Adam Smith’s Moral and Political Philosophy

First published Fri Feb 15, 2013; substantive revision Wed Nov 11, 2020

Adam Smith developed a comprehensive and unusual version of moral sentimentalism in his Theory of Moral Sentiments (1759, TMS). He did not expressly lay out a political philosophy in similar detail, but a distinctive set of views on politics can be extrapolated from elements of both TMS and his Wealth of Nations (1776, WN); student notes from his lectures on jurisprudence (1762–1763, LJ) have also helped flesh out his thoughts on governance. A central thread running through his work is an unusually strong commitment to the soundness of the ordinary human being’s judgments, and a concern to fend off attempts, by philosophers and policy-makers, to replace those judgments with the supposedly better “systems” invented by intellectuals. In his “History of Astronomy”, he characterizes philosophy as a discipline that attempts to connect and regularize the data of everyday experience (Smith 1795: 44–7); in TMS, he tries to develop moral theory out of ordinary moral judgments, rather than beginning from a philosophical vantage point above those judgments; and a central polemic of WN is directed against the notion that government officials need to guide the economic decisions of ordinary people. Perhaps taking a cue from David Hume’s skepticism about the capacity of philosophy to replace the judgments of common life, Smith is suspicious of philosophy as conducted from a foundationalist standpoint, outside the modes of thought and practice it examines. Instead, he maps common life from within, correcting it where necessary with its own tools rather than trying either to justify or to criticize it from an external standpoint. He aims indeed to break down the distinction between theoretical and ordinary thought. This intellectual project is not unconnected with his political interest in guaranteeing to ordinary individuals the “natural liberty” to act in accordance with their own judgments.

1. Methodology

Smith’s Theory of Moral Sentiments (TMS) tends to arouse sharply divergent reactions among the philosophers who pick it up. Kant is said to have considered it his favorite among Scottish moral sense theories (Fleischacker 1991), but others have dismissed it as devoid of systematic argument, or derivative, in its theoretical aspirations, of Hume. What explains these disparate reactions is one and the same feature of the book: that it consists largely of what Smith himself calls “illustrations” of the workings of the moral sentiments (TMS, “Advertisement”)—short vignettes, elegantly described, that attempt to show what frightens us about death, what we find interesting and what dull or distasteful about other people’s love affairs, how moral luck factors into our assessment of various actions (Garrett 2005; Hankins 2016), or how and why we deceive ourselves. To some, this provides the detail and psychological acuity that they find lacking in most moral philosophy; to others, it seems something more properly taken up by novelists or empirical psychologists, not the business of a philosopher. Indeed, one prominent view of TMS is that it is a work in descriptive psychology or sociology, not a contribution to normative moral theory (Campbell 1971; Raphael 2007). This reading is hard to square with the many normative judgments in TMS (see Hanley 2009, chapter 2 and Otteson 2002, chapter 6). It also misses the force of Smith’s insistence that the proper way to make normative judgments is to consider the details of a phenomenon from an impartial perspective: to judge the workings of our moral faculties, then, we need to consider them, and their uses, in appropriate detail. Laying out in detail how they work can help us see how they can be corrupted, and therefore to avoid that corruption, at least to some extent (see TMS 61–6, 92–104). If this was Smith’s goal—and it fits the text of TMS very well—then he was engaged not in the sociology or psychology but the phenomenology of morals, describing the workings of our modes of moral judgment as carefully as possible from within, and believing that the comprehensive view that results can itself help guide us in moral judgment. Moral phenomenology is normative moral theory, for him, and there is no more foundational theory—no set of general principles—of which we might avail ourselves. Justification for how we make moral judgments can only be found within the way we actually do make moral judgments; both moral justification and moral critique must be immanent to, not transcendent of, our moral practice (compare TMS 313–4).

A few implications of this approach. First, Smith is an anti-reductionist. He does not think morality can be reduced to a set of natural or divine laws, nor that it is simply a means for producing “the greatest happiness for the greatest number of people,” in the phrase coined by his teacher, Frances Hutcheson. He indeed says explicitly, against the proto-utilitarianism of Hutcheson and Hume, that philosophers in his day have paid too much attention to the consequences of actions, and he wants to focus instead on their propriety: the relation they bear to the motive that inspires them (18–19). At the same time, he argues that the moral systems proposed by Samuel Clarke, William Wollaston, and Lord Shaftesbury overstress propriety, which is just one “essential ingredient” in virtuous action (294; see also 265 and 326). His own view attempts to take account of all the essential ingredients in virtue and moral judgment, and to resist the temptation to reduce those ingredients to a single principle (see 326–7).

Second, and relatedly, Smith’s way of approaching virtue often resembles Aristotle’s—who has also sometimes been seen as too fond of the description of virtue, and who tried to acknowledge the many diverse elements of virtue, and the judgment of virtue, rather than to reduce them to a single principle. Smith says at the end of TMS that his system corresponds “pretty exactly” with Aristotle’s (271). The attentive reader of TMS will have noticed this earlier: when he characterizes propriety as lying between the excess and defect of passion (27), for instance, or when he distinguishes the restraint of appetite out of self-interest from the virtue of temperance (28), or when he emphasizes habit (152, 324), or the superiority of friendships of virtue over friendships of pleasure (224–5).

