The Early Development of Set Theory

First published Tue Apr 10, 2007; substantive revision Thu Jun 18, 2020

Set theory is one of the greatest achievements of modern mathematics. Basically all mathematical concepts, methods, and results admit of representation within axiomatic set theory. Thus set theory has served quite a unique role by systematizing modern mathematics, and approaching in a unified form all basic questions about admissible mathematical arguments—including the thorny question of existence principles. This entry covers in outline the convoluted process by which set theory came into being, covering roughly the years 1850 to 1930.

In 1910, Hilbert wrote that set theory is

that mathematical discipline which today occupies an outstanding role in our science, and radiates [ausströmt] its powerful influence into all branches of mathematics. [Hilbert 1910, 466; translation by entry author]

This already suggests that, in order to discuss the early history, it is necessary to distinguish two aspects of set theory: its role as a fundamental language and repository of the basic principles of modern mathematics; and its role as an independent branch of mathematics, classified (today) as a branch of mathematical logic. Both aspects are considered here.

The first section examines the origins and emergence of set theoretic mathematics around 1870; this is followed by a discussion of the period of expansion and consolidation of the theory up to 1900. Section 3 provides a look at the critical period in the decades 1897 to 1918, and Section 4 deals with the time from Zermelo to Gödel (from theory to metatheory), with special attention to the often overlooked, but crucial, descriptive set theory.

1. Emergence

The concept of a set appears deceivingly simple, at least to the trained mathematician, and to such an extent that it becomes difficult to judge and appreciate correctly the contributions of the pioneers. What cost them much effort to produce, and took the mathematical community considerable time to accept, may seem to us rather self-explanatory or even trivial. Three historical misconceptions that are widespread in the literature should be noted at the outset:

  1. It is not the case that actual infinity was universally rejected before Cantor.
  2. Set-theoretic views did not arise exclusively from analysis, but emerged also in algebra, number theory, and geometry.
  3. In fact, the rise of set-theoretic mathematics preceded Cantor’s crucial contributions.

All of these points shall become clear in what follows.

The notion of a collection is as old as counting, and logical ideas about classes have existed since at least the “tree of Porphyry” (3rd century CE). Thus it becomes difficult to sort out the origins of the concept of set. But sets are neither collections in the everyday sense of this word, nor “classes” in the sense of logicians before the mid-19th century. The key missing element is objecthood — a set is a mathematical object, to be operated upon just like any other object (the set \(\mathbf{N}\) is as much ‘a thing’ as number 3). To clarify this point, Russell employed the useful distinction between a class-as-many (this is the traditional idea) and a class-as-one (or set).

Ernst Zermelo, a crucial figure in our story, said that the theory had historically been “created by Cantor and Dedekind” [Zermelo 1908, 262]. This suggests a good pragmatic criterion: one should start from authors who have significantly influenced the conceptions of Cantor, Dedekind, and Zermelo. For the most part, this is the criterion adopted here. Nevertheless, as every rule calls for an exception, the case of Bolzano is important and instructive, even though Bolzano did not significantly influence later writers.

In 19th century German-speaking areas, there were some intellectual tendencies that promoted the acceptance of the actual infinite (e.g., a revival of Leibniz’s thought). In spite of Gauss’s warning that the infinite can only be a manner of speaking, some minor figures and three major ones (Bolzano, Riemann, Dedekind) preceded Cantor in fully accepting the actual infinite in mathematics. Those three authors were active in promoting a set-theoretic formulation of mathematical ideas, with Dedekind’s contribution in a good number of classic writings (1871, 1872, 1876/77, 1888) being of central importance.

Chronologically, Bernard Bolzano was the first, but he exerted almost no influence. The high quality of his work in logic and the foundations of mathematics is well known. A book entitled Paradoxien des Unendlichen was posthumously published in 1851. Here Bolzano argued in detail that a host of paradoxes surrounding infinity are logically harmless, and mounted a forceful defence of actual infinity. He proposed an interesting argument attempting to prove the existence of infinite sets, which bears comparison with Dedekind’s later argument (1888). Although he employed complicated distinctions of different kinds of sets or classes, Bolzano recognized clearly the possibility of putting two infinite sets in one-to-one correspondence, as one can easily do, e.g., with the intervals \([0, 5]\) and \([0, 12]\) by the function \(5y = 12x\). However, Bolzano resisted the conclusion that both sets are “equal with respect to the multiplicity of their parts” [1851, 30–31]. In all likelihood, traditional ideas of measurement were still too powerful in his way of thinking, and thus he missed the discovery of the concept of cardinality (however, one may consider Non-Cantorian ideas, on which see Mancosu 2009).

The case of Bolzano suggests that a liberation from metric concepts (which came with the development of theories of projective geometry and especially of topology) was to have a crucial role in making possible the abstract viewpoint of set theory. Bernhard Riemann proposed visionary ideas about topology, and about basing all of mathematics on the notion of set or “manifold” in the sense of class (Mannigfaltigkeit), in his celebrated inaugural lecture “On the Hypotheses which lie at the Foundations of Geometry” (1854/1868a). Also characteristic of Riemann was a great emphasis on conceptual mathematics, particularly visible in his approach to complex analysis (which again went deep into topology). To give but the simplest example, Riemann was an enthusiastic follower of Dirichlet’s idea that a function has to be conceived as an arbitrary correspondence between numerical values, be it representable by a formula or not; this meant leaving behind the times when a function was defined to be an analytic expression. Through this new style of mathematics, and through his vision of a new role for sets and a full program for developing topology, Riemann was a crucial influence on both Dedekind and Cantor (see Ferreirós 1999).

