of the notion of active potency is to explain elemental change. Every part of PPM that is informed by the form of a body has the forms of all four elements in potency. At any given time, only one of these forms can be actual. The elements transmute into one another in virtue of their active and passive qualities (DOS 249). With this account, Kilwardby addresses the question of the presence of the four elements’ forms existing within mixed bodies differently from other authors of his time. He takes his notion of potency, being a form in an inchoate state of actuality, as sufficient to avoid the problem of the simultaneous, fully actual presence of contraries in one and the same subject.

The third application of the notion of active potency is to explain human generation. Kilwardby appeals to a (then) well-known concept, especially in the Augustinian milieu, of seminal reasons (see Karger 2002; Donati 2002). Seminal reasons are a philosophical concept used by Augustine in order to explain the theological problem of two apparently incompatible accounts of creation: one according to which everything was created in an instant, the other that there were successive moments of creation (described in the six days narrative of the Genesis). Kilwardby interprets this concept as meaning that everything was created immediately but not everything was made immediately (QLIIS 61, 174): in Creation, God created corporeal matter out of which He produced the first light as well as the first individuals of the different species (D43Q 1, 11; QLIIS 85, 240). When He created the first individuals, He inserted in them these seminal reasons (QLIIS 63, 179; D43Q 15, 21; 26, 29; QLIIS 61, 176), which are the cause, through the generative power, of the continuous generation of individuals, therefore explaining the propagation of species throughout time without the need of divine intervention (E 4, 32; E 1, 22; 5, 39–40; D43Q 26, 31).

In the process of the generation of a human being, the father transmits to the descendent matter—endowed with seminal reasons, which contribute to the preservation and continuity of the species—and the corporeal spirit. These are present in the semen, as the first principle of life and the power of the principle of life. The principle of life is that which first receives the action of the soul, the one in which the soul is realized; the power of the principle of life is that which acting as an efficient cause brings the active potency in matter to actuality. In the same way as a plant germinates from a seed, the vegetative and sensitive souls (the principle of life) exist in an inchoate state in the semen separated from the father, and they are educed from this matter by the action of the corporeal spirit (the power of the principle of life—D43Q 34, 37; QLIIS 85, 239).

Making use of the medical and philosophical knowledge available to him, Kilwardby argues that the semen cannot be just a superfluity of digested food because in that case the offspring would resemble the father’s aliment and not the father (E 4, 30). In addition to the role played by the father in the generation of the new being, the mother contributes to the offspring with matter that is used to protect and feed the embryo (some matter of the semen has the same purpose) and the local warmth that constitutes the proper environment to the development of the new life.

Before concluding this section on matter, it is worth returning to point (iii) above, where it was clained that matter is a metaphysical constituent of things and is necessary for explaining change, receptivity of accidents, and individuation. Therefore, all created things must have matter and form in their constitution, as befits the position of universal hylemorphism. But, whereas things that are subjected to generation and corruption are made out of natural or physical matter (materia physica)—matter in the proper sense (proprie)—spiritual things also have matter, but in the common sense (communiter) of metaphysical matter (materia metaphysica). This matter is the subject of the spiritual form (DOS 265; QLIIS 82) and is defined as potential being (QLIIS 14). Matter in this sense explains individuation (DOS 266–269) as well as change (other than substantial change) that takes place in spiritual substances (DOS 320). (For Kilwardby’s view in the context of Thirteenth Century debates on matter, see Donati 2013)

4. Individuation

Among the issues Kilwardby has changed his mind about during his career is the principle of individuation: whearas in his Parisian period he assigns to matter the role of the cause of individuation (NSLP 7, 39), in the mature works of his Oxford and Canterbury stay, he claims that the principle of individuation is matter and form.

A main tenet in Kilwardby’s ontology is that every thing that exists outside the soul either exists in an individual or is itself an individual (QLIIS 17, 64). As all substances are composites of matter and form, matter and form are the two possible causes of individuation. It cannot be matter on its own because matter receives its determinations from form. It could be form, but in this case it would be either accidental or substantial form. He promptly dismisses the first possibility, since accidents can only inhere in an already constituted primary substance, that is, they follow the constitution of an individual substance rather than explain the constitution of that substance as an individual. This is not to say, he points out, that there are individuals without accidents: a sublunary, corporeal individual is always temporally and spatially located, even though one can think of an individual without reference to this particular place and time (QLIIS 17, 68).

His final answer is that both matter and form are principles of individuation: matter as the passive cause (causa receptiva; he also calls it the causa sine qua non), form as the active cause (QLIIS 17, 64). Individuation is achieved when the last species (the species specialissima) completes the individual (QLIIS 17, 67). Form, arriving at matter, designates matter and designating matter, designates itself. The designative action (signatio) of form on matter is the cause of an actual existing being (QLIS 71).

The distinctive property of the individual as such is precisely this actual existence (actualis exsistentia: QLIIS 17, 65; QLIII1S 9, 39). Kilwardby rejects the view that individuals have an essence in addition to the form of the species: there are no individual forms, only individuated forms. Otherwise, he argues, the essence of the individual would be distinct from the essence of the universal, and each individual would be made of two essences (Lewry 1978, 246). The individual has only matter in addition to the species.[10] What Kilwardby means is that the individuated form of the species is accidental to the species because a particular instantiation is irrelevant to the species—even if it is essential to the individual as such—as there would be no individual without a form of the species (QLIIS 17, 65). This idea is the basis of Kilwardby’s moderate realism of universals and his doctrine of the plurality of substantial forms: universal forms—genera and species—exist in individual things as their constituents, but as such (that is, as forms existing in individual things) they are not universal forms but individuated and individuating forms. As universal forms, they exist in the intellect only, by abstraction from the individuals that instantiate them. There is in the world outside the mind no universal human being aside from individual human beings.

5. Theory of Knowledge

5.1. Active sense perception

Kilwardby’s lengthiest discussion on sense perception is found in the work De spiritu fantastico. Here, Kilwardby argues that for an act of perception to occur, certain requirements need to be met: there needs to be an object, a sense organ, and a medium between them; the object must issue/generate a likeness (image or species) of itself by means of which it can be known (since nothing in the world can be known except by generating a species of itself). The likeness must be able to change the medium and then the sense organ. Both the medium and the sense organ, in different ways, must be appropriate to the likeness, that is, must be receptive of it. In the case of sight, for instance, the medium must be transparent, and there must be light (E 5, 42).

The change in medium is different from that in the sense organ, and different species seem to move (in) the medium in different ways. Kilwardby connects this with the materiality and even the different degrees of materiality of the species: the species of smell and hearing move with the airwaves, whereas the species of color do not.[11] With respect to sight—the prototypical sense discussed in medieval theories of perception—the object, according to the rules of optics, must stand opposite the perceiver’s eyes, and the species move along a straight line. There are two objects of sight: light and color; but whereas color (and by means of it the colored thing) is that which is perceived, light is that which makes this perception possible (QLIII2S 5, 18). Light is not perceived as such; only the mind (not the sensory soul) is able to distinguish light from color, by reflection (QLIII2S 26, 190).

In DSF 103, Kilwardby provides a careful synthesis of the process of perception, which can be described in terms of the two motions—outwards and inwards:

For there are two things in sensing, namely, the more attentive action of the soul in the body which is acted upon, and the perception of this action. (trans. Broadie)

The acted-upon refers to the affection (passio) of the sense organs by the sensible object, more precisely, the impressing of the likeness of the object (the sensible species) in the sense organ. This affection is a certain kind of alteration through which a disposition is perfected—in other words, the potentiality of the sense organ to receive a certain quality is actualized (DSF 61–62).

The attentive action is the sensory soul’s assimilating itself to the species received in the sense organ, and by means of this assimilation makes in and from itself (DSF 126) an image or likeness of the sensible species (DSF 166; 121; 185). It is by means of this assimilative action that the image of the sensible object comes into being in the sensory soul. The sensory soul (not the intellective, DSF 140) forms the image as if by natural instinct (instinctu naturali), that is, it has a natural capacity to do it (DSF 128).

