Scientific Progress

First published Tue Oct 1, 2002; substantive revision Mon Jan 22, 2024

Science is often distinguished from other domains of human culture by its progressive nature: in contrast to art, religion, philosophy, morality, and politics, there exist clear standards or normative criteria for identifying improvements and advances in science. For example, the historian of science George Sarton argued that “the acquisition and systematization of positive knowledge are the only human activities which are truly cumulative and progressive,” and “progress has no definite and unquestionable meaning in other fields than the field of science” (Sarton 1936). However, the traditional cumulative view of scientific knowledge was effectively challenged by many philosophers of science in the 1960s and the 1970s, and thereby the notion of progress was also questioned in the field of science. Debates on the normative concept of progress are at the same time concerned with axiological questions about the aims and goals of science. The task of philosophical analysis is to consider alternative answers to the question: What is meant by progress in science? This conceptual question can then be complemented by the methodological question: How can we recognize progressive developments in science? Relative to a definition of progress and an account of its best indicators, one may then study the factual question: To what extent, and in which respects, is science progressive?

1. The Study of Scientific Change

The idea that science is a collective enterprise of researchers in successive generations is characteristic of the Modern Age (Nisbet 1980). Classical empiricists (Francis Bacon) and rationalists (René Descartes) of the seventeenth century urged that the use of proper methods of inquiry guarantees the discovery and justification of new truths. This cumulative view of scientific progress was an important ingredient in the optimism of the eighteenth century Enlightenment, and it was incorporated in the 1830s in Auguste Comte’s program of positivism: by accumulating empirically certified truths science also promotes progress in society. Other influential trends in the nineteenth century were the Romantic vision of organic growth in culture, Hegel’s dynamic account of historical change, and the theory of evolution. They all inspired epistemological views (e.g., among Marxists and pragmatists) which regarded human knowledge as a process. Philosopher-scientists with an interest in the history of science (William Whewell, Charles Peirce, Ernst Mach, Pierre Duhem) gave interesting analyses of some aspects of scientific change.

In the early twentieth century, analytic philosophers of science started to apply modern logic to the study of science. Their main focus was the structure of scientific theories and patterns of inference (Suppe 1977). This “synchronic” investigation of the “finished products” of scientific activities was questioned by philosophers who wished to pay serious attention to the “diachronic” study of scientific change. Among these contributions one can mention N.R. Hanson’s Patterns of Discovery (1958), Karl Popper’s The Logic of Scientific Discovery (1959) and Conjectures and Refutations (1963), Thomas Kuhn’s The Structure of Scientific Revolutions (1962), Paul Feyerabend’s incommensurability thesis (Feyerabend 1962), Imre Lakatos’ methodology of scientific research programmes (Lakatos and Musgrave 1970), and Larry Laudan’s Progress and Its Problems (1977). Darwinist models of evolutionary epistemology were advocated by Popper’s Objective Knowledge: An Evolutionary Approach (1972) and Stephen Toulmin’s Human Understanding (1972). These works challenged the received view about the development of scientific knowledge and rationality. Popper’s falsificationism, Kuhn’s account of scientific revolutions, and Feyerabend’s thesis of meaning variance shared the view that science does not grow simply by accumulating new established truths upon old ones. Except perhaps during periods of Kuhnian normal science, theory change is not cumulative or continuous: the earlier results of science will be rejected, replaced, and reinterpreted by new theories and conceptual frameworks. Popper and Kuhn differed, however, in their definitions of progress: the former appealed to the idea that successive theories may approach towards the truth, while the latter characterized progress in terms of the problem-solving capacity of theories.

Since the mid-1970s, a great number of philosophical works have been published on the topics of change, development, and progress in science (Harré 1975; Stegmüller 1976; Howson 1976; Rescher 1978; Radnitzky and Andersson 1978, 1979; Niiniluoto and Tuomela 1979; Dilworth 1981; Smith 1981; Hacking 1981; Schäfer 1983; Niiniluoto 1984; Laudan 1984a; Rescher 1984; Pitt 1985; Radnitzky and Bartley 1987; Callebaut and Pinxten 1987; Balzer et al. 1987; Hull 1988; Gavroglu et al. 1989; Kitcher 1993; Pera 1994; Chang 2004; Maxwell 2017; Shan 2023; Rowbottom 2023). These studies have also led to many important novelties being added to the toolbox of philosophers of science. One of them is the systematic study of inter-theory relations, such as reduction (Balzer et al. 1984; Pearce 1987; Balzer 2000; Jonkisz 2000; Hoyningen-Huene and Sankey 2001), correspondence (Krajewski 1977; Nowak 1980; Pearce and Rantala 1984; Nowakowa and Nowak 2000; Rantala 2002), and belief revision (Gärdenfors, 1988; Aliseda, 2006). A new tool that is employed in many defenses of realist views of scientific progress (Niiniluoto 1980, 2014; Aronson, Harré, and Way 1994; Kuipers 2000, 2019; Garcia-Lapena 2023) is the notion of truthlikeness or verisimilitude (Popper 1963, 1970).

Besides individual statements and theories, there is also a need to consider temporally developing units of scientific activity and achievement: Kuhn’s paradigm-directed normal science, Lakatos’ research programme, Laudan’s research tradition, Wolfgang Stegmüller’s (1976) dynamic theory evolution, Philip Kitcher’s (1993) consensus practice, and Hasok Chang’s (2012) systems of practice. Kuhn refined his concept of paradigm to “a disciplinary matrix,” which is a constellation of symbolic generalizations, models, values, and exemplary problem solutions. Rachel Ankeny and Sabina Leonelli (2016) define an alternative to Kuhnian paradigms in their concept of “repertoire,” understood as a well-aligned assemblage of the skills, behaviors, and material, social, and epistemic components used by a collaborative group of researchers. Nancy Cartwright et al. (2022) argue that, instead of rigorous and objective methods, reliability is guaranteed by the “tangle” of science, i.e., the working together of theories, methods, experiments, instruments, classification schemes, habits of data collection, forms of analysis, and measuring techniques.

Lively interest about the development of science promoted close co-operation between historians and philosophers of science. For example, case studies of historical examples (e.g., the replacement of Newton’s classical mechanics by quantum theory and theory of relativity) have inspired many philosophical treatments of scientific revolutions. Historical case studies were important for philosophers who started to study scientific discovery (Hanson 1958; Nickles 1980). Historically oriented philosophers have shown how instruments and measurements have promoted the progress of physics and chemistry (Rheinberger 1997; Chang 2004). Experimental psychologists have argued that the strive for broad and simple explanations shapes learning and inference (Lombrozo 2016). Further interesting material for philosophical discussions about scientific progress is provided by quantitative approaches in the study of the growth of scientific publications (de Solla Price 1963; Rescher 1978) and science indicators (Elkana et al. 1978). Sociologists of science have studied the dynamic interaction between the scientific community and other social institutions. With their influence, philosophers have analyzed the role of social and cultural values in the development of science (Longino 2002, Pestre 2003). One of the favorite topics of sociologists has been the emergence of new scientific specialties (Mulkay 1975; Niiniluoto 1995b). Sociologists are also concerned with the pragmatic problem of progress: what is the best way of organizing research activities in order to promote scientific advance. In this way, models of scientific change turn out to be relevant to issues of science policy (Böhme 1977; Schäfer 1983).