The five-year period 1868–1872 saw a mushrooming of set-theoretic proposals in Germany, so much so that we could regard it as the birth of set-theoretic mathematics. Riemann’s geometry lecture, delivered in 1854, was published by Dedekind in 1868, jointly with Riemann’s paper on trigonometric series (1854/1868b, which presented the Riemann integral). The latter was the starting point for deep work in real analysis, commencing the study of “seriously” discontinuous functions. The young Georg Cantor entered into this area, which led him to the study of point-sets. In 1872 Cantor introduced an operation upon point sets (see below) and soon he was ruminating about the possibility to iterate that operation to infinity and beyond: it was the first glimpse of the transfinite realm.

Meanwhile, another major development had been put forward by Richard Dedekind in 1871. In the context of his work on algebraic number theory, Dedekind introduced an essentially set-theoretic viewpoint, defining fields and ideals of algebraic numbers. These ideas were presented in a very mature form, making use of set operations and of structure-preserving mappings (see a relevant passage in Ferreirós 1999: 92–93; Cantor employed Dedekind’s terminology for the operations in his own work on set theory around 1880 [1999: 204]). Considering the ring of integers in a given field of algebraic numbers, Dedekind defined certain subsets called “ideals” and operated on these sets as new objects. This procedure was the key to his general approach to the topic. In other works, he dealt very clearly and precisely with equivalence relations, partition sets, homomorphisms, and automorphisms (on the history of equivalence relations, see Asghari ‎2018). Thus, many of the usual set-theoretic procedures of twentieth-century mathematics go back to his work. Several years later (in 1888), Dedekind would publish a presentation of the basic elements of set theory, making only a bit more explicit the operations on sets and mappings he had been using since 1871.

The following year, Dedekind published a paper [1872] in which he provided an axiomatic analysis of the structure of the set \(\mathbf{R}\) of real numbers. He defined it as an ordered field that is also complete (in the sense that all Dedekind-cuts on \(\mathbf{R}\) correspond to an element in \(\mathbf{R}\)); completeness in that sense has the Archimedean axiom as a consequence. Cantor too provided a definition of \(\mathbf{R}\) in 1872, employing Cauchy sequences of rational numbers, which was an elegant simplification of the definition offered by Carl Weierstrass in his lectures. The form of completeness axiom that Weierstrass preferred was Bolzano’s principle that a sequence of nested closed intervals in \(\mathbf{R}\) (a sequence such that \([a_{m+1},b_{m+1}] \subset [a_{m},b_{m}]\)) “contains” at least one real number (or, as we would say, has a non-empty intersection).

The Cantor and Dedekind definitions of the real numbers relied implicitly on set theory, and can be seen in retrospect to involve the assumption of a Power Set principle. Both took as given the set of rational numbers, and for the definition of \(\mathbf{R}\) they relied on a certain totality of infinite sets of rational numbers (either the totality of Cauchy sequences, or of all Dedekind cuts). With this, too, constructivistic criticism of set theory began to emerge, as Leopold Kronecker started to make objections to such infinitary procedures. Simultaneously, there began a study of the topology of \(\mathbf{R}\), in particular in the work of Weierstrass, Dedekind, and Cantor. The set-theoretic approach was also exploited by several authors in the fields of real analysis and complex analysis (e.g., Hankel, du Bois-Reymond, H.J.S. Smith, U. Dini) and by Dedekind in joint work with Weber (1882), pioneering algebraic geometry.

Cantor’s derived sets are of particular interest (for the context of this idea in real analysis, see e.g., Dauben 1979, Hallett 1984, Lavine 1994, Kanamori 1996, Ferreirós 1999). Cantor took as given the “conceptual sphere” of the real numbers, and he considered arbitrary subsets \(P\), which he called ‘point sets’. A real number \(r\) is called a limit point of \(P\), when all neighbourhoods of \(r\) contain points of \(P\). This can only happen if \(P\) is infinite. With that concept, due to Weierstrass, Cantor went on to define the derived set \(P'\) of \(P\), as the set of all the limit points of \(P\). In general \(P'\) may be infinite and have its own limit points (see Cantor’s paper in Ewald [1996, vol. 2, 840ff], esp. p. 848). Thus one can iterate the operation and obtain further derived sets \(P''\), \(P'''\)… \(P^{(n)}\) … It is easy to give examples of a set \(P\) that will give rise to non-empty derived sets \(P^{(n)}\) for all finite \(n\). (A rather trivial example is \(P = \mathbf{Q}_{[0,1]}\), the set of rational numbers in the unit interval; in this case \(P' = [0,1] = P''\).) Thus one can define \(P^{(\infty)}\) as the intersection of all \(P^{(n)}\) for finite \(n\). This was Cantor’s first encounter with transfinite iterations.

Then, in late 1873, came a surprising discovery that fully opened the realm of the transfinite. In correspondence with Dedekind (see Ewald 1996, vol. 2), Cantor asked the question whether the infinite sets \(\mathbf{N}\) of the natural numbers and \(\mathbf{R}\) of real numbers can be placed in one-to-one correspondence. In reply, Dedekind offered a surprising proof that the set \(A\) of all algebraic numbers is denumerable (i.e., there is a one-to-one correspondence with \(\mathbf{N}\)). A few days later, Cantor was able to prove that the assumption that \(\mathbf{R}\) is denumerable leads to a contradiction. To this end, he employed the Bolzano-Weierstrass principle of completeness mentioned above. Thus he had shown that there are more elements in \(\mathbf{R}\) than in \(\mathbf{N}\) or \(\mathbf{Q}\) or \(A\), in the precise sense that the cardinality of \(\mathbf{R}\) is strictly greater than that of \(\mathbf{N}\).