Finally, the perception of the soul’s action is “to sense in itself the image which it has formed in itself” (or, “the turning of the eye <of the soul> upon itself, in and by means of which the image is sensed” (DSF 125), that is, the perception of the object. In other words, the sensory soul turns its eye upon itself and sees the sensible object through the image made by itself. It does not distinguish the image in the sense organ from the image in itself (DSF 104), and neither image is that which is perceived. The object of perception is the external thing (DSF 110–11) and not the image by which the thing is known (quo res cognoscitur) (QLIS 89, 280).

According to Kilwardby, the soul is the active element in the process in that perception is possible due to the soul’s intentional state with respect to the affection of the organ. The reason the soul permanently attends to the body and its affections is that it is proper for the soul, as the form of the body, to take care of the well-being and preservation of the body (DSF 100–101; Silva 2008). The soul avoids all affections that can injure and damage the body and its organs, which are the soul’s instruments for acquiring information about the external world. The soul’s control over the body is exercised through the mediation of the corporeal sensitive spirit, made of fine matter.[12]

When human beings sleep, the sense organs continue to be impressed by the species from sense objects; however, this impression, without the attention of the soul, does not give rise to any act of perception (DSF 203; Silva 2010), and it is arguable whether on these occasions the image in the soul is actually made.

The theory raises the question about the correspondence between the image made by the soul in imitating one received in the sense organs rather than by taking in the species of the external thing. Kilwardby dismisses that hypothetical objection by claiming that the sensory soul is from the outset endowed with such a capacity and by restating that the image does correspond to the external object.

The process includes a physically based account—the generation of the species (which have different degrees of materiality), its propagation through the medium, and its affection of sense organs—and a spiritual/immaterial account that explains what follows from the affection of the sense organ by the species. According to this second account, the soul reacts to this affection and makes the image of the object. It is this image that remains in memory, available for acts of imagination.

Kilwardby insists at great length on denying any efficient causality to the object, that is, he refuses to take perceptual acts as being caused by the external object or its species. The object is the necessary occasion and the causa sine qua non (otherwise there would be nothing to be perceived) but not the sufficient cause of perception (DSF 103; 123). The efficient cause per se of perception is the immaterial soul—the division into sensory faculties is instrumental to the process and in most of this part of the treatise Kilwardby talks of the operations of the sensory soul (which he also calls the ‘incorporeal sensitive spirit’) as a unified entity.

Kilwardby’s theory of sense perception is, on the one hand, Aristotelian because he accepts that our knowledge of the world originates in sense experience; he describes the process of perception as a being-affected. On the other hand, it is Augustinian because he limits the efficient role of the object to the affection of the sense organs; he takes the soul to be the true efficient cause of perception, reacting to the body’s being affected and making in and from itself the images of exterior objects; he grounds his theory on the ontological assumption of a hierarchy of being where only things at the same or higher level can affect each other, which forbids the action of anything corporeal upon something incorporeal. The body feels through the soul (and the soul through itself) because, as to feel is a kind of being-affected, the body cannot affect the soul, but the soul can affect the body.

Although much of his account of perception is made in terms of the sensory soul and its operations and less in terms of faculty psychology, it emerges from Kilwardby’s account that a major cognitive role is assigned to memory—a primacy found also in intellectual cognition (where memory represents God, the Father, in the analogy of the powers of the mind and in the Divine Trinity (see especially QLIS 35–37)). Contrasting Aristotle’s and Augustine’s views on memory, Kilwardby argues that the power of memory is responsible for receiving the images of objects of knowledge by natural assimilation, for preserving the images of sensible objects, and for making them available for the powers of imagination (sensory memory) and intellect (intellectual memory) (QLIS 62, 181). Kilwardby distinguishes between a sensory memory and a rational memory, further divided into inferior (dedicated to sensible things) and superior (dedicated to the intelligible objects) (QLIS 62, 179). The rational memory (the Father) generates understanding by presenting the intelligible species to the intellect (the Son; see QLIS 35; 37; QLIIS 77, 213–214). Understanding is a form of a vision of an image generated by rational memory, in the same way as an object generates an image of itself (QLIS 35). In both cases, the soul has, in the first moment, the image and in the second moment turns its eye (of the sensory soul and of the mind) to see (know) the object.

5.2. Intellectual Cognition

Following Grosseteste, Kilwardby took human knowledge to comprise the comprehension of the truth of contingently existing things, of what frequently is in the same way, and of what has an absolute way of being and is immutable—such as the principles and conclusions of a demonstration. Of these, the highest type of knowledge is that found in the conclusion of a demonstration (NLP I.5, 31–32).

Although we can know particular objects by means of perception, there is scientia only of what always is in the same way (NLP I.10, 48), that is, of what is eternal and incorruptible; in other words, scientia is about universals.

5.2.1. Universals

The knowledge of universals is reached through induction from the knowledge of singulars received through the senses (NLPA 171; DOS 196). Kilwardby describes the process in the following way: sensible species are retained in the absence of a sensible thing by memory, and from a multitude of memories arises experience, that is, a first comparison of what is common to the species, not yet a universal. The intellect is then able to discover the essential likeness (essentialis similitudo) or common nature (ratio uniuersalis) in which the sense data agree (NLP II.33, 503–504; DOS 7–8; NLPA 171–2). The universal is, then, the essential reason for agreement of many images of the same nature (QLIIS 78, 222.236–8; QLIIS 17, 71; Lewry 1978, 244).

In NLPor, Kilwardby describes the process of abstraction as the interaction of two aspects of the intellect: the agent intellect abstracts the intelligible species (species intelligibiles) from the images of sensible things acquired through sense perception. The intelligible species are then deposited in the possible intellect (Lewry 1978, 241), which is bare or naked (nudus) previous to this reception (QLIS 4, 12; QLIS 35, 83 and in DSF 14).

The universal is at rest in the soul, as it is the ratio common to all those particulars which instantiate it (NLP 33, 504–505). Kilwardby argues that Peter and Paul differ as individuals (they have their own matter and form), but they have something in common—their essence. Universals are, therefore, this agreement (convenientia) in essence. Two human beings agree essentially agreeing in their humanity when that humanity is considered not as individuated in this or that human being, but as abstracted from any concrete individual (QLIIS 17, 71). The universal is one thing (res una) not in the sense of being numerically one (an individual thing) but in the sense of being a unity of agreement or likeness of individual things outside the mind (QLIIS 17, 72).

It is this idea (together with individuation) that constitutes the basis for Kilwardby’s criticism of Averroes’ monopsychism—a theory he qualifies as being against faith and philosophy as well as contrary to Aristotle’s intention (QLIIS 78, 216). Averroes had argued for his theory that there is only one soul (una anima numero) common to all human beings with the contention (among others) that the unity of the representative species requires the unity of the soul (QLIIS 78, 215).[13] Kilwardby argues against this idea, by claiming that the different likenesses present in different souls are one only in species (QLIIS 78, 221), in the same way as individual human beings, such as Plato and Socrates, correspond as species, that is, as human beings, not as individuals. Those likenesses are numerically multiple according to the multiplicity of souls in which they are received, but they correspond to each other in being representations of one and the same thing, for example, Plato (QLIIS 78, 218–219; see also QLIIS 17, 71). The same is valid for the universal, which is abstracted from many similar likenesses, such as the likenesses of Socrates and Plato. It is also (incidentally) multiplied according to the multiplicity of intellects in which it exists. It is one only in species as the ratio in which the many likenesses of the same nature essentially agree (QLIIS 78, 222).

Therefore, sense perception and intellectual cognition are complementary. Even though there are intelligible things that are not sensory, all sensory things are intelligible (DOS 430–431): they are known by the senses as particulars and ordered towards further intellectual cognition (DOS 433). “Sensation is”, Kilwardby says, “the gate to human cognition”, because there can be no knowledge of universals (and demonstration) without the knowledge of particulars (NLP I.33, 509; DOS 433).