2. The Concept of Progress

2.1 Aspects of Scientific Progress

Science is a multi-layered complex system involving a community of scientists engaged in research using scientific methods in order to produce new knowledge. Thus, the notion of science may refer to a social institution, the researchers, the research process, the method of inquiry, and scientific knowledge. The concept of progress can be defined relative to each of these aspects of science. Hence, different types of progress can be distinguished relative to science: economical (the increased funding of scientific research), professional (the rising status of the scientists and their academic institutions in the society), educational (the increased skill and expertise of the scientists), methodical (the invention of new methods of research, the refinement of scientific instruments), and cognitive (increase or advancement of scientific knowledge). These types of progress have to be conceptually distinguished from advances in other human activities, even though it may turn out that scientific progress has at least some factual connections with technological progress (increased effectiveness of tools and techniques) and social progress (economic prosperity, quality of life, justice in society).

All of these aspects of scientific progress may involve different considerations, so that there is no single concept that would cover all of them. For our purposes, it is appropriate here to concentrate only on cognitive progress, i.e., to give an account of advances of science in terms of its success in knowledge-seeking or truth-seeking. Such progress in modern science presupposes that scientific information is made available in published and peer reviewed articles and monographs, while economical, professional, educational, and methodical advances promote scientific progress but do not constitute cognitive progress (cf. Dellsén 2023). Similarly, technological progress and social progress may be consequences of scientific progress without constituting cognitive progress.

2.2 Progress vs. Development

“Progress” is an axiological or a normative concept, which should be distinguished from such neutral descriptive terms as “change” and “development” (Niiniluoto 1995a). In general, to say that a step from stage \(A\) to stage \(B\) constitutes progress means that \(B\) is an improvement over \(A\) in some respect, i.e., \(B\) is better than \(A\) relative to some standards or criteria. In science, it is a normative demand that all contributions to research should yield some cognitive profit, and their success in this respect can be assessed before publication by referees (peer review) and after publication by colleagues. Hence, the theory of scientific progress is not merely a descriptive account of the patterns of developments that science has in fact followed. Rather, it should give a specification of the values or aims that can be used as the constitutive criteria for “good science.”

The “naturalist” program in science studies suggests that normative questions in the philosophy of science can be reduced to historical and sociological investigations of the actual practice of science. In this spirit, Laudan has defended the project of testing philosophical models of scientific change by the history of science: such models, which are “often couched in normative language,” can be recast “into declarative statements about how science does behave” (Laudan et al. 1986; Donovan et al. 1988). It may be the case that most scientific work, at least the best science of each age, is also good science. But it is also evident that scientists often have different opinions about the criteria of good science, and rival researchers and schools make different choices in their preference of theories and research programs. Therefore, it can be argued against the naturalists that progress should not be defined by the actual developments of science: the definition of progress should give us a normative standard for appraising the choices that the scientific communities have made, could have made, are just now making, and will make in the future. The task of finding and defending such standards is a genuinely philosophical one which can be enlightened by history and sociology but which cannot be reduced to empirical studies of science. For the same reason, Mizrahi’s (2013) empirical observation that scientists talk about the aim of science in terms of knowledge rather than merely truth cannot settle the philosophical debate about scientific progress (cf. Bird 2007; Niiniluoto 2014).

2.3 Progress, Quality, Impact

For many goal-directed activities it is important to distinguish between quality and progress. Quality is primarily an activity-oriented concept, concerning the skill and competence in the performance of some task. Progress is a result-oriented concept, concerning the success of a product relative to some goal. All acceptable work in science has to fulfill certain standards of quality. But it seems that there are no necessary connections between quality and progress in science. Sometimes very well-qualified research projects fail to produce important new results, while less competent but more lucky works lead to success. Nevertheless, the skillful use of the methods of science will make progress highly probable. Hence, the best practical strategy in promoting scientific progress is to support high-quality research.

Following the pioneering work of Derek de Solla Price (1963) in “scientometrics,” quantitative science indicators have been proposed as measures of scientific activity (Elkana et al. 1978). For example, output measures like publication counts are measures of scholarly achievement, but it is problematic whether such a crude measure is sufficient to indicate quality (cf. Chotkowski La Follette 1982). Another example of a science indicator, citation index, is an indicator for the “impact” of a publication and for the “visibility” of its author within the scientific community. The relative importance and quality of a journal is often measured by its impact factor, defined by the yearly mean number of citations of its published articles in the last two years. Thus, the number of articles in refereed journals with a high impact factor is an indicator of the quality of their author, but it is clear that this indicator cannot yet define what progress means, since publications may contribute different amounts to the advance of scientific knowledge. “Rousseau’s Law” proposed by Nicholas Rescher (1978) marks off a certain part (the square root) of the total number of publications as “important”, but this is merely an alleged statistical regularity.

Martin and Irvine (1983) suggest that the concept of scientific progress should be linked to the notion of impact, i.e., the actual influence of research to the surrounding scientific activities at a given time. It is no doubt correct that one cannot advance scientific knowledge without influencing the epistemic state of the scientific community. But the impact of a publication as such only shows that it has successfully “moved” the scientific community in some direction. If science is goal-directed, then we must acknowledge that movement in the wrong direction does not constitute progress.

The failure of science indicators to function as definitions of scientific progress is due to the fact that they do not take into account the semantic content of scientific publications. To determine whether a work \(W\) gives a contribution to scientific progress, we have to specify what \(W\) says (alternatively: what problems \(W\) solves) and then relate this content of \(W\) to the knowledge situation of the scientific community at the time of the publication of \(W\). For the same reason, research assessment exercises may use science indicators as tools, but ultimately they have to rely on the judgment of peers who have substantial knowledge in the field.

2.4 Progress and Goals

Progress is a goal-relative concept. But even when we consider science as a knowledge-seeking cognitive enterprise, there is no reason to assume that the goal of science is one-dimensional. In contrast, as Isaac Levi’s classic Gambling With Truth (1967) argued, the cognitive aim of scientific inquiry has to be defined as a weighted combination of several different, and even conflicting, epistemic utilities. As we shall see in Section 3, alternative theories of scientific progress can be understood as specifications of such epistemic utilities. For example, they might include truth and information (Levi 1967; see also Popper 1959, 1963) or explanatory and predictive power (Hempel 1965). Kuhn’s (1977) list of the values of science includes accuracy, consistency, scope, simplicity, and fruitfulness.

A goal may be accessible in the sense that it can be reached in a finite number of steps in a finite time. A goal is utopian if it cannot be reached or even approached. Thus, utopian goals cannot be rationally pursued, since no progress can be made in an attempt to reach them. Walking to the moon is a utopian task in this sense. However, not all inaccessible goals are utopian: an unreachable goal, such as being morally perfect, can function as a regulative principle in Kant’s sense, if it guides our behavior so that we are able to make progress towards it.

The classical sceptic argument against science, repeated by Laudan (1984a), is that knowing the truth is a utopian task. Kant’s answer to this argument was to regard truth as a regulative principle for science. Charles S. Peirce, the founder of American pragmatism, argued that the access to the truth as the ideal limit of scientific inquiry is “destined” or guaranteed in an “indefinite” community of investigators. Almeder’s (1983) interpretation of Peirce’s view of scientific progress is that there is only a finite number of scientific problems and they will all be solved in a finite time. However, there does not seem to be any reason to think that truth is generally accessible in this strong sense. Therefore, the crucial question is whether it is possible to make rational appraisals that we have made progress in the direction of the truth (see Section 3.4).

A goal is effectively recognizable if there are routine or mechanical tests for showing that the goal has been reached or approached. If the defining criteria of progress are not recognizable in this strong sense, we have to distinguish true or real progress from our perceptions or estimations of progress. In other words, claims of the form ‘The step from stage \(A\) to stage \(B\) is progressive’ have to be distinguished from our appraisals of the form ‘The step from stage \(A\) to stage \(B\) seems progressive on the available evidence’. The latter appraisals, as our own judgments, are recognizable, but the former claims may be correct without our knowing it. Characteristics and measures that help us to make such appraisals are then indicators of progress.