Finally, Smith’s phenomenological method is interwoven with his strong leanings toward particularism. He insists that general moral rules are “founded upon experience of what, in particular instances, our moral faculties, our natural sense of merit and propriety, approve, or disapprove of” (159; see also 160 and 320), and that our notions of right and wrong bottom out in these reactions to particular cases (320; see also 187 and Gill 2014). His account of virtue as depending on our attempts to adjust ourselves as closely as possible to the feelings of the particular others we encounter also suggests that what is virtuous in one set of circumstances may not be so in different circumstances. These commitments entail that moral theorists will give us little moral guidance if they present just the general structure of right and wrong (and Smith thinks that moral theory should help guide moral practice: TMS 293, 315). A fine-grained phenomenology of how we carry out various kinds of moral judgment, and the errors or infelicities to which we are prone in this process, will be far more helpful.

2. Summary of Smith’s Moral Philosophy

With these methodological points in mind, let’s proceed to the contents of TMS. Smith begins the book with an account of sympathy, which he describes as arising when we imagine how we would feel in the circumstances of others. (A rich discussion of Smith on sympathy can be found in Griswold 1999, ch.2; see also Fleischacker 2019, chapter 2.) This is somewhat different from Hume’s account, on which sympathy normally consists in feeling what others actually feel in their circumstances. Hume’s may be called a “contagion” account of sympathy, while Smith’s is a “projective” account (see Fleischacker 2012 and 2019). Smith’s projective account opens up the possibility that our feelings on another person’s behalf may often not match the feelings she herself has. Indeed to some extent they will never match, since imagining oneself into a set of circumstances will always lack the intensity of actually experiencing those circumstances (TMS 21–2). This difference is of great importance to Smith, since he maintains that trying to share the feelings of others as closely as possible is one of our main drives in life. We make constant efforts to adjust our feelings, as spectators, to those of the people “principally concerned” in a set of circumstances (importantly, these include people acted upon as well as agents), and to adjust our feelings as people principally concerned to a level with which sympathetic spectators can go along (110–13, 135–6). It is this process of mutual emotional adjustment that gives rise to virtue: the “awful” virtues of self-restraint, insofar as the people principally concerned keep themselves from feeling, or at least expressing, the full flood of their grief or joy, and the “amiable” virtues of compassion and humanity, insofar as the spectators strive to participate in the joys and sufferings of others (23–5).

Neither the feelings we seek to have nor the standards by which we judge feelings need be identical with the feelings and standards that are actually current in our society. We know that many actual spectators misjudge our situations out of ignorance or interest, so we seek to judge, and act on, just the feelings that a well-informed and impartial spectator would have (TMS 129, 135). Smith thinks that to sympathize with another’s feelings is to approve of those feelings (17), and to sympathize as we think an impartial spectator would is to approve morally of those feelings. Moral norms thus express the feelings of an impartial spectator. A feeling, whether on the part of a person motivated to take an action or on the part of a person who has been acted upon by others, is worthy of moral approval if and only if an impartial spectator would sympathize with that feeling. (Again, people acted upon are subject to moral judgment as well as agents; reactions can be judged as well as actions.) When achieving a morally right feeling is difficult, we call that achievement “virtuous”; otherwise, we describe people as acting or failing to act within the bounds of “propriety” (25). Thus do moral norms and ideals, and the judgments by which we guide ourselves towards those norms and ideals, arise out of the process by which we try to achieve mutual sympathy.

Smith distinguishes two kinds of normative guides to action: rules and virtues. Moral rules, formed on the basis of our reactions to specific instances (we say to ourselves, “I’ll never do that”), bar certain especially egregious kinds of behavior—murder, rape, theft—and provide a framework of shared expectations for society (156–66). They are essential to justice, especially, without which societies could not survive. They also enable people who are not fully virtuous to behave with a minimum of decorum and decency (162–3), and help all of us cut through the “veil of self-delusion” (158) by which we misrepresent our situations to ourselves. Virtue requires more than simply following moral rules, however. Our emotional dispositions need to be re-configured so that we do not merely “affect” the sentiments of the impartial spectator but “adopt” those sentiments: identify ourselves with, become, the impartial spectator, insofar as that is possible (147). If we are truly virtuous, a submission to certain rules will constrain everything we do, but within that framework we will operate without rules, trying instead to mold ourselves with the know-how by which an artist molds his clay, such that we develop dispositions to proper gratitude, kindness, courage, patience, and endurance.