Human knowledge proceeds from that which is acquired through the senses, i.e., particular intentions, to the knowledge of that which is more distant from the senses (DOS 627), that is, the common intentions (communes raciones siue communes intenciones) which are abstracted from them (QLIII1S 44, 189; see also see Lewry Por, 360). Although acts of perception are about singular objects, it is by means of sense perception that cognition of universals is accomplished (by abstraction of those individuating circumstances) (NLP II.33, 505): one perceives Callias, but we cognize Callias not as an individual human being but qua human being as such. But one needs to proceed from what is better known to us (that is, that which is immediate in sense perception, the singular thing) to what is better known by nature or more removed from the senses (DOS 238; see also NLP I.7, 39; NSLP 18, 139–140), as scientific knowledge is not about the particular object immediately perceived but the universal (DOS 436). We come to perceive first universals, then particulars, as when, at a distance, we perceive first a body, then that it is an animated body, then that it is an animal, and finally that it is this particular animal—it must be said, though, as Avicenna points out (says Kilwardby), that what is perceived in this process is a confused universal (universale confusum), i.e., a universal “fused together”, as it were, (to use Peter King’s happy literal translation) with a particular (NSLP 18; see also NLP I.7, 40; NLPor 11, M 9vb).

According to Kilwardby, universals exist, having different modes, in and outside the mind (QLIIS 78, 218). The universal is one over many (unum preter multa) according to its own essence (secundum suam essentiam), but it exists in the many as their essence (secundum esse) (NLP 33, 504–505). For him, a universal on account of its being universal (secundum rationem qua universale est), can be considered:

as existing in many individual things (secundum concretionem et esse suum in multis). Everything that exists outside the soul is either an individual, or it exists in an individual (QLIIS 17, 64), thus universals exist through and in individuals (QLIIS 18, 76; QLIIS 17, 70). Universals are corruptible incidentally, as their instantiations are corruptible (NSLPery I.2; NLP 21, 123–4).
according to its essence, in abstraction from the many (secundum essentiam sive abstractionem a multis), that is, existing in the mind through abstraction from the individual things (QLIIS 78, 221; Lewry Por, 360; QLIIS 18, 74; DOS 10; 201; see also Piché 2002). As such, the universal exists only in the intellect (est tantum opus intellectus et in intellectu tantum et non extra). The form is the same per essentiam, but its being (esse) is different (DOS 200), as the universal is separable (by abstraction) from an individual thing according to intellectual being, but not in its natural, real being (NSLPor 7; NLP II.33, 504–5).

In a clear expression of his realist commitment, Kilwardby points out that universals are not fictions of the mind: they are found in individual existing things as their essences; otherwise there would be no univocal predication or definition, and science would be about fictions of the mind (QLIIS 17, 69; 73). Universals can be said of many because they exist in the many that exemplify them (QLIIS 78, 220).

It is important to notice that Kilwardby rules out the association of universals with divine ideas, as essences of things separate from matter, as Plato claimed (ut Plato posuit). For him, such ideas have no role in human cognition. In NSLPor 2 (M 2vb), he states that universals exist in God’s mind as exemplary and formal causes, but science is about universals that exist in and are abstracted from individual things; thus, the ideas (ydee) that exist in God’s mind from eternity are of no use to science (NLP I.36, 230–231).

As Kilwardby frequently remarks, following Aristotle’s dictum in the Metaphysics, human beings have a natural desire for knowledge (DOS 6): Omnes homines natura scire desiderant. Knowledge or more properly scientific knowledge (scientia) is defined as the knowledge of the conclusion of a demonstrative syllogism (based on Aristotle’s doctrine in the Posterior Analytics). As many other authors of the period, Kilwardby distinguishes between the understanding of the principles (intellectus),[14] and the knowledge of the conclusion (scientia).[15]

5.2.2. Truth

Truth, Kilwardby says, is an equivocal notion: the truth (ueritas) of a thing is the thing’s being (esse), that is, what the thing genuinely is (NSLPery I.2, M 46vb; see also NSLP 17, 130), namely, its essence or quiddity (essentia vel quidditas) that is signified by its definition (QLIS 44, 141).[16] Things themselves, and the forms or intentiones through which things come to be known, lack any composition, that is, they are neither affirmed nor denied, and therefore they are not true or false as are declarative sentences (NSLPery, p. 16. See also NSLP 17, 124). Truth is the correspondence of the thing and concept (adequatio rei et intellectus), a definition Kilwardby takes from Avicenna (NSLPery I.9).[17]

As the intellect is able to consider separately things that are together and to separate things that are not together in reality, truth and falsity have to do with the composition and division of the species of things in the soul and not in extramental things.[18] That is to say, ‘the composition and division that thought brings about must have reference to the being and not-being of things outside thought’.[19] Complex expressions are true in cases in which they conform to the way the things are outside the combining mind, and they are signified by the terms—the predicate and subject.[20] The intentions (intentiones or passiones animae) in the soul and their combinations exist in the soul as signs (signa) of extra-mental things.

Although the logician is not primarily concerned with the way things are,[21] he must know how they are in order to make statements that are true with respect to the being of things outside the composing and dividing mind (DOS 521), because logic does not teach how to reason in a fictional mode (DOS 578). The one that combines or divides must know the properties or modes of things in which things themselves agree or disagree (DOS 577).

According to a common conception of truth, for a proposition to be true, the actual existence of what is signified by its terms is required; however, terms can also be considered without this correspondence to something existing outside the mind(LPA I.18, 388-95). In NSLPery (I.7) Kilwardby considers the case of the chimera:

But it must be said that when I say that every statement is something of something, this ‘something’ is taken in a common way, either as something in speech only or in reality: thus when non being is stated in reality, it is a statement about being at least in discourse, as when one talks about chimeras or such things.[22]

A chimera corresponds at least to something in speech or in the composing mind, even if not to something in the extra-mental world.[23] The word ‘chimera’ signifies what exists only in the soul; therefore, its definition shows not the essence of a thing (as there are no extra-mental things such as chimeras) but what the name signifies (NLP II.7, 381–382).

The actual existence of things outside the soul is not always required for a (affirmative) proposition (here understood as a statement-making sentence) to be true (NLP II.7, 381). Nonbeing can be understood as being not yet actual but in potency only, that is, that has an aptitude to exist in actuality.[24] About those things that can but do not yet exist outside the soul, existence is taken to refer to the (common) nature and not to the individual (NLP II.7, 379): when animal is predicated of human being or when one says that an eclipse is the privation of light, it is not necessary to know whether or not this is actually the case because a human being is always an animal, and an eclipse cannot be but the privation of light. Thus, even if no human being actually existed outside the soul, even then the proposition ‘homo est animal’ would still be true (NLP II.7, 381).

5.2.3. Signs

Kilwardby classifies signs into

natural signs, for example, smoke is a sign of fire and redness a sign of heat, and
given signs; these divide into
signs that have a likeness of the thing signified—these divide further into
those which are signs of something else, as spoken words are signs of the affections of the soul and the affections of things;
those which are signs of invisible grace, such as the sacraments (QLIVS 42, 225–26)
signs that do not have a likeness of the thing signified.

Of those signs that are signs of something else (ii′*), some signify by convention (ad placitum, which Kilwardby proves by their not being the same for everybody); others signify naturally (like the sounds of non-rational animals). Of those words that signify by convention, some are simple expressions, and others are complex expressions (oratio or enuntiatio). Only significative complex expressions are true or false; simple expressions are neither true nor false (NSLPery I.2).

Signifying by convention is the result of an original (voluntary) imposition of a significatum upon a word, primarily conceived of as a spoken word (vox) – a modulated sound (DOS 488; see also QLIVS 42, 224).[25] A word signifies the passio mentis and the thing outside the soul (QLIVS 11, 47). Spoken words signify primarily the passio animi (or species intelligibilis or intellectus; Lewry Pery, 289) and signify things via thoughts (uoces sunt note intellectuum, et sic rerum) (QLIS 144, 143). The passio, being a likeness of a thing in the mind—received rather than made by us—is common to all human beings (LPA ed. 1516, 82rb).