Laudan requires that a rational goal for science should be accessible and effectively recognizable (Laudan 1977, 1984a). This requirement, which he uses to rule out truth as a goal of science, is very strong. The demands of rationality cannot dictate that a goal has to be given up, if there are reasonable indicators of progress towards it.

A goal may be backward-looking or forward-looking: it may refer to the starting point or to the destination point of an activity. If my aim is to travel as far from home as possible, my success is measured by my distance from Helsinki. If I wish to become ever better and better piano player, my improvement can be assessed relative to my earlier stages, not to any ideal Perfect Pianist. But if I want to travel to San Francisco, my progress is a function of my distance from the destination. Only in the special case, where there is only one way from \(A\) to \(B\), the backward-looking and the forward-looking criteria (i.e., distance from \(A\) and distance to \(B)\) determine each other.

Kuhn and Stegmüller were advocating backward-looking criteria of progress. In arguing against the view that “the proper measure of scientific achievement is the extent to which it brings us closer to ” the ultimate goal of “one full, objective true account of nature,” Kuhn suggested that we should “learn to substitute evolution-from-what-we-know for evolution-toward-what-we-wish-to-know” (Kuhn 1970, p. 171). In the same spirit, Stegmüller (1976) argued that we should reject all variants of “a teleological metaphysics” defining progress in terms of “coming closer and closer to the truth.”

A compromise between forward-looking and backward-looking criteria can be proposed in the following way. If science is viewed as a knowledge-seeking activity, it is natural to define real progress in forward-looking terms: the cognitive aim of science is to know something that is still unknown, and our real progress depends on our distance from this destination. But, as this goal is unknown to us, our estimates or perceptions of progress have to be based on backward-looking evidential considerations. This kind of view of the aims of science does not presuppose the existence of one unique ultimate goal. To use Levi’s words, our goals may be “myopic” rather than “messianic” (Levi 1985): the particular target that we wish to hit in the course of our inquiry has to be redefined “locally,” relative to each cognitive problem situation. Furthermore, in addition to the multiplicity of the possible targets, there may be several roads that lead to the same destination. The forward-looking character of the goals of inquiry does not exclude what Stegmüller calls “progress branching.” This is analogous to the simple fact that we may approach San Francisco from New York along two different ways—via Chicago or St Louis.

2.5 Progress and Rationality

Some philosophers use the concepts of progress and rationality as synonyms: progressive steps in science are precisely those that are based upon the scientists’ rational choices. One possible objection is that scientific discoveries are progressive when they introduce novel ideas, even though they cannot be fully explained in rational terms (Popper 1959; cf. Hanson 1958; Kleiner 1993). However, another problem is more relevant here: By whose lights should such steps be evaluated? This question is urgent especially if we acknowledge that standards of good science have changed in history (Laudan 1984a).

As we shall see, the main rival philosophical theories of progress propose absolute criteria, such as problem-solving capacity or increasing truthlikeness, that are applicable to all developments of science throughout its history. On the other hand, rationality is a methodological concept which is historically relative: in assessing the rationality of the choices made by the past scientists, we have to study the aims, standards, methods, alternative theories and available evidence accepted within the scientific community at that time (cf. Doppelt 1983, Laudan 1987; Niiniluoto 1999a). If the scientific community \(SC\) at a given point of time \(t\) accepted the standards \(V\), then the preference of \(SC\) for theory \(T\) over \(T'\) on evidence \(e\) was rational just in case the epistemic utility of \(T\) relative to \(V\) was higher than that of \(T'\). But in a new situation, where the standards were different from \(V\), a different preference might have been rational.

3. Theories of Scientific Progress

3.1 Realism and Instrumentalism

A major controversy among philosophers of science is between instrumentalist and realist views of scientific theories (Leplin 1984; Psillos 1999; Niiniluoto 1999a; Saatsi 2018). The instrumentalists follow Duhem in thinking that theories are merely conceptual tools for classifying, systematizing and predicting observational statements, so that the genuine content of science is not to be found on the level of theories (Duhem 1954). Scientific realists, by contrast, regard theories as attempts to describe reality even beyond the realm of observable things and regularities, so that theories can be regarded as statements having a truth value. Excluding naive realists, most scientists are fallibilists in Peirce’s sense: scientific theories are hypothetical and always corrigible in principle. They may happen to be true, but we cannot know this for certain in any particular case. But even when theories are false, they can be cognitively valuable if they are closer to the truth than their rivals (Popper 1963). Theories should be testable by observational evidence, and success in empirical tests gives inductive confirmation (Hintikka 1968; Kuipers 2000) or non-inductive corroboration to the theory (Popper 1959).

It might seem natural to expect that the main rival accounts of scientific progress would be based upon the positions of instrumentalism and realism. But this is only partly true. To be sure, naive realists as a rule hold the accumulation-of-truths view of progress, and many philosophers combine the realist view of theories with the axiological thesis that truth is an important goal of scientific inquiry. A non-cumulative version of the realist view of progress can be formulated by using the notion of truthlikeness. But there are also philosophers who accept the possibility of a realist treatment of theories, but still deny that truth is a relevant value of science which could have a function in the characterization of scientific progress. Nancy Cartwright et al. (2022) suggest that truth should be replaced by reliability as the ultimate goal of science. Bas van Fraassen’s (1980) constructive empiricism takes the desideratum of science to be empirical adequacy: what a theory says about the observable should be true. The acceptance of a theory involves only the claim that it is empirically adequate, not its truth on the theoretical level. Van Fraassen has not developed an account of scientific progress in terms of his constructive empiricism, but presumably such an account would be close to empiricist notions of reduction and Laudan’s account of problem-solving ability (see Section 3.2).

An instrumentalist who denies that theories have truth values usually defines scientific progress by referring to other virtues theories may have, such as their increasing empirical success. In 1906 Duhem expressed this idea by a simile: scientific progress is like a mounting tide, where waves rise and withdraw, but under this to-and-fro motion there is a slow and constant progress. However, he gave a realist twist to his view by assuming that theories classify experimental laws, and progress means that the proposed classifications approach a “natural classification” (Duhem 1954).

Evolutionary epistemology is open to instrumentalist (Toulmin 1972) and realist (Popper 1972) interpretations (Callebaut and Pinxten 1987; Radnitzky and Bartley 1987). A biological approach to human knowledge naturally gives emphasis to the pragmatist view that theories function as instruments of survival. Darwinist evolution in biology is not goal-directed with a fixed forward-looking goal; rather, species adapt themselves to an ever changing environment. In applying this account to the problem of knowledge-seeking, the fitness of a theory can be taken to mean that the theory is accepted by members of the scientific community. But a realist can reinterpret the evolutionary model by taking fitness to mean the truth or truthlikeness of a theory (Niiniluoto 1984).