2. Consolidation

Set theory was beginning to become an essential ingredient of the new “modern” approach to mathematics. But this viewpoint was contested, and its consolidation took a rather long time. Dedekind’s algebraic style only began to find followers in the 1890s; David Hilbert was among them. The soil was better prepared for the modern theories of real functions: Italian, German, French and British mathematicians contributed during the 1880s. And the new foundational views were taken up by Peano and his followers, by Frege to some extent, by Hilbert in the 1890s, and later by Russell.

Meanwhile, Cantor spent the years 1878 to 1885 publishing key works that helped turn set theory into an autonomous branch of mathematics. Let’s write \(A \equiv B\) in order to express that the two sets \(A\), \(B\) can be put in one-to-one correspondence (have the same cardinality). After proving that the irrational numbers can be put in one-to-one correspondence with \(\mathbf{R}\), and, surprisingly, that also \(\mathbf{R}^{n} \equiv \mathbf{R}\), Cantor conjectured in 1878 that any subset of \(\mathbf{R}\) would be either denumerable \((\equiv \mathbf{N})\) or \(\equiv \mathbf{R}\). This is the first and weakest form of the celebrated Continuum Hypothesis. During the following years, Cantor explored the world of point sets, introducing several important topological ideas (e.g., perfect set, closed set, isolated set), and arrived at results such as the Cantor-Bendixson theorem.

A point set \(P\) is closed iff its derived set \(P' \subseteq P\), and perfect iff \(P = P'\). The Cantor-Bendixson theorem then states that a closed point set can be decomposed into two subsets \(R\) and \(S\), such that \(R\) is denumerable and \(S\) is perfect (indeed, \(S\) is the \(a\)th derived set of \(P\), for a countable ordinal \(a\)). Because of this, closed sets are said to have the perfect set property. Furthermore, Cantor was able to prove that perfect sets have the power of the continuum (1884). Both results implied that the Continuum Hypothesis is valid for all closed point sets. Many years later, in 1916, Pavel Aleksandrov and Felix Hausdorff were able to show that the broader class of Borel sets have the perfect set property too.

His work on points sets led Cantor, in 1882, to conceive of the transfinite numbers (see Ferreirós 1999: 267ff). This was a turning point in his research, for from then onward he studied abstract set theory independently of more specific questions having to do with point sets and their topology (until the mid-1880s, these questions had been prominent in his agenda). Subsequently, Cantor focused on the transfinite cardinal and ordinal numbers, and on general order types, independently of the topological properties of \(\mathbf{R}\).

The transfinite ordinals were introduced as new numbers in an important mathematico-philosophical paper of 1883, Grundlagen einer allgemeinen Mannigfaltigkeitslehre (notice that Cantor still uses Riemann’s term Mannigfaltigkeit or ‘manifold’ to denote sets). Cantor defined them by means of two “generating principles”: the first (1) yields the successor \(a+1\) for any given number \(a\), while the second (2) stipulates that there is a number \(b\) which follows immediately after any given sequence of numbers without a last element. Thus, after all the finite numbers comes, by (2), the first transfinite number, \(\omega\) (read: omega); and this is followed by \(\omega+1\), \(\omega+2\), …, \(\omega+\omega = \omega \cdot 2\), …, \(\omega \cdot n\), \(\omega\cdot n +1\), …, \(\omega^{2}\), \(\omega^{2}+1\), …, \(\omega^{\omega}\), … and so on and on. Whenever a sequence without last element appears, one can go on and, so to say, jump to a higher stage by (2).

The introduction of these new numbers seemed like idle speculation to most of his contemporaries, but for Cantor they served two very important functions. To this end, he classified the transfinite ordinals as follows: the “first number class” consisted of the finite ordinals, the set \(\mathbf{N}\) of natural numbers; the “second number class” was formed by ω and all numbers following it (including \(\omega^{\omega}\), and many more) that have only a denumerable set of predecessors. This crucial condition was suggested by the problem of proving the Cantor-Bendixson theorem (see Ferreirós 1995). On that basis, Cantor could establish the results that the cardinality of the “second number class” is greater than that of \(\mathbf{N}\); and that no intermediate cardinality exists. Thus, if you write \(\textit{card}(\mathbf{N}) = \aleph_{0}\) (read: aleph zero), his theorems justified calling the cardinality of the “second number class” \(\aleph_{1}\).

After the second number class comes a “third number class” (all transfinite ordinals whose set of predecessors has cardinality \(\aleph_{1}\)); the cardinality of this new number class can be proved to be \(\aleph_{2}\). And so on. The first function of the transfinite ordinals was, thus, to establish a well-defined scale of increasing transfinite cardinalities. (The aleph notation used above was introduced by Cantor only in 1895.) This made it possible to formulate much more precisely the problem of the continuum; Cantor’s conjecture became the hypothesis that \(\textit{card}(\mathbf{R}) = \aleph_{1}\). Furthermore, relying on the transfinite ordinals, Cantor was able to prove the Cantor-Bendixson theorem, rounding out the results on point sets that he had been elaborating during these crucial years. The Cantor-Bendixson theorem states: closed sets of \(\mathbf{R}^n\) (generalizable to Polish spaces) have the perfect set property, so that any closed set \(S\) in \(\mathbf{R}^n\) can be written uniquely as the disjoint union of a perfect set \(P\) and a countable set \(R\). Moreover, \(P\) is \(S^α\) for α countable ordinal.