Kilwardby argues that only human beings proffer meaningful utterances because, as Priscian points out, the articulate vocal sound (uox articulata) uttered by humans is tied together (copulata) with a sensus mentis or intellectus in the mind of the speaker; thus only beings that have minds can produce significative utterances.[26] Moreover, the production of the vox litterata requires the control of the modulation of sounds—what Kilwardby calls the figure in the air (through which the utterances are transmitted)—on a regular basis, that is, always the same figure for the same word. This is done by the sensory soul under the control of the rational soul (NLPA, 124–125). This explains not only why meaningful articulate vocal sounds are signs but also their primacy as efficiently caused by the soul (see Mora-Márquez 2014).

There are, therefore, two aspects of spoken language: on the one hand, the vox, as an articulate sound, causes a natural change in both the medium and the ear of the one who hears it (DOS 147; NLPA 127–128); on the other, the utterance, as something heard, brings about an act of the intellect of the listener (DOS 425; NSLPery I.1). To speak (dicere) in the proper sense means expressing the likeness of a thing in order to make known that of which it is the likeness (QLIS 37, 106). In that sense, a meaningful utterance should be called ‘nota’ with respect to the speaker, because it refers to the meaning conveyed by the speaker (the species intelligibilis), and it should be called ‘signum’ with respect to the one who hears it, because it refers to the material/sensitive aspect of the sign (NSLPery I.2; see Lewry 1978, 289; Rosier 1994, 97–98; Marmo 1997, 139–40). As noted by Rosier, Sirridge, and Kneepkens (see Bibliography), one of the main contributions of Kilwardby (and Bacon and others in the intentionalist grammatical tradition) is the emphasis on two levels of completeness of speech: one, concerning the word’s modes of signifying and the other concerning the way the hearer understands or interprets the intention of the speaker (intentio proferentis).

One consequence of the conventional nature of language, according to which the relation between a sign and a significate is imposed on the sign by a voluntary act on the part of the impositor, is that the change in what is signified by the sign does not require a change in the sign (NLPery I.1; Lewry 1981). On the other contrary, in the case of natural signs, such as paleness from fear or redness from shame, the change in the thing signified implies a change of its sign.[27]

5.2.4. Logic and Demonstrative science

Kilwardby adopts Robert Grosseteste’s distinction between four main senses of ‘to know’ (scire: (i) in a general sense, the comprehension of the truth of contingent things, (ii) in a common sense, the comprehension of the truth of things that often are, (iii) properly, the comprehension of the truth of things that are immutable, (iv) most properly, the comprehension of the truth of things that always are the same and the truth of which depends on what is prior (NLP I.5; Silva 2012, 216; Corbini 2013, 166). So, whereas in a sense to know can be said of sense perception, it is properly and most properly said of what is universal and of what is necessary (DOS 379). Such knowledge is found in the premises/principles and above all in the knowledge of the conclusions of demonstrations (iii and iv, above). Scientific knowledge (scientia) is then more properly demonstrative reasoning (DOS 381).

A demonstration is a syllogism that brings about knowledge (NLP I.5, 31). A syllogism is “an expression in which a conclusion follows of necessity when certain things have been asserted” (DOS 493, Kretzmann 1988, 265). The material principles of the syllogism are the three terms (remote matter)—the two extremes (major, minor) and the middle—combined into two premises (proximate matter). The conclusion is not part of the syllogism.

A demonstration must have as starting-points appropriate principles (NLP I.19, 106–7): true, first, immediate, prior to, better known than, and causes of the conclusion (NLP I.6, 34; DOS 503; 558). Of these conditions, to be true, first (or primitive), and immediate are the central ones: first because there is nothing prior to it in its kind—otherwise the source of scientific knowledge rests on an infinite series of demonstrations (NLP I.8, 43; I.11, 53); immediate because there is no medium between the subject and predicate (NLP 6, 38). Whereas to be true, first, and immediate are the qualifications that concern what the principles are in themselves (and thus the ones which belong to their definition), the others—for example, to be better known—qualify the principles with respect to the conclusion (NLP I.8, 44; I.10, 49).

Kilwardby presents the following division of the first principles (NLP I.9, 45):

dignitates (axioms), principles common to all sciences, such as the principle of noncontradiction (De nullo eodem simul affirmatio et negatio) and the law of the excluded middle (De quodlibet affirmatio vel negatio…) (DOS 584; NLP I.25, 152). A dignitas does not require any external reason justifying it; it is immediately understood by the intellect;[28]
positio, the principle proper to a particular science. All particular sciences (scientie speciales) share the common first principles (communia principia), but they have their own set of first principles (propria principia; NLP 25, 152). The positio further divides into suppositio, that is, a proposition that states of something that it is or it is not, and the diffinitio, that is, the definition of the subject-matter of a science (QLIS 7, 18). A definition expresses the essence of a thing (NLP II.3, 346; QLIS 44, 141) and what is indicated by its name (NLP I.9, 45); it is not a proposition because it does not say of something that it does or does not exist. Therefore, a definition enters into a demonstration as a part of a principle/premise (NLP I.9, 46).

Kilwardby denies (NLP II.33) that the first principles of demonstration are innate or demonstrable. Kilwardby argues, instead, that they are acquired from pre-existing sensory knowledge (NLP II.33, 506). The knowledge of propositions must be preceded by the knowledge of the terms that enter into its composition, that is, what it is that is predicated and what the thing is of which something is predicated (NLP I.2, 16). By abstraction the intellect comes to know the universals that function as subject and predicate in syllogistic propositions.

These principles are known by themselves (sunt per se nota) (DOS 331; 503; QLIII2S 1, 7); our certitude of them, Kilwardby says, comes from the ‘light of truth’ (QLIS 12, 31). It is by the same light of truth that one assents to the principles/premises from the knowledge (notitia) of the terms that constitute them as well as to the conclusion from the premises (NLP I.11, 54). This act of assent is the result of some kind of illumination from the soul’s cognitive powers (QLIII2S 1, 7). The conclusion, he asserts, is the terminus of the act of intellectual cognition, but the middle term is what makes it possible, just as light makes bodily seeing possible (QLIII2S 5, 18–20). One assents to the conclusion because one comes to see how the middle term leads to the conclusion and makes the conclusion worthy of assent (QLIS 13, 33.2–3; see also DOS 472).

In the highest type of demonstration, the potissima demonstratio, the middle term is a causal definition (NLP II.3, 343.12–14; DOS 527; LPA prologue) and the definition of the predicate (NSLP 6, 29; DOS 563). The middle term allows for the demonstration of the predicate to belong per se et propter quid to the subject (NLP I.20, 117). The paradigmatic demonstration is a syllogism of the first figure in the first mood, that is with two universal premises because the relation of necessity between premises and conclusion is more evident (see Thom 2013, 144-47).

It is not, however, enough for a principle of demonstration to be true; it must also be necessary. A necessary conclusion follows from necessary premises (NLP I. 19, 110–113). The kind of universality required for demonstration is not the same as that of a universal acquired through abstraction, which is said of many (ut dicatur de multis)—the kind described in the Perihermeneias and in Porphyry’s Isasoge—but the universal that must be said of all and always (de quodlibet et semper et primo).[29] The kind of necessity Kilwardby has in mind is what applies to all (things under the subject), on account of what they are, and it is universal (de omni, per se, and universale) (NLP I.12, 62).