3.2 Empirical Success and Problem-Solving

For a constructive empiricist, it would be natural to think that among empirically adequate theories one theory \(T_{2}\) is better than another theory \(T_{1}\) if \(T_{2}\) entails more true observational statements than \(T_{1}\). Such a comparison makes sense at least if the observation statements entailed by \(T_{1}\) are a proper subset of those entailed by \(T_{2}\). Kemeny and Oppenheim (1956) gave a similar condition in their definition of reduction: \(T_{1}\) is reducible to \(T_{2}\) if and only if \(T_{2}\) is at least as well systematized as \(T_{1}\) and \(T_{2}\) is observationally stronger than \(T_{1}\), i.e., all observational statements explained by \(T_{1}\) are also consequences of \(T_{2}\). Variants of such an empirical reduction relation has been given by the structuralist school in terms of set-theoretical structures (Stegmüller 1976; Scheibe 1986; Balzer et al. 1987; Moulines 2000). A similar idea, but applied to cases where the first theory \(T_{1}\) has been falsified by some observational evidence, was used by Lakatos in his definition of empirically progressive research programmes: the new superseding theory \(T_{2}\) should have corroborated excess content relative to \(T_{1}\) and \(T_{2}\) should contain all the unrefuted content of \(T_{1}\) (Lakatos and Musgrave 1970). The definition of Kuipers (2000) allows that even the new theory \(T_{2}\) is empirically refuted: \(T_{2}\) should have (in the sense of set-theoretical inclusion) more empirical successes, but fewer empirical counter-examples than \(T_{1}\).

Against these cumulative definitions it has been argued that definitions of empirical progress have to take into account an important complication. A new theory often corrects the empirical consequences of the previous one, i.e., \(T_{2}\) entails observational statements \(e_{2}\) which are in some sense close to the corresponding consequences \(e_{1}\) of \(T_{1}\). Various models of approximate explanation and approximate reduction have been introduced to handle these situations. An important special case is the limiting correspondence relation: theory \(T_{2}\) approaches theory \(T_{1}\) (or the observational consequences of \(T_{2}\) approach those of \(T_{1})\) when some parameter in its laws approaches a limit value (e.g., theory of relativity approaches classical mechanics when the velocity of light c grows without limit). Here \(T_{2}\) is said to be a concretization or de-idealization of the idealized theory \(T_{1}\) (Nowak 1980; Nowakowa and Nowak 2000; Kuipers 2019). However, these models do not automatically guarantee that the step from an old theory to a new one is progressive. For example, classical mechanics can be related by the correspondence condition to an infinite number of alternative and mutually incompatible theories, and some additional criteria are needed to pick out the best among them.

Kuhn’s (1962) strategy was to avoid the notion of truth and to understand science as an activity of making accurate predictions and solving problems or “puzzles”. Paradigm-based normal science is cumulative in terms of the problems solved, and even paradigm-changes or revolutions are progressive in the sense that “a relatively large part” of the problem-solving capacity of the old theory is preserved in the new paradigm. But, as Kuhn argued, it may happen that some problems solved by the old theory are no longer relevant or meaningful for the new theory. These cases are called “Kuhn-losses.” A more systematic account of these ideas is given by Laudan (1977): the problem-solving effectiveness of a theory is defined by the number and importance of solved empirical problems minus the number and importance of the anomalies and conceptual problems that the theory generates. Here the concept of anomaly refers to a problem that a theory fails to solve, but is solved by some of its rivals. For Laudan the solution of a problem by a theory \(T\) means that the “statement of the problem” is deduced from \(T\). A good theory is thus empirically adequate, strong in its empirical content, and—Laudan adds—avoids conceptual problems.

One difficulty for the problem-solving account is to find a proper framework for identifying and counting problems (Rescher 1984; Kleiner 1993). When Newton’s mechanics is applied to determine the orbit of the planet Mars, this can be counted as one problem. But, given an initial position of Mars, the same theory entails a solution to an infinite number of questions concerning the position of Mars at time \(t\). Perhaps the most important philosophical issue is whether one may consistently hold that the notion of problem-solving may be entirely divorced from truth and falsity: the realist may admit that science is a problem-solving activity, if this means the attempt to find true solutions to predictive and explanatory questions (Popper, 1972; Niiniluoto 1984). Bird’s (2007) main criticism against the “functional account” of Kuhn and Laudan is its consequence that the cumulation of false solutions from an entirely false theory counts as scientific progress (e.g. Oresme in the fourteenth century believed that hot goat’s blood could split diamonds).

According to Shan (2019), “science progresses if more useful research problems and their corresponding solutions are proposed”. Progress means that “more useful exemplary practices are proposed”, where usefulness requires repeatability in further investigation (Shan 2023). This definition involves both problem-defining and problem-solving, as illustrated by the development of early genetics from Darwin to Bateson. Articles in Shan (2023) apply it to economics, seismology, and interdisciplinary sciences. Shan gives up the typical Kuhn-Laudan assumption that the scientific community is able to know whether it makes progress or not, and is open to the introduction of the notions of know-how and perspectival truth, so that his “new functional approach” is a compromise with what Bird (2007) calls the “epistemic view” of progress. Bird (2023) and Dellsén (2023) object that some progressive developments (e.g. the discovery of X-rays, applications of Newtonian mechanics) do not involve the proposal of any new exemplary practices. It can also be argued that improved experimentation and exploration belong to factors which promote but do not constitute progress in science.

A different view of problem-solving is involved in those theories which discuss problems of decision and action. A radical pragmatist view treats science as a systematic method of solving such decision problems relative to various kinds of practical utilities. According to the view called behavioralism by the statistician L J. Savage, science does not produce knowledge, but rather recommendations for actions: to accept a hypothesis is always a decision to act as if that hypothesis were true. Progress in science can then be measured by the achievement of the practical utilities of the decision maker. An alternative methodological version of pragmatism is defended by Rescher (1977) who accepts the realist view of theories with some qualifications, but argues that the progress of science has to be understood as “the increasing success of applications in problem-solving and control.” Similarly, Douglas (2014), after suggesting that the distinction between pure and applied science should be relinquished, defines progress “in terms of the increased capacity to predict, control, manipulate, and intervene in various contexts.” A concrete example of interdisciplinary “frontier science” is given by Nersessian (2022): bioengineering scientists create novel problem-solving methods which help to understand complex dynamical biological systems sufficiently in order to control and intervene in them. Mizrahi (2013) and Shan (2023) count increasing know how as progress in science. But, in this view, the notion of scientific progress is in effect reduced to science-based technological progress (cf. Niiniluoto 1984).

3.3 Explanatory Power, Unification, and Simplicity

Already the ancient philosophers regarded explanation as an important function of science. The status of explanatory theories was interpreted either in an instrumentalist or realist way: Plato’s school started the tradition of “saving the appearances” in astronomy, while Aristotle took theories to be necessary truths. Both parties can take explanatory power to be a criterion of a good theory, as shown by van Fraassen’s (1980) constructive empiricism and Wilfrid Sellars’ scientific realism (Pitt 1981; Tuomela 1985). When it is added that a good theory should also yield true empirical predictions, the notions of explanatory and predictive power can be combined within the notion of systematic power (Hempel 1965). If the demand of systematic power simply means that a theory has many true deductive consequences in the observational language, this concept is essentially equivalent to the notion of empirical success and empirical problem-solving ability discussed in Section 3.2, but normally explanation is taken to include additional structural conditions besides mere deduction (Aliseda 2006). Inductive systematization should also be taken into account (Hempel 1965; Niiniluoto and Tuomela 1973).

One important idea regarding systematization is that a good theory should unify empirical data and laws from different domains (Kitcher 1993; Schurz 2015). For Whewell, the paradigm case of such “consilience” was the successful unification of Kepler’s laws and Galileo’s laws by means of Newton’s theory.

On the other hand, instead of requiring consensus on a single unifying theory, many philosophers have defended pluralist approaches by arguing that scientific progress needs a variety of conceptual classifications (Dupré 1993; Kitcher 2001; Chang 2012), a non-fundamentalist patchwork of laws for “a dappled world” (Cartwright 1999), and different perspectives and values (Longino 2002).