The study of the transfinite ordinals directed Cantor’s attention towards ordered sets, and in particular well-ordered sets. A set \(S\) is well-ordered by a relation < iff < is a total order and every subset of \(S\) has a least element in the <-ordering. (The real numbers are not well-ordered in their usual order: just consider an open interval. Meanwhile, \(\mathbf{N}\) is the simplest infinite well-ordered set.) Cantor argued that the transfinite ordinals truly deserve the name of numbers, because they express the “type of order” of any possible well-ordered set. Notice also that it was easy for Cantor to indicate how to reorder the natural numbers so as to make them correspond to the order types \(\omega+1\), \(\omega+2\), …, \(\omega \cdot 2\), …, \(\omega \cdot n\), …, \(\omega^2\), …, \(\omega^{\omega}\), … and so on. (For instance, reordering \(\mathbf{N}\) in the form: 2, 4, 6, …, 5, 15, 25, 35, …, 1, 3, 7, 9, … we obtain a set that has order type \(\omega\cdot 3\).)

Notice too that the Continuum Hypothesis, if true, would entail that the set \(\mathbf{R}\) of real numbers can indeed be well-ordered. Cantor was so committed to this viewpoint, that he presented the further hypothesis that every set can be well-ordered as “a fundamental and momentous law of thought”. Some years later, Hilbert called attention to both the Continuum Hypothesis and the well-ordering problem as Problem 1 in his celebrated list of ‘Mathematische Probleme’ (1900). Doing so was an intelligent way of emphasizing the importance of set theory for the future of mathematics, and the fruitfulness of its new methods and problems.

In 1895 and 1897, Cantor published his last two articles. They were a well-organized presentation of his results on the transfinite numbers (cardinals and ordinals) and their theory, and also on order types and well-ordered sets. However, these papers did not advance significant new ideas. Unfortunately, Cantor had doubts about a third part he had prepared, which would have discussed very important issues having to do with the problem of well-ordering and the paradoxes (see below). Surprisingly, Cantor also failed to include in the 1895/97 papers a theorem which he had published some years before which is known simply as Cantor’s Theorem: given any set \(S\), there exists another set whose cardinality is greater (this is the power set \(\mathcal{P}(S)\), as we now say—Cantor used instead the set of all functions of the form \(f\): \(S \rightarrow \{0, 1\}\), which is equivalent). In the same short paper (1892), Cantor presented his famous proof that \(\mathbf{R}\) is non-denumerable by the method of diagonalisation, a method which he then extended to prove Cantor’s Theorem. (A related form of argument had appeared earlier in the work of P. du Bois-Reymond [1875], see among others [Wang 1974, 570] and [Borel 1898], Note II.)

Meanwhile, other authors were exploring the possibilities opened by set theory for the foundations of mathematics. Most important was Dedekind’s contribution (1888) with a deep presentation of the theory of the natural numbers. He formulated some basic principles of set (and mapping) theory; gave axioms for the natural number system; proved that mathematical induction is conclusive and recursive definitions are flawless; developed the basic theory of arithmetic; introduced the finite cardinals; and proved that his axiom system is categorical. His system had four axioms. Given a function φ defined on \(S\), a set \(N \subseteq S\), and a distinguished element \(1 \in N\), they are as follows:

\[ \begin{align} \tag{α} & \phi(N) \subset N\\ \tag{β} & N = \phi_{o}\{1\}\\ \tag{γ} & 1 \not\in \phi(N)\\ \tag{δ} & \textrm{the function } \phi \textrm{ is injective.} \end{align} \]

Condition (β) is crucial since it ensures minimality for the set of natural numbers, which accounts for the validity of proofs by mathematical induction. \(N = \phi_{o}\{1\}\) is read: \(N\) is the chain of singleton {1} under the function φ, that is, the minimal closure of {1} under the function φ. In general, one considers the chain of a set \(A\) under an arbitrary mapping γ, denoted by \(\gamma_{o}(A)\); in his booklet Dedekind developed an interesting theory of such chains, which allowed him to prove the Cantor-Bernstein theorem. The theory was later generalized by Zermelo and applied by Skolem, Kuratowski, etc.

In the following years, Giuseppe Peano gave a more superficial (but also more famous) treatment of the natural numbers, employing the new symbolic language of logic, and Gottlob Frege elaborated his own ideas, which however fell prey to the paradoxes. An important book inspired by the set-theoretic style of thinking was Hilbert’s Grundlagen der Geometrie (1899), which took the “mathematics of axioms” one step beyond Dedekind through a rich study of geometric systems motivated by questions concerning the independence of his axioms. Hilbert’s book made clear the new axiomatic methodology that had been shaping up in connection with the novel methods of set theory, and he combined it with the axiomatic trends coming from projective geometry.