There must, however, exist a science whose aim is to discover and teach the method of how to investigate, through correct reasoning, what is not known from what is known. It cannot be metaphysics because this science regards things apart from motion. A syllogism, however, is a kind of motion where the properties are deduced from the subject(-matter) and the conclusion from the premises (NLP prologue, 4). That science is logic. Since logic has the task of discovering a method of knowing that can be used by all sciences (LPA prologue), logic is thought of as the modus scientiarum, or the science of sciences (scientia scientiarum). Proficiency in the way of reasoning allows for the discovery of truth in every field of inquiry (DOS 419), even though every science demonstrates according to the possibilities of its matter (NLP II.34, 512). In order to accomplish this task, logic needs to teach how to combine one term with another (or divide one from another), the species of combinations and divisions corresponding to the species of propositions or statements (DOS 517). Logic also relates things to one another by means of a middle term in the syllogism, which is logic’s subject matter.

The different operations of the intellect producing different linguistic units are studied in Aristotle’s different logical works: the simple significative expression (simplex sermo significativus or the dicibile sine complexione), significative of one of the ten genera of things, is the subject-matter of the Categories; the declarative sentence (or the dicibile ordinatum cum dicibili interpretatione enuntiativa) is dealt with in the Perihermeneias; and the syllogism (or the dicibile ordinatum cum dicibili in complexione duorum extremorum) in the Prior Analytics. The syllogistic form—which Aristotle presents in the Prior Analytics—can then be applied to any matter whatsoever, probable or necessary (DOS 502). The Posterior Analytics presents the demonstrative syllogism, made of necessary matter; the Topics the dialectical syllogism of probable matter; and the Sophistical Refutations deals with sophistical matter, i.e., fallacious reasoning (DOS 503).

Now, logic considers things in one of two ways: in terms of first intentions, that is, as the things themselves and thus belonging to one of the ten highest kinds of being—the categories; in terms of second intentions, that is, things as considered by the intellect and in respect to other things (DOS 459). They are called first and second because only after knowing things themselves can we consider their mutual relations (DOS 459): second intentions are about first intentions. ‘Substance’, ‘quality’, and such are names of first intentions, whereas ‘universal’, ‘particular’, ‘to be an antecedent’, ‘to be a consequent’, and such are names of second intentions.

Kilwardby discusses second intentions in the context of a distinction he proposes between reasoning as a subject of a discipline (logic) and as an instrument which is common to all disciplines (DOS 455; LT 39, 125). Reasoning in one and the other case is the same from the point of form, since the moods and figures are the same; but it is different in respect to matter (probable and necessary, DOS 500–504). As an instrument, reasoning is about things themselves—those that belong to their subject matters, such as lines and figures in geometry—because the subject matter of particular disciplines is things (DOS 455; 477). By comparison, as the subject matter of logic, reasoning makes no reference to things themselves but to their accounts/reasons (rationes rerum), that is, the modes by means of which they are reasoned about (DOS 463). The logician is not concerned primarily with things themselves, the res naturae or first intentions, but with the res rationis or second intentions; that is, he is not concerned with the things signified by the subject and predicate terms of a proposition but with subject and predicate as such (QLIS 90; see also NSLP Prooemium, 4; 5, 20; Pini 2002, 21–22).

Things themselves – things that fall into one of the categories—are not in our soul, only their accounts (rationes) are (DOS 448–49). These modes or accounts (modi rerum sive rationes) are abstracted from things and compared to each other as if they were the things themselves being compared (DOS 451). It is the mode or account of things that makes it possible for us to reason about them (faciunt res rationalibes: DOS 450; rationes rerum et modi per quos res sunt rationabiles: DOS 463). Logic then considers the modi sive rationes rerum, the properties of things in so far as they are thought or compared to one another, which enables combining them into propositions and demonstrations and arriving at scientific knowledge (scientia). (See DOS 449) Without the consideration of things together with the rationes rerum—for example, that ‘divisible’ is more universal than ‘line’—no reasoning could be done about them (DOS 450).

Reasoning needs to be considered as independently as possible from any particular subject matter because logic examines the method of correct reasoning, which can then be taught and applied to all the other sciences (the syllogism simpliciter has matter, premises, and terms. In that sense, they can be replaced by transcendent matter, such as A, B, C; each particular science then replaces the terms with its own subject, properties, causes, and so on—DOS 452. In that sense also, the syllogism simpliciter is not productive of knowledge or belief—LPA prologue (see Thom 2013, 140).

Thus, Kilwardby’s meaning of first and second intentions cannot be confused with the meaning these terms acquire later on. His use of second intentions as proper to logic shows how he understands this notion in the context of his theory of reasoning and of logic as being the science of reasoning—that is, it studies the process of reasoning in such a way that it can be used by all the other sciences as an instrument for the discovery of truth.

6. The Classification of sciences in the De ortu Scientiarum

Kilwardby adopts a scheme of ordination for the different sciences or disciplines, and it is largely based on the model of Hugh of St. Victor’s Didascalicon: De studii legendi, a widely circulated and immensely influential work from the twelfth century on the classification of sciences (see Silva 2013). As with the work of his (Augustinian) predecessor and notable influence, the DOS had a fame of its own and remains one of the most relevant medieval works of its kind.

Hugh’s Didascalicon (itself inspired by previous classifications—see Weisheipl 1965) however only allows for Kilwardby to include the sciences in what is called knowledge—to this he must (and does) add the principles of the division of the different sciences into various fields of inquiry and then the classification of the different sciences within a certain field of inquiry. Kilwardby goes beyond Hugh and previous classifications not so much with regard to the principles of division and classification, but rather with regard to what is implied in science—that is to say, with regard to the necessary requirements for something to be considered scientific in a certain field of inquiry and process of discovery according to the Aristotelian deductive model of science. Any science (not art)[30] needs to fulfill three main requirements: first, it should have a subject matter (DOS 167; 221); second, it should present the parts and species of a science’s subject matter and their properties (DOS 650–652); third, it should take into account the first common principles of demonstration and have a set principles appropriated to its genus (NLP I.23).

The modus sciencie, according to the prologue of his NLPery, “consists of the speculation about the proven properties of the parts and species of the subject matter” (Lewry Pery, 382; see also NLP prologue; LT 50, 125), which is done by means of definition, division, and collection. By means of division one comes to know the subject of a science; through collection or reasoning one comes to know the properties of the parts and species of the subject; from definition, one comes to know the parts and species of the subject (DOS 524–525; QLIS 7, 18–19).

A major difficulty is whether one and the same science—metaphysics—can have such two distinct objects as God and creatures, still respecting the principle of the unity of science (DOS 221; see also QLIS 4). In DOS 226 Kilwardby claims that unity by analogy is sufficient for the science of being qua being (scientia de ente), metaphysics, to be the field of inquiry that has God and the creatures as objects of inquiry. Being and substance can be predicated by analogy of God and creatures: of God primarily and properly, of creatures in a participative and less proper way. God cannot be known directly, but He can be known by means of His effects and by negation, in the same way our bodily eyes do not see themselves except through a mirror (DOS 225).

A major issue in the division and classification of disciplinary fields is the relation between subaltern sciences. In DOS 324 Kilwardby advocates three criteria for subalternation:

The subject matter of the subaltern science falls under the subject genus of the subject matter of the subalterning science.
The properties of the subject of a subaltern science can only be proven by means of the properties of the subject genus of the subalterning science (DOS 330), by adding something of another genus in nature that is, however, somehow essential to the subalternate science. For instance, the knowledge of ‘triangle’ and ‘isosceles’ belongs to one and the same science even though ‘isosceles’ is something in addition to the geometrical demonstrations of the properties of ‘triangle’ (DOS 329).
Demonstrations of subaltern sciences must be made within the same subject genus of the subalterning science, that is, a property of something belonging to one genus cannot be demonstrated from a thing belonging to another genus—for example, a geometrical proposition demonstrated by means of arithmetic (NLP I.21, 120). Moreover, each subalterning science has a set of first principles that are used as starting points for all the subaltern sciences. For example, the properties of numbers of harmony can only be known through the knowledge of the properties of number simpliciter (DOS 330).