If theories are underdetermined by observational data, then one is often advised to choose the simplest theory compatible with the evidence (Foster and Martin 1966). Simplicity may be an aesthetic criterion of theory choice (Kuipers 2019), but it may also have a cognitive function in helping us in our attempt to understand the world in an “economical” way. Ernst Mach’s notion of the economy of thought is related to the demand of manageability, which is important especially in the engineering sciences and other applied sciences: for example, a mathematical equation can be made “simpler” by suitable approximations, so that it can be solved by a computer. Simplicity has also been related to the notion of systematic or unifying power. This is clear in Eino Kaila’s concept of relative simplicity, which he defined in 1939 as the ratio between the explanatory power and the structural complexity of a theory (for a translation, see Kaila 2014). According to this conception, progress can be achieved by finding structurally simpler explanations of the same data, or by increasing the scope of explanations without making them more complex. Laudan’s formula of solved empirical problems minus generated conceptual problems is a variation of the same idea.

After Hempel’s pioneering work in 1948, various probabilistic measures of explanatory power have been proposed (Hempel 1965; Hintikka 1968). Most of them demand that the explanatory theory \(h\) should be positively relevant to the empirical data \(e\). This is the case also with the particular proposal \[ \frac{P(h\mid e) - P(h\mid\neg e)}{P(h\mid e) + P(h\mid\neg e)} \] defended by Schupbach and Sprenger (2011) as the unique measure which satisfies seven intuitively plausible adequacy conditions. Dellsén’s (2016) original version of his noetic account defines progress in terms of increasing explanations and predictions, but he does not apply measures of explanatory or systematic power.

While philosophers from Hempel (1965) to Dellsén (2016) have treated explanation and prediction as equally important for scientific advance, some authors have a strong preference for prediction against the “explanationists”. Following Akaike’s statistical account of model selection, Sober (2008) takes simplicity and predictive accuracy to be the main virtues of a scientific theory. Lakatos emphasized the role of temporally new predictions in his view of progress by research programmes (Lakatos and Musgrave 1970). Leplin (1997) characterizes “novel” predictions by the independence condition, i.e. they were not used in the construction of a theory, and argues that such such novel predictions can be explained only by the truth of the theory (cf. Alai 2014). However, Vickers (2022) argues that evidence provided by novel predictions has been historically unreliable, suggesting that “future-proof science” has to be identified by at least 95 per cent consensus of the scientific community.

3.4 Truth and Information

Realist theories of scientific progress take truth to be an important goal of inquiry. This view is built into the classical definition of knowledge as justified true belief: if science is a knowledge-seeking activity, then it is also a truth-seeking activity. However, truth cannot be the only relevant epistemic utility of inquiry. This is shown in a clear way by cognitive decision theory (Levi 1967; Niiniluoto 1987).

Let us denote by \(B = \{h_{1}, \ldots ,h_{n}\}\) a set of mutually exclusive and jointly exhaustive hypotheses. Here the hypotheses in \(B\) may be the most informative descriptions of alternative states of affairs or possible worlds within a conceptual framework \(L\). For example, they may be complete theories expressible in a finite first-order language. If \(L\) is interpreted on a domain \(U\), so that each sentence of \(L\) has a truth value (true or false), it follows that there is one and only one true hypothesis (say \(h^*\)) in \(B\). Our cognitive problem is to identify the target \(h^*\) in \(B\). The elements \(h_{i}\) of \(B\) are the (potential) complete answers to the problem. The set \(D(B)\) of partial answers consists of all non-empty disjunctions of complete answers. The trivial partial answer in \(D(B)\), corresponding to ‘I don’t know’, is represented by a tautology, i.e., the disjunction of all complete answers.

For any \(g\) in \(D(B)\), we let \(u(g, h_{j})\) be the epistemic utility of accepting \(g\) if \(h_{j}\) is true. We also assume that a rational probability measure \(P\) is associated with language \(L\), so that each \(h_{j}\) can be assigned with its epistemic probability \(P(h_{j}\mid e)\) given evidence \(e\). Then the best hypothesis in \(D(B)\) is the one \(g\) which maximizes the expected epistemic utility

\[\tag{1} U(g\mid e) = \sum_{j=1}^{n} P(h_j \mid e)u(g, h_j) \]

For comparative purposes, we may say that one hypothesis is better than another if it has a higher expected utility than the other by formula (1).

If truth is the only relevant epistemic utility, all true answers are equally good and all false answers are equally bad. Then we may take \(u(g, h_{j})\) simply to be the truth value of \(g\) relative to \(h_{j}\):

\[ u(g, h_j) = \begin{cases} 1 \text{ if } h_j \text { is in } g \\ 0 \text{ otherwise.} \end{cases} \]

Hence, \(u(g, h^*)\) is the real truth value \(tv(g)\) of \(g\) relative to the domain \(U\). It follows from (1) that the expected utility \(U(g\mid e)\) equals the posterior probability \(P(g\mid e)\) of \(g\) on \(e\). In this sense, we may say that posterior probability equals expected truth value. The rule of maximizing expected utility leads now to an extremely conservative policy: the best hypotheses \(g\) on \(e\) are those that satisfy \(P(g\mid e) = 1\), i.e., are completely certain on \(e\) (e.g. \(e\) itself, logical consequences of \(e\), and tautologies). On this account, if we are not certain of the truth, then it is always progressive to change an uncertain answer to a logically weaker one.

The argument against using high probability as a criterion of theory choice was made already by Popper in 1934 (see Popper 1959). He proposed that good theories should be bold or improbable. This idea has been made precise in the theory of semantic information.

Levi (1967) measures the information content \(I(g)\) of a partial answer \(g\) in \(D(B)\) by the number of complete answers it excludes. With a suitable normalization, \(I(g) = 1\) if and only if \(g\) is one of the complete answers \(h_{j}\) in \(B\), and \(I(g) = 0\) for a tautology. If we now choose \(u(g, h_{j}) = I(g)\), then \(U(g\mid e) = I(g)\), so that all the complete answers in B have the same maximal expected utility 1. This measure favors strong hypotheses, but it is unable to discriminate between the strongest ones. For example, the step from a false complete answer to the true one does not count as progress. Therefore, information cannot be the only relevant epistemic utility.

Another measure of information content is \(cont(g) = 1 - P(g)\) (Hintikka 1968). If we choose \(u(g, h_{j}) = cont(g)\), then the expected utility \(U(g\mid e) = 1 - P(g)\) is maximized by a contradiction, as the probability of a contradictory sentence is zero. Any false theory can be improved by adding new falsities to it. Again we see that information content alone does not give a good definition of scientific progress. The same remark can be made about explanatory and systematic power.

Levi’s (1967) proposal for epistemic utility is the weighted combination of the truth value \(tv(g)\) of \(g\) and the information content \(I(g)\) of \(g\):

\[\tag{2} aI(g) + (1 - a)tv(g), \]

where \(0 \lt a \lt \bfrac{1}{2}\) is an “index of boldness,” indicating how much the scientist is willing to risk error, or to “gamble with truth,” in her attempt to be relieved from agnosticism. The expected epistemic utility of \(g\) is then

\[\tag{3} aI(g) + (1 - a)P(g\mid e). \]

A comparative notion of progress ‘\(g_{1}\) is better than \(g_{2}\)’ could be defined by requiring that both \(I(g_{1}) \gt I(g_{2})\) and \(P(g_{1}\mid e) \gt P(g_{2}\mid e)\), but most hypotheses would be incomparable by this requirement. By using the weight \(a\), formula (3) expresses a balance between two mutually conflicting goals of inquiry. It has the virtue that all partial answers \(g\) in \(D(B)\) are comparable with each other: \(g\) is better than \(g'\) if and only if the value of (3) is larger for \(g\) than for \(g'\).