Nevertheless, as we said before, there was quite a lot of criticism of set-theoretic, infinitarian methods. As early as 1870, Kronecker had begun to voice critical remarks of a constructivist bent that, many years later, would be echoed by prominent thinkers like Brouwer or Wittgenstein. Kronecker’s critical orientation pointed in the way of renouncing the real number system and classical analysis, in favor of some more stringent form of analysis — twentieth century examples of this would be predicative analysis (H. Weyl building on basic notions of Poincaré, see Feferman 1988) and intuitionistic analysis (Brouwer). Even Weierstrass had objections (in 1874, at least) against the idea of distinguishing sizes of infinity, and that on the face of Cantor’s proofs. Examples abound, and so during the 1900s many mathematicians expressed doubts about key ideas and methods of set theory. A prototype case is E. Borel, who after introducing the ideas of Cantor in France [1898], became increasingly suspicious of set theory (the five letters exchanged by him and Baire, Lebesgue, Hadamard in 1905 have become famous; see Ewald [1996, vol. 2]). But there are also the cases of Poincaré, Weyl, Skolem, and so on. Among philosophers, the most prominent example is Wittgenstein, who condemned set theory for building on the "nonsense" of fictitious symbolism, suggesting “wrong imagery”, and so on.

3. Critical Period

In the late nineteenth century, it was a widespread idea that pure mathematics is nothing but an elaborate form of arithmetic. Thus it was usual to talk about the “arithmetisation” of mathematics, and how it had brought about the highest standards of rigor. With Dedekind and Hilbert, this viewpoint led to the idea of grounding all of pure mathematics in set theory. The most difficult steps in bringing forth this viewpoint had been the establishment of a theory of the real numbers, and a set-theoretic reduction of the natural numbers. Both problems had been solved by the work of Cantor and Dedekind. But precisely when mathematicians were celebrating that “full rigor” had been finally attained, serious problems emerged for the foundations of set theory. First Cantor, and then Russell, discovered the paradoxes in set theory.

Cantor was led to the paradoxes by having introduced the “conceptual sphere” of the transfinite numbers. Each transfinite ordinal is the order type of the set of its predecessors; e.g., ω is the order type of \(\{0, 1, 2, 3, \ldots\}\), and \(\omega+2\) is the order type of \(\{0, 1, 2, 3, \ldots, \omega, \omega +1\}\). Thus, to each initial segment of the series of ordinals, there corresponds an immediately greater ordinal. Now, the “whole series” of all transfinite ordinals would form a well-ordered set, and to it there would correspond a new ordinal number. This is unacceptable, for this ordinal \(o\) would have to be greater than all members of the “whole series”, and in particular \(o < o\). This is usually called the Burali-Forti paradox, or paradox of the ordinals (although Burali-Forti himself failed to formulate it clearly, see Moore & Garciadiego 1981).

Although it is conceivable that Cantor might have found that paradox as early as 1883, immediately after introducing the transfinite ordinals (for arguments in favour of this idea see Purkert & Ilgauds 1987 and Tait 2000), the evidence indicates clearly that it was not until 1896/97 that he found this paradoxical argument and realized its implications. By this time, he was also able to employ Cantor’s Theorem to yield the Cantor paradox, or paradox of the alephs: if there existed a “set of all” cardinal numbers (alephs), Cantor’s Theorem applied to it would give a new aleph \(\aleph\), such that \(\aleph < \aleph\). The great set theorist realized perfectly well that these paradoxes were a fatal blow to the “logical” approaches to sets favoured by Frege and Dedekind. Cantor emphasized that his views were “in diametrical opposition” to Dedekind’s, and in particular to his “naïve assumption that all well-defined collections, or systems, are also ‘consistent systems’ ” (see the letter to Hilbert, Nov. 15, 1899, in Purkert & Ilgauds 1987: 154). (Contrary to what has often been claimed, Cantor’s ambiguous definition of set in his paper of 1895 was intended to be “diametrically opposite” to the logicists’ understanding of sets—often called “naïve” set theory, which could more properly be called the dichotomy conception of sets, following a suggestion of Gödel.)

Cantor thought he could solve the problem of the paradoxes by distinguishing between “consistent multiplicities” or sets, and “inconsistent multiplicities”. But, in the absence of explicit criteria for the distinction, this was simply a verbal answer to the problem. Being aware of deficiencies in his new ideas, Cantor never published a last paper he had been preparing, in which he planned to discuss the paradoxes and the problem of well-ordering (we know quite well the contents of this unpublished paper, as Cantor discussed it in correspondence with Dedekind and Hilbert; see the 1899 letters to Dedekind in Cantor 1932, or Ewald 1996: vol. 2). Cantor presented an argument that relied on the “Burali-Forti” paradox of the ordinals, and aimed to prove that every set can be well-ordered. This argument was later rediscovered by the British mathematician P.E.B. Jourdain, but it is open to criticism because it works with “inconsistent multiplicities” (Cantor’s term in the above-mentioned letters).

Cantor’s paradoxes convinced Hilbert and Dedekind that there were important doubts concerning the foundations of set theory. Hilbert formulated a paradox of his own (Peckhaus & Kahle 2002), and discussed the problem with mathematicians in his Göttingen circle. Ernst Zermelo was thus led to discover the paradox of the “set” of all sets that are not members of themselves (Rang & Thomas 1981). This was independently discovered by Bertrand Russell, who was led to it by a careful study of Cantor’s Theorem, which conflicted deeply with Russell’s belief in a universal set. Some time later, in June 1902, he communicated the “contradiction” to Gottlob Frege, who was completing his own logical foundation of arithmetic, in a well-known letter [van Heijenoort 1967, 124]. Frege’s reaction made very clear the profound impact of this contradiction upon the logicist program. “Can I always speak of a class, of the extension of a concept? And if not, how can I know the exceptions?” Faced with this, “I cannot see how arithmetic could be given a scientific foundation, how numbers could be conceived as logical objects” (Frege 1903: 253).