One example of this subordination is found in the relation between the science of geometry and its subordinate sciences. Geometry is the part of speculative philosophy dedicated to the study of limited magnitude (finite limited quantity abstracted from natural matter), its parts, and their properties (DOS 64–65). Astronomy and optics are two such subordinated sciences. Astronomy is a speculative science that has as its object the magnitude of celestial bodies and the distance between them (DOS 72), whereas optics is defined as the speculative science that has as its object the diverse modes of vision, focusing on the nature of visual rays. It belongs to the genus that is the subject matter of geometry because the visual rays propagate rectilinearly (DOS 77).

Kilwardby begins his text in a clarifying manner of distinguishing between those sciences that are about human words and actions and those that are about what is divine (DOS 1; 654). The science of the divine is theology, focused on the study of the Sacred Scripture. Of the human sciences, some are commendable (philosophy), others vicious or illicit (magic). In DOS, Kilwardby is mostly concerned with the sciences of human invention. He further divides philosophy into speculative—the name that designates a group of sciences constituted by physics, mathematics, and metaphysics—and another group classified under the heading ‘about human things’, that is, the results of human intentionality (QLIS 90, 286); it includes the active sciences and the sciences of language. The former divides into mechanics and ethics, the latter into grammar, logic, and rhetoric. Mathematics includes the sciences of the quadrivium, that is, the four sciences of things as they were known in the Middle Ages (geometry, astronomy, music, and arithmetic).

Science, in the sense of knowledge, falls into one of three kinds: (i) that which is primarily oriented to and necessary for salvation; (ii) that which is useful in the search for truth and righteous living—for living an honest life—but not sufficient for salvation; (iii) that which is useless in both respects and is connected with vanity (DOS 1–2). This grouping obeys a general principle, originated from Augustine, which sets up the direction for medieval learning: knowledge must be directed towards virtue (DOS 639). This same aspect is also present in the consideration of the order of the sciences, in which all sciences are preparatory to the science of the higher end: all sciences are subordinated to, or at the service of (famulantur), theology.

Kilwardby’s criterion for classification is the object of the sciences (Alessio 2001, 108–9): “science must be divided according to the division of things about which it is” (DOS 5). “The diversity of sciences”, he says, “results from the diversity of their subject matters” (DOS 108). Sciences are organized, as in the Boethian scheme, according to the level of abstraction of their objects of study from matter. Speculative sciences rank highest (DOS 203) and among them metaphysics. Metaphysics deals with being without qualification (simpliciter), whereas mathematics and physics deal with particular kinds of being (DOS 323; NLP II.11, 417). Metaphysics considers substance and its principles – matter and form – per se, that is, apart from change and privation, whereas physics (natural philosophy) considers substance as mutable and therefore matter and form (and privation) as principles of change (DOS 232); mathematics deals with changeable material things but not insofar as they are material, rather, insofar as they are abstracted from motion (within the sciences of the quadrivium, where the order is astronomy, geometry, harmony, and arithmetic).

In chapters 63 and 64, Kilwardby discusses different ways to consider the order of the sciences: (i) the order of discovery, (ii) the natural order, (iii) the ordering according to ends, (iv) the order of the degree of certainty, and (v) the order of teachability.

According to (i), the first among the (arts and) sciences are the mechanical arts because they result from the necessity to assist human beings in surpassing their natural physical constraints (DOS 358). Human beings are, in comparison with other animals, weaker in body, and therefore tend to devise forms to surpass this deficiency (DOS 626); but they are gifted (by God) with reason to discover ways to surpass their physical limitations (DOS 360–61). The sub-divisions of the mechanical arts obey the principles laid out in Hugh of St. Victor’s Didascalicon—as Kilwardby himself makes explicit (see DOS, chapters 37–39). Special attention must be paid to the similarity between the scheme of the seven liberal arts and the seven mechanical arts that Hugh defends and Robert follows (DOS 363): as the liberal arts divide into trivium (sciences of language) and quadrivium (sciences of things) the mechanical arts also divide into a group of three arts concerning those things related to what is external to the body (extrinsecus corporis)—clothing, weaponry (further divided into architecture and industry), and navigation—and a group of four arts focusing on what is internal to the body (intrinsecus corporis)—agriculture, hunting, medicine, and theatre.

Next comes speculative philosophy, and here the order is physics, mathematics, and metaphysics. This order is established on the basis of the proximity of each to the senses, from closest to most distant (DOS 627). The end of the speculative sciences is truth (DOS 394), that is, to know the way of natural things according to their natures (DOS 405). Then comes ethics (DOS 628), the science that considers the human operations in connection with the mortal human body (DOS 404), followed by the sciences of speech/language, which have an order themselves: grammar, rhetoric, and logic.

Kilwardby offers a two-fold consideration of logic, in a stricter and in a broader sense. In the broader sense, logic is a science of speech (scientia sermocinalis), dealing with correct expression, including grammar, rhetoric, and dialectic (logic in the strict sense). In the stricter sense, logic is the science of reasoning (scientia rationalis) (DOS 492). Logic is the science of reasoning because it considers and teaches the discovery of terms, their organization into complex expressions, and the combination of complex expressions into syllogistic demonstrations; but it is also the science of speech because it deals with the linguistic expression of reasoning—which does not remain, as Kilwardby says, hidden (inchoate) in the mind (DOS 578): mental words are about things, spoken words are about mental words, and written words are about spoken words (DOS 593).

The sciences of speech divide into those that are significative of what is known (grammar) and those that are inquisitive about what is not known (logic and rhetoric) (DOS 468). Rhetoric differs from logic in that the former is about hypotheses and what is particular, whereas the latter is about theses and what is universal—its subject matter is the syllogism and its species (DOS 468; 471; 474). By contrast, rhetoric, as the science of speaking well, presupposes grammar—the science of signifying correctly (DOS 629). The subject matter of grammar is significative speech qua significative (DOS 474), that is, the oratio and its parts insofar as they signify or co-signify (DOS 489). Speech (sermo) here means the human vox as it signifies by convention (ad placitum) (DOS 488). Grammar considers the sentence from the point of view of how well it is formed or its congruity (congruitas), which is the result of how its elements are correctly ordered to one another, rather than of the correspondence of those words with the things they signify (NSLPery I.5). The end (finis) is to teach how to correctly express the conceptions of the mind (DOS 483–84; 490). Kilwardby’s willingness to grant a scientific role to grammar is notorious (Rosier 1994; Sirridge 1988).

Natural order (ii) is the order of the subject matter, that is, the degree of abstraction: first the speculative sciences, then active sciences, and finally the sciences of language (DOS 630–635). (According to this criterion, the order among the sciences of language is: grammar, logic, and rhetoric; this order is found already in the prologue of the NSLP).

The third type of order (iii) is the order of the end (finis) or the ends of the different sciences. Among the sciences, ethics is the first from this point of view, followed by the speculative sciences, and then the sciences of language. (According to this criterion, the order among the sciences of language is: logic, rhetoric, and grammar.) Speculative knowledge is ordered to ethics in the same way as truth is ordered to the supreme good (DOS 405; see Celano 2013, 340).

The next criterion (iv) is according to the form or the degree of certainty achieved. According to this, the first among the sciences are the speculative – and among them the highest (certior) is mathematics (NLP II.34, 512) – followed by the active sciences – and here ethics is prior to mechanics.

The final criterion (v) is the order of teachability. According to this ordering, the sciences of language come first—and grammar first among them—followed by the speculative and active sciences—ethics first, then mechanics.

To conclude, Kilwardby’s classification includes elements from previous classifications, but the overall result is quite original: (i) the inclusion of logic, as a branch of science about human beings, within the active sciences; (ii) the Aristotelian inspired division between theoretical or speculative philosophy—which encompasses physics, mathematics, and metaphysics—and practical philosophy—which comprises ethics and divides further into monastic, economic, and political; (iii) the inclusion of the mechanical arts (from Hugh of St. Victor) within active or practical philosophy.