If epistemic utility is defined by information content cont(g) in a truth-dependent way, so that

\[ U(g,e) = \begin{cases} cont(g) \text{ if } g \text{ is true}\\ -cont(\neg g) \text{ if } g \text{ is false}, \end{cases} \]

(i,e., in accepting hypothesis \(g\), we gain the content of \(g\) if \(g\) is true, but we lose the content of the true hypothesis \(\neg g\) if \(g\) is false), then the expected utility \(U(g\mid e)\) is equal to

\[\tag{4} P(g\mid e) - P(g) \]

This measure combines the criteria of boldness (small prior probability \(P(g))\) and high posterior probability \(P(g\mid e)\). Similar results can be obtained if \(cont(g)\) is replaced by Hempel’s (1965) measure of systematic power \(syst(g, e) = P(\neg g\mid \neg e)\).

For Levi, the best hypothesis in \(D(B)\) is the complete true answer. But his utility assignment also makes assumptions that may seem problematic: all false hypotheses (even those that make a very small error) are worse than all truths (even the uninformative tautology); all false complete answers have the same utility (see, however, the modified definition in Levi, 1980); among false hypotheses utility covaries with logical strength (i.e. if \(h\) and \(h'\) are false and \(h\) entails \(h'\), then \(h\) has greater utility than \(h')\). These features are motivated by Levi’s project of using epistemic utility as a basis of acceptance rules. But if such utilities are used for ordering rival theories, then the theory of truthlikeness suggests other kinds of principles.

3.5 Truthlikeness

Popper’s notion of truthlikeness is also a combination of truth and information (Popper 1963, 1972). For him, verisimilitude represents the idea of “approaching comprehensive truth.” Popper’s explication used the cumulative idea that the more truthlike theory should have (in the sense of set-theoretical inclusion) more true consequences and less false consequences, but it turned out that this comparison is not applicable to pairs of false theories. An alternative method of defining verisimilitude, initiated in 1974 by Pavel Tichy and Risto Hilpinen, relies essentially on the concept of similarity.

In the similarity approach, as developed in Niiniluoto (1987), closeness to the truth is explicated “locally” by means of the distances of partial answers \(g\) in \(D(B)\) to the target \(h^*\) in a cognitive problem \(B\). For this purpose, we need a function \(d\) which expresses the distance \(d(h_{i}, h_{j}) =: d_{ij}\) between two arbitrary elements of \(B\). By normalization, we may choose \(0 \le d_{ij} \le 1\). The choice of \(d\) depends on the cognitive problem \(B\), and makes use of the metric structure of \(B\) (e.g., if \(B\) is a subspace of the real numbers \(\Re)\) or the syntactic similarity between the statements in \(B\). Then, for a partial answer \(g\), we let \(D_{\min}(h_{i}, g)\) be the minimum distance of the disjuncts in \(g\) from \(h_{i}\), and \(D_{\rmsum}(h_{i}, g)\) the normalized sum of the distances of the disjuncts of \(g\) from \(h_{i}\). Then \(D_{\min}(h_{i}, g)\) tells how close to \(h_{i}\) hypothesis \(g\) is, so that the degree of approximate truth of \(g\) (relative to the target \(h^*\)) is \(1 - D_{\min}(h^*, g)\). On the other hand, \(D_{\rmsum}(h_{i}, g)\) includes a penalty for all the mistakes that \(g\) allows relative to \(h_{i}\). The min-sum measure

\[\tag{5} D_{\rmms}(h_{i},g) = aD_{\min}(h_{i},g) + bD_{\rmsum}(h_{i},g), \]

where \(a \gt 0\) and \(b \gt 0\), and \((a + b)\le 1\), combines these two aspects. Then the degree of truthlikeness of \(g\) is

\[\tag{6} Tr(g, h^*) = 1 - D_{\rmms}(h^*, g). \]

Thus, parameter \(a\) indicates our cognitive interest in hitting close to the truth, and parameter \(b\) indicates our interest in excluding falsities that are distant from the truth. In many applications, choosing \(a\) to be equal to \(2b\) gives intuitively reasonable results.

If the distance function \(d\) on \(B\) is trivial, i.e., \(d_{ij} = 1\) if and only if \(i = j\), and otherwise 0, then \(Tr(g, h^*)\) reduces to the variant (2) of Levi’s definition of epistemic utility.

Obviously \(Tr(g, h^*)\) takes its maximum value 1 if and only if \(g\) is equivalent to \(h^*\). If \(g\) is a tautology, i.e., the disjunction of all elements \(h_{i}\) of \(B\), then \(Tr(g,h^*) = 1 - b\). If \(Tr(g, h^*) \lt 1 - b\), \(g\) is misleading in the strong sense that its cognitive value is smaller than that of complete ignorance.

Oddie (1986) has continued to favor the average function instead of the min-sum measure (cf. Oddie and Cevolani 2022). An alternative account of truth approximation is given by Kuipers (2019).

When \(h^*\) is unknown, the degree of truthlikeness (6) cannot be calculated. But the expected degree of verisimilitude of a partial answer \(g\) given evidence \(e\) is given by

\[\tag{7} ver(g\mid e) = \sum_{i=1}^n P(h_i \mid e) Tr(g, h_i) \]

If evidence \(e\) entails some \(h_{j}\) in \(B\), or makes \(h_{j}\) completely certain (i.e., \(P(h_{j}\mid e) = 1)\), then \(ver(g\mid e)\) reduces to \(Tr(g,h_{j})\). If all the complete answers \(h_{i}\) in \(B\) are equally probable on \(e\), then \(ver(h_{i}\mid e)\) is also constant for all \(h_{i}\).

The truthlikeness function \(Tr\) allows us to define an absolute concept of real progress:

  • (RP) Step from \(g\) to \(g'\) is progressive if and only if \(Tr(g, h^*) \lt Tr(g', h^*)\),

and the expected truthlikeness function \(ver\) gives the relative concept of estimated progress:

  • (EP) Step from \(g\) to \(g'\) seems progressive on evidence \(e\) if and only if \(ver(g\mid e) \lt ver(g'\mid e)\).

(Cf. Niiniluoto 1980.) According to definition RP, it is meaningful to say that one theory \(g'\) satisfies better the cognitive goal of answering problem \(B\) than another theory \(g\). This is an absolute standard of scientific progress in the sense of Section 2.5. Definition EP shows how claims of progress can be fallibly evaluated on the basis of evidence: if \(ver(g\mid e) \lt ver(g'\mid e)\), it is rational to claim on evidence \(e\) that the step from \(g\) to \(g'\) in fact is progressive. This claim may of course be mistaken, since estimation of progress is relative to two factors: the available evidence \(e\) and the probability measure \(P\) employed in the definition of \(ver\). Both evidence \(e\) and the epistemic probabilities \(P(h_{i}\mid e)\) may mislead us. In this sense, the problem of estimating verisimilitude is as difficult as the problem of induction.

Rowbottom (2015) argues against RP and EP that scientific progress is possible in the absence of increasing verisimilitude. He asks us to imagine that the scientists in a specific area of physics have found the maximally truthlike theory C*. Yet this general true theory could be used for further predictions and applications. This is indeed the case if we do not make the idealized assumption that the scientists know all the logical consequences of their theories. Then the predictions from C* constitute new cognitive problems. Moreover, in Rowbottom’s thought experiment further progress is possible by expanding the conceptual framework in order to consider as a target a deeper truth than C* (Niiniluoto 2017). A similar reply can be given to Dellsén (2023), who argues that Newton’s explanation of Kepler’s laws of planetary motions does not constitute progress on the truthlikeness account, since the theory and the laws were already accepted before the explanation: Newton was successful in solving the cognitive problem “Which theory would explain Kepler’s laws?”.