The publication of Volume II of Frege’s Grundgesetze (1903), and above all Russell’s work The Principles of Mathematics (1903), made the mathematical community fully aware of the existence of the set-theoretic paradoxes, of their impact and importance. There is evidence that, up to then, even Hilbert and Zermelo had not fully appreciated the damage. Notice that the Russell-Zermelo paradox operates with very basic notions—negation and set membership—concepts that had widely been regarded as purely logical. The “set” \(R = \{x: x \not\in x\}\) exists according to the principle of comprehension (which allows any open sentence to determine a class), but if so, \(R \in R \textit{ iff } R \not\in R\). It is a direct contradiction to the principle favoured by Frege and Russell.

It was obviously necessary to clarify the foundations of set theory, but the overall situation did not make this an easy task. The different competing viewpoints were widely divergent. Cantor had a metaphysical understanding of set theory and, although he had one of the sharpest views of the field, he could not offer a precise foundation. It was clear to him (as it had been, somewhat mysteriously, to Ernst Schröder in his Vorlesungen über die Algebra der Logik, 1891) that one has to reject the idea of a Universal Set, favoured by Frege and Dedekind. Frege and Russell based their approach on the principle of comprehension, which was shown contradictory. Dedekind avoided that principle, but he postulated that the Absolute Universe was a set, a “thing” in his technical sense of Gedankending; and he coupled that assumption with full acceptance of arbitrary subsets.

This idea of admitting arbitrary subsets had been one of the deep inspirations of both Cantor and Dedekind, but none of them had thematized it. (Here, their modern understanding of analysis played a crucial but implicit background role, since they worked within the Dirichlet-Riemann tradition of “arbitrary” functions.) As for the now famous iterative conception there were some elements of it (particularly in Dedekind’s work, with his iterative development of the number system, and his views on “systems” and “things”), but it was conspicuously absent from many of the relevant authors. Typically, e. g., Cantor did not iterate the process of set formation: he tended to consider sets of homogeneous elements, elements which were taken to belong “in some conceptual sphere” (either numbers, or points, or functions, or even physical particles—but not intermingled). The iterative conception was first suggested by Kurt Gödel in [1933], in connection with technical work by von Neumann and Zermelo a few years earlier; Gödel would insist on the idea in his well-known paper on Cantor’s continuum problem. It came only post facto, after very substantial amounts of set theory had been developed and fully systematized.

This variety of conflicting viewpoints contributed much to the overall confusion, but there was more. In addition to the paradoxes discussed above (set-theoretic paradoxes, as we say), the list of “logical” paradoxes included a whole array of further ones (later called “semantic”). Among these are paradoxes due to Russell, Richard, König, Berry, Grelling, etc., as well as the ancient liar paradox due to Epimenides. And the diagnoses and proposed cures for the damage were tremendously varied. Some authors, like Russell, thought it was essential to find a new logical system that could solve all the paradoxes at once. This led him into the ramified type theory that formed the basis of Principia Mathematica (3 volumes, Whitehead and Russell 1910–1913), his joint work with Alfred Whitehead. Other authors, like Zermelo, believed that most of those paradoxes dissolved as soon as one worked within a restricted axiomatic system. They concentrated on the “set-theoretic” paradoxes (as we have done above), and were led to search for axiomatic systems of set theory.

Even more importantly, the questions left open by Cantor and emphasized by Hilbert in his first problem of 1900 caused heated debate. At the International Congress of Mathematicians at Heidelberg, 1904, Gyula (Julius) König proposed a very detailed proof that the cardinality of the continuum cannot be any of Cantor’s alephs. His proof was only flawed because he had relied on a result previously “proven” by Felix Bernstein, a student of Cantor and Hilbert. It took some months for Felix Hausdorff to identify the flaw and correct it by properly stating the special conditions under which Bernstein’s result was valid (see Hausdorff 2001, vol. 1). Once thus corrected, König’s theorem became one of the very few results restricting the possible solutions of the continuum problem, implying, e.g., that \(\textit{card}(\mathbf{R})\) is not equal to \(\aleph_{\omega}\). Meanwhile, Zermelo was able to present a proof that every set can be well-ordered, using the Axiom of Choice [1904]. During the following year, prominent mathematicians in Germany, France, Italy and England discussed the Axiom of Choice and its acceptability.

The Axiom of Choice states: For every set \(A\) of non-empty sets, there exists a set that has exactly one element in common with each set in \(A\). This started a whole era during which the Axiom of Choice was treated most carefully as a dubious hypothesis (see the monumental study by Moore 1982). And that is ironic, for, among all of the usual principles of set theory, the Axiom of Choice is the only one that explicitly enforces the existence of some arbitrary subsets. But, important as this idea had been in motivating Cantor and Dedekind, and however entangled it is with classical analysis, infinite arbitrary subsets were rejected by many other authors. Among the most influential ones in the following period, one ought to emphasize the names of Russell, Hermann Weyl, and of course Brouwer.

Choice was, for a long time, a controversial axiom. On the one hand, it is of wide use in mathematics and, indeed, it’s key to many important theorems of analysis (this became gradually clear with works such as Sierpiński [1918]). On the other hand, it has rather unintuitive consequences, such as the Banach-Tarski Paradox, which says that the unit ball can be partitioned into finitely-many ‘pieces’ (subsets), which can then be rearranged to form two unit balls (see Tomkowicz & Wagon [2019]). The objections to the axiom arise from the fact that it asserts the existence of sets that cannot be explicitly defined. During the 1920s and 1930s, there existed the ritual practice of mentioning it explicitly, whenever a theorem would depend on the axiom. This stopped only after Gödel’s proof of relative consistency, discussed below.