7. Celestial motion and time

In 1271, Kilwardby, together with Thomas Aquinas and Albert the Great, received a questionnaire sent by the Master General of the Dominican Order, John of Vercelli. The questionnaire, constituting 43 questions to be answered in a systematic order (forma taxata), surveyed a wide range of theological problems, but the majority (25) was concerned with the movement of the celestial bodies, its causes, and the possible influence upon the inferior (terrestrial) bodies. It includes questions such as: Does God move any body immediately; if so, by a continuous everlasting movement, by a continuous but not everlasting movement, or by an instantaneous motion? (Q1) Are angels the cause of the movement of the celestial bodies? (Q2)

The fifth question inquires about the cause of celestial motion. Kilwardby considers three possible answers that he considers to be either (a) philosophically correct, (b) not to be approved either by philosophy or by the saints, or (c) in agreement with philosophy.

According to Aristotle and others, celestial bodies are animate beings that have intelligence and move by the power of will, in the same way as human bodies are moved by their souls (D43Q 2, 14). Kilwardby himself defends this view in his LSP and DOS (Lewry 1978, 324–5; DOS 20).
Celestial bodies are moved by angels. Kilwardby dismisses this answer by arguing that the motion of the celestial bodies needs to be natural, in other words the principle of motion must be internal to the thing moved (if the cause is external, the motion is violent) (D43Q 2, 12; see also E 2, 24–25). If angels moved celestial bodies, their motion would be violent. In spite of this objection, Kilwardby leaves open the possibility for this view, diplomatically stating that because he does not know, he cannot assert it (quia nescio, asserere nolo) (D43Q 10, 19; 15, 21).
According to some, the cause of the motion of the celestial bodies is their own weight and inclination (instinctu propriorum ponderum: D43Q 3, 192), in the same way as heavy and light bodies are moved by their own weight and inclination (propriis ponderibus et inclinationibus: D43Q 2, 14).

In Kilwardby’s own words:

Just as heavy and light bodies are moved to a place in which they rest by their own inclinations and tendencies, so celestial bodies are moved circularly in place by their own inclinations similar to the weight (quasi ponderibus) in order to conserve corruptible things, lest they suddenly perish and fail. (trans. Weisheipl 1961, 315).

Kilwardby’s theory is, however, not absolutely original, as scholars (in particular Weisheipl) have shown. In fact, some sixty years earlier, John Blund argued for the same explanation in his Tractaus de anima (paragraph 10); here he stated that heaven (including all celestial spheres) is moved by nature and not by the soul or celestial beings. This view seemed to go unnoticed until Kilwardby referred to it; originality claims apart, the significance of Kilwardby’s statement must be emphasized. The interest of his solution is in how it harmonizes a natural explanation for the phenomenon of celestial motion – designating the instinct of their [the celestial bodies’] own weight as its cause – while at the same time it safeguards God’s influence in the natural world: God is not the direct mover, but the one who endows these bodies with their instinct (D43Q 2, 14; see Silva 2007 for references).


One of the questions Kilwardby addresses in his treatise On time (De tempore)—written most probably after DOS—is whether time, as the measure of motion, is defined in relation to the diurnal motion (DT 35), a view identified with Averroes. The aim of his treatise is to understand time in such a way that it reveals compatibility between Aristotle’s (Physics IV, 10–14) definition of time—which Kilwardby calls ‘physical’—as relative to motion (and motion relative to continuous quantity) and the Augustinian (Confessions XI) definition of time—which he calls ‘metaphysical’—as an extension (distensio) of the mind, thus existing only in the mind (DT 10–11). Kilwardby’s solution is to argue for a distinction between indeterminate and determinate time: on the one hand, indeterminate time exists outside of and independent from the numbering mind (it is neither numbered nor measured) as, prior to any measuring, that which is measured is already in motion (DT 77). Determinate time, on the other hand, has existence in the mind only, as it can only exist in the measuring mind. In Kilwardby’s own words, “time comes into existence when we perceive the direction of that which is earlier and later in motion” (DT 77). Time is, therefore, the measure not of any specific motion but the measure of motion (DT 42) defined by an instant before and an instant after. The quantity of motion between these two instants, before and after, has a numerical expression (DT 34), and this number is then used to measure all other motions (DT 49): time “measures the whole motion by determining the motion which will measure the whole” (DT 27). Time is the number of motion because number is the appropriate name for that measure.[31] We determine time by measuring motion according to fixed measures (days, hours, and so on) (DT 77). As the measure for any kind of motion, time has unity.

Time, hence, is dependent for its definition on motion (NSLP 7, 54). The continuous nature of motion is essential to guarantee the continuous nature of time (DT 12). Time needs to be continuous for it to measure continuous motion (NSLP 8, 58). The continuity of motion, in turn, is guaranteed by the continuity of the parts that constitute the moving thing (DT 17). Kilwardby argues that time and motion are exceptions to the rule according to which the parts of composite things must exist simultaneously; instead, he claims, that they are composite transient things, and the parts of time are successive (DT 7–9). Time has its being from the ordination of its parts into before and after (NSLP 8, 58). The instant (the now: nunc) is from the point of view of the substance which is always the same but different in the manner of its existence (DT 89). Time is the measure of continuous motion, and the instant is the measure of one of the moments of that continuous alteration (DT 94–95). For Kilwardby, celestial motion as measured by time is the standard for measuring all other motions (see Trifogli 2013; for other aspects of Kilwardby’s treatment of time, namely the connections to his contemporaries, see Porro 1996.)