The measure of expected truthlikeness can be used for retrospective comparisons of past theories \(g\), if evidence \(e\) is taken to include our currently accepted theory \(T\), i.e., the truthlikeness of \(g\) is estimated by \(ver(g\mid e \amp T)\) (Niiniluoto 1984, 171). In the same spirit, Barrett (2008) has proposed that—assuming that science makes progress toward the truth through the elimination of descriptive error—the “probable approximate truth” of Newtonian gravitation can be warranted by its “nesting relations” to the General Theory of Relativity.

The definition of progress by RP can be contrasted with the model of belief revision (Gärdenfors 1988). The simplest case of revision is expansion: a theory \(T\) is conjoined by an input statement \(A\), so that the new theory is \(T \amp A\). According to the min-sum measure, if \(T\) and \(A\) are true, then the expansion \(T \amp A\) is at least as truthlike as \(T\). But if \(T\) is false and \(A\) is true, then \(T \amp A\) may be less truthlike than \(T\). For example, let the false theory \(T\) state that the number of planets is 9 or 20, and let \(A\) be the true sentence that this number is 8 or 20. Then \(T \amp A\) states that the number of planets is 20, but this is clearly less truthlike than \(T\) itself. Similar examples show that the AGM revision of a false theory by true input need not increase truthlikeness (Niiniluoto 2011).

3.6 Knowledge and Understanding

Bird (2007) has defended the epistemic definition of progress (accumulation of knowledge) against the semantic conception (accumulation of true beliefs or succession of theories with increasing verisimilitude) (see also Bird 2022, 2023). Here knowledge is not defined as justified true belief, but still it is taken to entail truth and justification, so that Bird’s epistemic view in fact returns to the old cumulative model of progress. According to Bird, an accidentally true or truthlike belief reached by irrational methods without any justification does not constitute progress. This kind of thought experiment may seem artificial, since there is always some sort of justification for any hypothetical theory which is accepted or at least seriously considered by the scientific community. But Bird’s argument raises the important question whether justification is merely instrumental for progress (Rowbottom 2008) or necessary for progress (Bird 2008). Another interesting question is whether the rejection of unfounded but accidentally true beliefs is regressive. The truthlikeness approach replies to these problems by distinguishing real progress RP and estimated progress EP: justification is not constitutive of progress in the sense of RP, but claims of real progress can be justified by appealing to expected verisimilitude (Cevolani and Tambolo 2013). On the other hand, the notion of progress explicated by EP (or by the combination of RP and EP) is relative to evidence and justification but at the same time non-cumulative.

Bird (2015) can reformulate his initial example by assuming that an accidentally true or truthlike theory \(H\) has been obtained by scientific but yet unreliable means, perhaps by derivation from an accepted theory which turns out to be false. Does such application of mistaken reasoning constitute progress? The interplay of RP and EP allows several possibilities here. Later evidence might show that the initial estimate \(ver(H\mid e)\) was too high. Or the Tr-value was in fact high but initially the ver-value was low (e.g. Aristarchus on heliocentric system, Wegener on continental drift) and only later it was increased by new evidence.

Most accounts of truthlikeness satisfy the principle that among true theories truthlikeness covaries with logical strength (for an exception, see Oddie 1986). So accumulation of knowledge is a special case of increasing verisimilitude, but it does not cover the case of progress by successive false theories. In his attempt to rehabilitate the cumulative knowledge model of scientific progress, Bird admits that there are historical sequences of theories none of which are “fully true” (e.g. Ptolemy—Copernicus—Kepler or Galileo—Newton—Einstein). As knowledge entails truth, Bird tries to save his epistemic account by reformulating past false theories as true ones. He proposes that if \(g\) is approximately true, then the proposition “approximately \(g\)” is true, so that “the improving precision of approximations can be an object of knowledge”. One problem with this treatment is that scientists typically formulate their theories as exact statements, and at the time of their proposal it is not known how large margins of errors would be needed to transform them into true theories. With reference to Barrett (2008), Saatsi (2019) argues that the approximate truth of Newtonian mechanics can be assessed only from the vantage point of General Theory of Relativity, so that this knowledge was not epistemically accessible to Newton at his time. Further, many past theories were radically false rather than approximately true or truthlike, but still they could be improved by more truthlike successors. Ptolemy’s geocentric theory was rejected in the Copernican revolution, not retained in the form “approximately Ptolemy”. Indeed, the progressive steps from Ptolemy to Copernicus or from Newton to Einstein are not only matters of improved precision but involve changes in theoretical postulates and laws. A further problem for Bird’s proposal is the question whether his approximation propositions are able to distinguish between progress and regress in science (Niiniluoto 2014).

Dellsén (2016, 2018b) has formulated the noetic account of scientific progress as increasing understanding. Using objectual understanding instead of understanding-why, he characterizes understanding in terms of “grasping how to correctly explain and predict aspects of a given target”. Against Bird (2007), who takes understanding to be a species of knowledge of causes, Dellsén argues that understanding does not require the scientists to have justification for, or even belief in, the explanations or predictions they propose. Still, understanding is a matter of degree. Thus, there are increases in scientific understanding without accumulation of scientific knowledge (e.g. Einstein’s explanation of Brownian motion in terms of the kinetic theory of heat) and accumulation of scientific knowledge without increases in understanding (e.g. knowledge about random experimental outcomes or spurious statistical correlations). The latter thesis is easy to accept, especially if explanation needs laws, but on the other hand the epistemic and truthlikeness approaches could agree against Dellsénthat the collection of new important data may constitute scientific progress; Bird’s (2023) example is the activity of cataloguing stars. The possibility of “quasi-factive” understanding by means of idealized theories (a common feature with the verisimilitudinarian approach) is taken to be an advantage of the noetic account. Park (2017) has challenged Dellsén’s conclusions against the epistemic definition. He argues that scientific understanding involves beliefs that the explained phenomena are real and the confirmed predictions are true. He also argues that Wegener’s continental drift theory, which was not supported by available evidence, was progressive, since it paved the way for the later theory of plate tectonics in the 1960s. Dellsén (2018a) questions Park’s arguments by rejecting the “means-end thesis”, i.e., one should make the crucial distinction between cognitive and non-cognitive scientific progress and likewise distinguish episodes that constitute and promote scientific progress.

Dellsén (2023) has restated his noetic account by characterizing understanding in terms of dependency relations (causation, constitution, and grounding). The requirement that a grasped dependency model should be sufficiently accurate and comprehensive brings his account close to the Popperian notion of truthlikeness as a combination of truth and information (cf. Section 3.5). Bird (2023) objects that the discovery of X-rays in 1895 did not involve dependency relations. Dellsén’s (2023) additional proposal to analyze understanding among those for whom scientific progress is made, instead of those by whom progress is achieved, is problematic, since the transmission of public scientific information to non-scientists (such as students, engineers, medical professionals, and policy-makers) is an important consequence of inquiry without constituting cognitive scientific progress.

The lively debate about four current accounts of scientific progress is continued in Shan (2023): epistemic (Bird), semantic (Niiniluoto), functional (Shan), and noetic (Dellsén) (see also Rowbottom 2023).

4. Is Science Progressive?

In Section 3.5., we made a distinction between real and estimated progress in terms of the truthlikeness measures. A similar distinction can be made in connection with measures of empirical success. For example, one may distinguish two notions of the problem-solving ability of a theory: the number of problems solved so far, and the number of solvable problems. Real progress could be defined by the latter, while the former gives us an estimate of progress.