The impressive polemics which surrounded his Well-Ordering Theorem, and the most interesting and difficult problem posed by the foundations of mathematics, led Zermelo to concentrate on axiomatic set theory. As a result of his incisive analysis, in 1908 he published his axiom system, showing how it blocked the known paradoxes and yet allowed for a masterful development of the theory of cardinals and ordinals. This, however, is the topic of the entry Zermelo’s axiomatization of set theory; also, on the life and work of Zermelo, see Ebbinghaus 2015.

4. From Zermelo to Gödel

In the period 1900–1930, the rubric “set theory” was still understood to include topics in topology and the theory of functions. Although Cantor, Dedekind, and Zermelo had left that stage behind to concentrate on pure set theory, for mathematicians at large this would still take a long time. Thus, at the first International Congress of Mathematicians, 1897, keynote speeches given by Hadamard and Hurwitz defended set theory on the basis of its importance for analysis. Around 1900, motivated by topics in analysis, important work was done by three French experts: Borel [1898], Baire [1899] and Lebesgue [1902] [1905]. Their work inaugurated the development of descriptive set theory by extending Cantor’s studies on definable sets of real numbers (in which he had established that the Continuum Hypothesis is valid for closed sets). They introduced the hierarchy of Borel sets, the Baire hierarchy of functions, and the concept of Lebesgue measure—a crucial concept of modern analysis.

Descriptive set theory (DST) is the study of certain kinds of definable sets of real numbers, which are obtained from simple kinds (like the open sets and the closed sets) by well-understood operations like complementation or projection. The Borel sets were the first hierarchy of definable sets, introduced in the 1898 book of Émile Borel; they are obtained from the open sets by iterated application of the operations of countable union and complementation. In 1905 Lebesgue studied the Borel sets in an epochal memoir, showing that their hierarchy has levels for all countable ordinals, and analyzing the Baire functions as counterparts of the Borel sets. The main aim of descriptive set theory is to find structural properties common to all such definable sets: for instance, the Borel sets were shown to have the perfect set property (if uncountable, they have a perfect subset) and thus to comply with the continuum hypothesis (CH). This result was established in 1916 by Hausdorff and by Alexandroff, working independently. Other important “regularity properties” studied in DST are the property of being Lebesgue measurable, and the so-called property of Baire (to differ from an open set by a so-called meager set, or set of first category).

Also crucial at the time was the study of the analytic sets, namely the continuous images of Borel sets, or equivalently, the projections of Borel sets. The young Russian mathematician Mikhail Suslin found a mistake in Lebesgue’s 1905 memoir when he realized that the projection of a Borel set is not Borel in general [Suslin 1917]. However, he was able to establish that the analytic sets, too, possess the perfect set property and thus verify CH. By 1923 Nikolai Lusin and Wacław Sierpiński were studying the co-analytic sets, and this was to lead them to a new hierarchy of projective sets, which starts with the analytic sets \((\Sigma^{1}_{1})\), their complements (co-analytic, \(\Pi^{1}_{1}\) sets), the projections of these last (\(\Sigma^{1}_{2}\) sets), their complements (\(\Pi^{1}_{2}\) sets), and so on. During the 1920s much work was done on these new types of sets, mainly by Polish mathematicians around Sierpiński and by the Russian school of Lusin and his students. A crucial result obtained by Sierpiński was that every \(\Sigma^{1}_{2}\) set is the union of \(\aleph_{1}\) Borel sets (the same holds for \(\Sigma^{1}_{1}\) sets), but this kind of traditional research on the topic would stagnate after around 1940 (see Kanamori [1995]).

Soon Lusin, Sierpiński and their colleagues were finding extreme difficulties in their work. Lusin was so much in despair that, in a paper of 1925, he came to the “totally unexpected” conclusion that “one does not know and one will never know” whether the projective sets have the desired regularity properties (quoted in Kanamori 1995: 250). Such comments are highly interesting in the light of later developments, which have led to hypotheses that solve all the relevant questions (Projective Determinacy, in particular). They underscore the difficult methodological and philosophical issues raised by these more recent hypotheses, namely the problem concerning the kind of evidence that backs them.

Lusin summarized the state of the art in his 1930 book Leçons sur les ensembles analytiques (Paris, Gauthier-Villars), which was to be a key reference for years to come. Since this work, it has become customary to present results in DST for the Baire space \( ^{\omega}\)\(\omega\) of infinite sequences of natural numbers, which in effect had been introduced by René Baire in a paper published in 1909. Baire space is endowed with a certain topology that makes it homeomorphic to the set of the irrational numbers, and it is regarded by experts to be “perhaps the most fundamental object of study of set theory” next to the set of natural numbers [Moschovakis 1994, 135].

This stream of work on DST must be counted among the most important contributions made by set theory to analysis and topology. But what had begun as an attempt to prove the Continuum Hypothesis could not reach this goal. Soon it was shown using the Axiom of Choice that there are non-Lebesgue measurable sets of reals (Vitali 1905), and also uncountable sets of reals with no perfect subset (Bernstein 1908). Such results made clear the impossibility of reaching the goal of CH by concentrating on definable and “well-behaved” sets of reals.