Primary Sources

Robert Kilwardby’s works

  • [Lewry I] Commentaries on the Isagoge, [Lewry P] Praedicamenta, [Lewry Pery] Peri Hermeneias, [Lewry LSP] Liber Sex Principiorum, and [Lewry LD] Liber divisionum, ed. P.O. Lewry, Robert Kilwardby’s Writings on the Logica Vetus Studied With Regard to Their Teaching and Method, Ph.D. Dissertation, University of Oxford, 1978.
  • [NSLP] Notulae Super Librum Praedicamentorum, ed. Alessandro D. Conti. [NSLP online]
  • [NSLPery] Notule super librum Peryermenias, ed. Alessandro D. Conti (forthcoming).
  • [NSLPor] Notulae super librum Porphyrii, ed. Alessandro D. Conti (forthcoming).
  • [NLPA] Notulae libri Prisciani De accentibus, ed. P.O. Lewry, “Robertus Kilwardby Notulae libri Prisciani De accentibus,” Mediaeval Studies, 50 (1988): 96–185.
  • [DAM] In Donati artem maiorem III, ed. L. Schmücker, Brixen-Bressanone: A. Weger, 1984.
  • [DNR] De natura relationis, ed. L. Schmücker, Brixen: A. Weger, 1980 (uncritical edition in J.J. Hanagan, The contribution of Robert Kilwardby to Thirteenth Century Thought on the Doctrine of Relation. Ph.D. dissertation, University of Toronto, 1973, Appendix, pp. 1–78.)
  • [NLP] Notule Libri Posteriorum, ed. D. Cannone, Le Notule Libri Posteriorum di Robert Kilwardby nella tradizione esegetica latina medievale del XIII secolo, Ph.D. Dissertation, Rome, 2003–2004.
  • [LT] In libri topycorum, ed. O. Weijers, “Le commentaire sur les Topiques attribué à Robert Kilwardby”, Documenti e studi sulla tradizione filosofica medievale, 6 (1995), 107–143.
  • [LPA] Reverendi Magistri Egidii Romani in libros Priorum analeticorum Aristotelis Expositio et interpretatio sum perquam diligenter visa recognita erroribus purgata. Et quantum anniti ars potuit fideliter impressa cum textu. Venice, 1516, reprinted Frankfurt: Minerva, 1968. New edition (with facing English translation) by P. Thom and J. Scott, Notule Libri Priorum, Oxford: Published for The British Academy by Oxford University Press, 2015 (2 vols.).
  • [DT] De tempore, ed. P.O. Lewry, On Time and Imagination: De tempore, De spiritu fantastico, Oxford: Oxford University Press for the British Academy, 1987.
  • [DSF] De spiritu fantastico, ed. P.O. Lewry, On Time and Imagination: De tempore, De spiritu fantastico, Oxford: Oxford University Press for the British Academy, 1987.
  • [DOS] De ortu scientiarum, ed. A. Judy. Oxford: Oxford University Press for the British Academy, 1976. [A section of the text has been translated as “The Nature of Logic: Dialectic and Demonstration”, in N. Kretzmann & E. Stump (ed.), The Cambridge Translations of Medieval Philosophical Texts, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1989]
  • [QLIS] Quaestiones in Librum Primum Sententiarum, ed. J. Schneider, Munich: Verlag der Bayerischen Akademie der Wissenschaften, 1986.
  • [QLIIS] Quaestiones in Librum Secundum Sententiarum, ed. G. Leibold, Munich: Verlag der Bayerischen Akademie der Wissenschaften, 1992.
  • [QLIII1S] Quaestiones in Librum Tertium Sententiarum, Teil 1: Christologie, ed. E. Gössmann, Munich: Verlag der Bayerischen Akademie der Wissenschaften, 1982.
  • [QLIII2S] Quaestiones in Librum Tertium Sententiarum, Teil 2: Tugendlehre, ed. G. Leibold, Munich: Verlag der Bayerischen Akademie der Wissenschaften, 1985.
  • [QLIVS] Quaestiones in Librum Quartum Sententiarum, ed. R. Schenk, Munich: Verlag der Bayerischen Akademie der Wissenschaften, 1993.
  • [SCI] Sermo in capite ieiunii, ed. E.M.F. Sommer-Seckendorff in Studies in the Life of Robert Kilwardby, O.P., Rome: S. Sabinae, 1937, 163–176.
  • [SDP] Sermo in dominica in Passione, ed. P.O. Lewry, “A Passiontide Sermon of Robert Kilwardby OP,” Archivium Fratrum Praedicatorum, 52 (1982): 89–113.
  • [D43Q] Responsio de XLIII questionibus, ed. H.-F. Dondaine, “Le de 43 questionibus de Robert Kilwardby,” Archivium Fratrum Praedicatorum, 47 (1977): 5–50. [There is a previous partial edition of the text edited by M.-D. Chenu in “Les réponses de S. Thomas et de Kilwardby à la consultation de Jean de Verceil (1271)”, Mélanges Mandonnet. Études d’Histoire Littéraire et Doctrinale du Moyen Age, (Bibliothèque Thomiste 13), Paris: Vrin, 1930, 191–222.]
  • [I] The injunctions of Archbishop Kilwardby (on his Visitation of the University of Oxford in 1276), ed. H.W. Garrod, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1929.
  • [E] Epistola Roberti Kilwardby Archiepiscopi Cantuarensis ad Petrum de Confleto Archiepiscopum Corinthi, ed. F. K. Ehrle in Gesammelte Aufsätze zur Englischen Scholastik, Roma: Edizioni di Storia e Letteratura, 1970, pp. 18–54. [There is a previous partial edition of the 7th article by A. Birkenmajer in “Der Brief Robert Kilwardbys an Peter von Conflans und die Steritschrift Ägidius von Lessines,” Beitrage zur Geschichte der Philosophie des Mittelalters, 20:5 (1922): 36–65.]

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  • –––, 1935, “Further Philosophical Doctrines of Kilwardby,” The New Scholasticism, 9: 39–55.
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  • –––, 2008, “Robert Kilwardby on Sense Perception,” in Theories of Perception in Medieval and Early Modern Philosophy, S. Knuuttila and P. Kärkkäinen (eds.), Dordrecht: Springer, pp. 87–99.
  • –––, 2009, The Human Soul in Robert Kilwardby’s Natural Philosophy and Theology, Ph.D. Dissertation, University of Porto.
  • –––, (and Juhana Toivanen) 2010, “The Active Nature of the Soul in Sense Perception: Robert Kilwardby and Peter John of Olivi,” Vivarium, 48(3–4): 245–278.
  • –––, 2011, “Robert Kilwardby,” in Encyclopedia of Medieval Philosophy, H. Lagerlund (ed.), Dordrecht: Springer, pp. 1148–53.
  • –––, 2012, Robert Kilwardby on The Human Soul. Plurality of Forms and Censorship in the Thirteenth Century, Leiden: Brill.
  • –––, 2013a, “Hugh of St. Victor and Robert Kilwardby on Science,” in La Compilación del Saber en la Edad Media, M.J. Muñoz, P. Cañizares and C. Martin (eds.), Porto: FIDEM, pp. 515–31.
  • –––, 2013b, “Robert Kilwardby on the Theory of the Soul and Epistemology,” in Lagerlund and Thom (eds.) 2013, pp. 275–313.
  • –––, 2014, “Medieval Theories of Active Perception: An Overview,” Active Perception in the History of Philosophy. From Plato to Modern Philosophy, J.F. Silva and M. Yrjönsuuri (eds.), Dordrecht: Springer, pp. 117–46.
  • –––, 2020a, “Robert Kilwardby on Negative Judgement,” Topoi 39: 667–677.
  • –––, 2020b, Robert Kilwardby, (Series Great Medieval Thinkers), Oxford, Oxford University Press.
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  • –––, 1988, “’Instituitiones Grammaticae’ XVII.187: Three Reactions,” in L’Héritage des grammariens latins de l’antiquité aux lumières, I. Rosier (ed.), Paris: Editions Peeters, pp. 171–229.
  • –––, 1990, “Robert Kilwardby: Figurative constructions and the limits of grammar”, in De ortu grammaticae. Studies in Medieval Grammar and Linguistic Theory in Memory of Jan Pinborg, G.L. Bursill-Hall, S. Ebbesen, and K. Koerner (eds.), Amsterdam-Philadelphia: John Benjamins, pp. 321–37.
  • –––, 2007, “‘Utrum idem sint dicere et intelligere sive videre in mente’: Robert Kilwardby, Quaestiones in librum primum Sententiarum,” Vivarium, 45(2–3): 253–68.
  • ––– and K.M. Fredborg, 2013, “Demonstratio ad oculum and Demonstratio ad intellectum: Pronouns in Ps.–Jordan and Robert Kilwardby,” in Fink and Ebbesen (eds.) 2013, pp. 199–20.
  • Sommer-Seckendorff, E.M.F., 1937, Studies in the Life of Robert Kilwardby, O.P., (Dissertationes Historicae: Fasc. VII), Rome: Institutum Historicum Fratum Praedicatorum Romae S. Sabinae.
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  • –––, 1935–36, “Der Traktat des Roberts Kilwardby, O.P. De imagine et vestigio Trinitatis,” Archives d’histoire doctrinale et littéraire du moyen âge, 10: 324–407.
  • Steel, C., 2009, “Albert’s use of Kilwardby’s Notulae in his Paraphrase of the Categories,” in Via Alberti. Texte-Quellen-Interpretationen, L. Honnefelder, H. Möhle, and S.B. del Barrio (eds.), Münster: Aschendorff, pp. 481–507.
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  • –––, 2013a, “Robert Kilwardby on Syllogistic Form,” in Lagerlund and Thom (eds.) 2013, pp. 131–61.
  • –––, 2013b, “Culuerbinus Somnians,” in Fink and Ebbesen (eds.), 2013, pp. 171–84.
  • –––, 2016, “Robert Kilwardby’s Disputational Logic,” History and Philosophy of Logic, 37(3): 230–43.
  • –––, 2019, Robert Kilwardby’s Science of Logic: A Thirteenth-Century Intensional Logic, Leiden: Brill.
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  • –––, 1954, “Maxims in Kilwardby,” Dominican Studies, 7: 129–34.
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  • Thörnqvist, C.T., 2013, “The “Anonymus Aurelianensis III” and Robert Kilwardby on the Prior Analytics,” in Fink and Ebbesen (eds.), 2013, pp. 185–198.
  • –––, 2015, Anonymus Aurelianensis III in Aristotelis Analytica priora, Leiden: Brill.
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