The scientific realist may continue this line of thought by arguing that all measures of empirical success in fact are at best indicators of real cognitive progress, measured in terms of truth or truthlikeness. For example, if \(T\) explains \(e\), then it can be shown that \(e\) also confirms \(T\), or increases the probability of \(T\) (Niiniluoto 1999b). A similar reasoning can be employed to give the so-called “ultimate argument” or “no miracle argument” for scientific realism: theoretical realism is the only assumption that does not make the empirical success of science a miracle (Putnam, 1978; Psillos 1999; Alai 2014; Niiniluoto 2017; Kuipers 2019; cf. criticism in Laudan 1984b). This means that the best explanation of the empirical progress of science is the hypothesis that science is also progressive on the level of theories.

The thesis that science is progressive is an overall claim about scientific activities. It does not imply that each particular step in science has in fact been progressive: individual scientists make mistakes, and even the scientific community is fallible in its collective judgments. For this reason, we should not propose such a definition that the thesis about the progressive nature of science becomes a tautology or an analytic truth. This undesirable consequence follows if we define truth as the limit of scientific inquiry (this is sometimes called the consensus theory of truth), as then it is a mere tautology that the limit of scientific research is the truth (Laudan 1984a). But this “trivialization of the self-corrective thesis” cannot be attributed to Peirce who realized that truth and the limit of inquiry coincide at best with probability one (Niiniluoto 1980). The notion of truthlikeness allows us to make sense of the claim that science converges towards the truth. But the characterization of progress as increasing truthlikeness, given in Section 3.5, does not presuppose “teleological metaphysics” (Stegmüller 1976), “convergent realism” (Laudan 1984), or “scientific eschatology” (Moulines 2000), as it does not rely on any assumption about the future behavior of science.

The claim about scientific progress can still be questioned by the theses that observations and ontologies are relative to theories. If this is true, the comparison of rival theories appears to be impossible on cognitive or rational grounds. Kuhn (1962) compared paradigm-changes to Gestalt switches (Dilworth 1981). Feyerabend (1984) concluded from his methodological anarchism that the development of science and art resemble each other.

Hanson, Popper, Kuhn, and Feyerabend agreed that all observation is theory-laden, so that there is no theory-neutral observational language. Accounts of reduction and progress, which take for granted the preservation of some observational statements within theory-change, thus run into troubles. Even though Laudan’s account of progress allows Kuhn-losses, it can be argued that the comparison of the problem-solving capacity of two rival theories presupposes some kind of correlation or translation between the statements of these theories (Pearce 1987). Various replies have been proposed to this issue. One is the movement from language to structures (Stegmüller 1976; Moulines 2000), but it turns out that a reduction on the level structures already guarantees commensurability, since it induces a translation between conceptual frameworks (Pearce 1987). Another has been the point that an evidence statement \(e\) may happen to be neutral with respect to rival theories \(T_{1}\) and \(T_{2}\), even though it is laden with some other theories. The realist may also point that the theory-ladenness of observations concerns at most the estimation of progress (EP), but the definition of real progress (RP) as increasing truthlikeness does not mention the notion of observation at all.

Even though Popper accepted the theory-ladenness of observations, he rejected the more general thesis about incommensurability as “the myth of the framework” (Lakatos and Musgrave 1970). Popper insisted that the growth of knowledge is always revolutionary in the sense that the new theory contradicts the old one by correcting it, but there is still continuity in theory-change, as the new theory should explain why the old theory was successful to some extent. Feyerabend tried to claim that successive theories are both inconsistent and incommensurable with each other, but this combination makes little sense. Kuhn argued against the possibility of finding complete translations between the languages of rival theories, but in his later work he admitted the possibility that a scientist may learn different theoretical languages (Hoyningen-Huene 1993). Kuhn kept insisting that there is “no theory-independent way to reconstruct phrases like ‘really there’,” i.e., each theory has its own ontology. Convergence to the truth seems to be impossible, if ontologies change with theories. The same idea has been formulated by Putnam (1978) and Laudan (1984a) in the so-called “pessimistic meta-induction”: as many past theories in science have turned out to be non-referring, there is all reason to expect that even the future theories fail to refer—and thus also fail to be approximately true or truthlike. But the optimistic reply by comparative realists points out that for all rejected theories in Laudan’s list the scientists have been able to find a better, more truthlike alternative (Niiniluoto 2017; Kuipers 2019).

The difficulties for realism seem to be reinforced by the observation that measures of truthlikeness are relative to languages. The choice of conceptual frameworks cannot be decided by means of the notion of truthlikeness, but needs additional criteria. In defense of the truthlikeness approach, one may point to the fact that the comparison of two theories is relevant only in those cases where they are considered (perhaps via a suitable translation) as rival answers to the same cognitive problem. It is interesting to compare Newton’s and Einstein’s theories for their truthlikeness, but not Newton’s and Darwin’s theories. When definitions RP and EP are applied to rival theories in different languages, they have to be translated into a common conceptual framework.

Another line is to appeal to theories of reference in order to show that rival theories can after all be regarded as speaking about the same entities (Psillos 1999). For example, Thompson, Bohr, and later physicists are talking about the same electrons, even though their theories of the electron differ from each other. This is not possible on the standard descriptive theory of reference: a theory \(T\) can only refer to entities about which it gives a true description. Kuhn’s and Feyerabend’s meaning holism, with devastating consequences for realism, presupposes this account of reference. A similar argument is used by Moulines (2000), who denies that progress could be understood as “knowing more about the same,” but his own structuralist reconstruction of progress with “partial incommensurability” assumes that rival theories share some intended applications. Causal theories of reference allow that reference is preserved even within changes of theories (Kitcher 1993). The same result is obtained if the descriptive account is modified by introducing a Principle of Charity (Putnam 1975; Smith 1981; Niiniluoto 1999a): a theory refers to those entities about which it gives the most truthlike description. An alternative account, illustrated by the relation of phlogiston theory and oxygen theory, is given by Schurz (2011) by his notion of structural correspondence. This makes it possible that even false theories are referring. Moreover, there can be reference invariance between two successive theories, even though both of them are false; progress means then that the latter theory gives a more truthlike description about their common domain than the old theory.

A radically different account of scientific change emerges from Chang’s (2022) pluralist ontology. Inspired by classical pragmatists, he advocates a charitable definition of reality and truth in terms of “operational coherence”. For example, phlogiston had some succesful applications, so it has some reality, and likewise for oxygen. More generally, Chang defends “conservationist pluralim”: scientists do not tend to discard useful theories from the past, so that scientific progress is largely cumulative. This return to the cumulative model of progress resembles the surprising position that Feyerabend reached from his methodological anarchism without Popperian falsification: “knowledge … is not a gradual approach to the truth. It is rather an ever increasing ocean of mutually incompatible (and perhaps even incommensurable) alternatives … Nothing is ever settled, no view can ever be omitted from the comprehensive account” (Feyerabend 1975 [1993], 21).

Finally, Rowbottom (2023) has advanced meta-normative relativism to challenge claims about scientific progress: inspired by J. L. Mackie’s error-theory in meta-ethics, he argues against the assumption that there are objective or privileged intersubjective aims of science (cf. Section 2.2). Rowbottom allows that individual scientists and groups may have cognitive aims, but doubts attempts to analyze aims on the collective level. His thesis that standards of good science are “ultimately subjective” is in conflict with the fact that science is a social institution, so that the members of the scientific community are jointly committed to methods and values which also characterize standards of scientific progress (Niiniluoto 2020).


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