Also, with Gödel’s work around 1940 (and also with forcing in the 1960s) it became clear why the research of the 1920s and 30s had stagnated: the fundamental new independence results showed that the theorems established by Suslin (perfect set property for analytic sets), Sierpinski (\(\Sigma^{1}_{2}\) sets as unions of \(\aleph_{1}\) Borel sets) and a few others were the best possible results on the basis of axiom system ZFC. This is important philosophically: already an exploration of the world of sets definable from the open (or closed) sets by complement, countable union, and projection had sufficed to reach the limits of the ZFC system. Hence the need for new axioms, that Gödel emphasized after World War II [Gödel 1947].

Let us now turn to Cantor’s other main legacy, the study of transfinite numbers. By 1908 Hausdorff was working on uncountable order types and introduced the Generalized Continuum Hypothesis \((2^{\aleph_{a}} = \aleph_{a+1})\). He was also the first to consider the possibility of an “exorbitant” cardinal, namely a weakly inaccessible, i.e., a regular cardinal that is not a successor (a cardinal \(\alpha\) is called regular if decomposing \(\alpha\) into a sum of smaller cardinals requires \(\alpha\)-many such numbers). Few years later, in the early 1910s, Paul Mahlo was studying hierarchies of such large cardinals in work that pioneered what was to become a central area of set theory; he obtained a succession of inaccessible cardinals by employing a certain operation that involves the notion of a stationary subset; they are called Mahlo cardinals. But the study of large cardinals developed slowly. Meanwhile, Hausdorff’s textbook Grundzüge der Mengenlehre (1914) introduced two generations of mathematicians into set theory and general topology.

The next crucial steps into the “very high” infinite were done in 1930. The notion of strongly inaccessible cardinals was then isolated by Sierpiński & Tarski, and by Zermelo [1930]. A strong inaccessible is a regular cardinal \(\alpha\) such that \(2^x\) is less than \(\alpha\) whenever \(x < \alpha\). While weak inaccessibles merely involve closure under the successor operation, strong inaccessibles involve a much stronger notion of closure under the powerset operation. That same year, in a path-breaking paper on models of ZFC, Zermelo [1930] established a link between the uncountable (strongly) inaccessible cardinals and certain “natural” models of ZFC (in which work he assumed that the powerset operation is, so to say, fully determinate).

In that same year, Stanislaw Ulam was led by considerations coming out of analysis (measure theory) to a concept that was to become central: measurable cardinals. It turned out that such cardinals, defined by a measure-theoretic property, had to be (strongly) inaccessible. Indeed, many years later it would be established (by Hanf, working upon Tarski’s earlier work) that the first inaccessible cardinal is not measurable, showing that these new cardinals were even more “exorbitant”. As one can see, the Polish school led by Sierpiński had a very central role in the development of set theory between the Wars. Measurable cardinals came to special prominence in the late 1960s when it became clear that the existence of a measurable cardinal contradicts Gödel’s axiom of constructibility (\(V = L\) in the class notation). This again vindicated Gödel’s convictions, expressed in what is sometimes called “Gödel’s program” for new axioms.

Set-theoretic mathematics continued its development into the powerful axiomatic and structural approach that was to dominate much of the 20th century. To give just a couple of examples, Hilbert’s early axiomatic work (e.g., in his arch-famous Foundations of Geometry) was deeply set-theoretic; Ernst Steinitz published in 1910 his research on abstract field theory, making essential use of the Axiom of Choice; and around the same time the study of function spaces began with work by Hilbert, Maurice Fréchet, and others. During the 1920s and 30s, the first specialized mathematics journal, Fundamenta Mathematicae, was devoted to set theory as then understood (centrally including topology and function theory). In those decades structural algebra came of age, abstract topology was gradually becoming an independent branch of study, and the study of set theory initiated its metatheoretic turn.

Ever since, “set theory” has generally been identified with the branch of mathematical logic that studies transfinite sets, originating in Cantor’s result that \(\mathbf{R}\) has a greater cardinality than \(\mathbf{N}\). But, as the foregoing discussion shows, set theory was both effect and cause of the rise of modern mathematics: the traces of this origin are indelibly stamped on its axiomatic structure.


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Further Reading

  • Cavaillès, Jean, 1962, Philosophie mathématique, Paris: Hermann.
  • Ebbinghaus, Heinz-Dieter, 2007, Ernst Zermelo: An approach to his life an work, New York: Springer.
  • Fraenkel, Abraham, 1928, Einleitung in die Mengenlehre, 3rd edn. Berlin: Springer.
  • Grattan-Guinness, Ivor (ed.), 1980, From the Calculus to Set Theory, 1630–1910, London: Duckworth.
  • Kanamori, Akihiro, 2004, “Zermelo and set theory”, Bulletin of Symbolic Logic, 10(4): 487–553.
  • –––, 2007, “Gödel and set theory”, Bulletin of Symbolic Logic, 13 (2): 153–188.
  • –––, 2008, “Cohen and set theory”, Bulletin of Symbolic Logic, 14(3): 351–378.
  • –––, 2009, “Bernays and set theory”, Bulletin of Symbolic Logic, 15(1): 43–60.
  • Maddy, Penelope, 1988, “Believing the axioms”, Journal of Symbolic Logic, 53(2): 481–511; 53(3): 736–764.
  • Wagon, Stan, 1993, The Banach-Tarski Paradox, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Other Internet Resources

  • A History of Set Theory, by J.J. O’Connor and E.F. Robertson, in The MacTutor History of Mathematics archive. Note that their reconstruction conflicts at some points with the one provided here.
  • Godel’s Program (PowerPoint), an interesting talk by John R. Steel (Mathematics, U.C./Berkeley).
  • A Home Page for the Axiom of Choice, maintained by Eric Schechter (Mathematics, Vanderbilt University).

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