This is a picture that owes a great deal to Hume and Joseph Butler, but gets worked out by Smith in much greater detail. It has been hailed by some as an especially sensible recognition of the kind and degree of virtue appropriate to modern liberal politics and commercial society (Berry 1992; McCloskey 2006). Others see a darker, more pessimistic attitude towards virtue in Smith, echoing the kinds of worries to be found in Rousseau about the corruption wrought by commerce (Dwyer 1987, chapter 7). Still others argue that Smith’s account of virtue re-works but to a remarkable degree also retains the highest ideals of both the Christian and the ancient Greco-Roman traditions, suggesting that his willingness to uphold such an ideal of character even in modern commercial societies should be understand as a critique rather than an endorsement of Rousseau (Hanley 2009).

In any case, Smith gives us more a virtue ethics than a rule-based moral system along the lines proposed by Kant and the utilitarians. Nevertheless, he tries to incorporate some of the intuitions that generated these other systems. As we have seen, he thinks that we need to submit to general rules, and his reasons for supposing that relying on sentiment alone can feed our self-deceit anticipate Kant’s critique of moral sentimentalism in the Groundwork (see Fleischacker 1991). Smith also acknowledges that we in fact judge actions by their effects as well as their intentions, and thinks this sort of judgment is appropriate as long as we look at effects as they are intended, and not just as they happen to occur. The “merit” of actions, he says in Book II of TMS, depends on their consequences, even if their propriety is independent of consequences; the point, for him, is just that these are two different elements of moral judgment and the first is of greater importance than the second (188). Having insisted on this, he grants that in some cases the consequences of an action—where they threaten the very survival of our society, for instance—may trump all other considerations (90–91).

In line with his concern for accurate moral phenomenology, Smith also tries to make sense of the role that religion and culture play in our moral lives. He handles the first of these by explaining why people who come to believe in higher powers will naturally attribute virtues, and a concern for our virtue, to those powers (163–6). He also says that it adds to the sacredness we attribute to moral rules to see them as laws of the Deity, and to the importance of morality as a whole to see it as a way of “co-operat[ing] with the Deity” in the governance of the universe (166). And he shows how a belief in an afterlife may be necessary if we are to see the universe as just, which in turn is important if we are to maintain our commitment to the value of acting morally (168–70). In all these ways, but especially the last, he anticipates Kant’s moral argument for belief in God, without ever quite saying that there is a God. At the same time, he makes clear that any religion that gives priority to ritual or creed over morality is baleful, and poses grave dangers to a decent and peaceful society (TMS 176–7; cf. WN 802–3).

Smith handles the importance of culture under the heading of “custom and fashion.” Book V of TMS takes up this topic, acknowledging the influence of prevailing opinions in each society over all sorts of value judgments, and granting that what is regarded as virtuous will vary to some extent in accordance with this influence. The French value politeness more than the Russians, and the Dutch value frugality more than the Poles (TMS 204). The leisured classes in every country tend to be less strict about sexual mores than the working classes (WN 794). These are easily explicable differences, and not worrisome ones: they are matters of emphasis, and cannot affect “the general style of conduct or behaviour” of a society. That general style of conduct cannot vary in its essentials. No society could survive otherwise (TMS 209, 211).

Part VI of TMS, added in the last edition, presents the virtues of prudence, benevolence and self-command by way of a series of elegant character portraits, and part VII offers a short history of moral philosophy, which stresses the contributions of Plato, Aristotle, and the Stoics. This way of concluding the book reinforces the emphasis on virtuous character, as opposed to a decision-procedure for specific actions, and indicates that we might gain by returning to the ancient schools of moral philosophy that shared this emphasis. Smith does not endorse any ancient moral theorist uncritically, but—like Shaftesbury and Hume—he seems to look forward to a revival of ancient Greek ethics, a modern retrieval and re-working of the character ideals on which those schools had focused.

3. Advantages of Smith’s Moral Philosophy

Smith’s version of moral sentimentalism has a number of advantages over those of his contemporaries. His approach yields moral judgments closer to those we already normally make, and makes better sense of the complexity and richness of both virtue and the judgment of virtue. He is expressly concerned to do justice to this complexity, criticizing Hutcheson for reducing virtue too single-mindedly to benevolence, and Hume for putting too much emphasis on utility.

In addition, none of Smith’s predecessors had developed such an essentially social conception of the self. Hutcheson and Hume both see human beings as having a natural disposition to care about the good of their society, but for Smith, all our feelings, whether self-interested or benevolent, are constituted by a process of socialization. Smith conceives of humanity as less capable of solipsism than Hume does, less capable of the thoroughgoing egoism that Hume, in his famous discussion of the sensible knave, finds it so difficult to refute (Hume 1777, 81–2). At the same time, Smith reconciles his social conception of the self with a deep respect for the importance of each individual self, and the capacity of each self for independent choice. Ethical self-transformation, for Smith, is inspired and guided by social pressures but ultimately carried out by the individual for him or herself. The “impartial spectator” begins as a product and expression of society, but becomes, once internalized, a source of moral evaluation that enables the individual to stand apart from, and criticize, his or her society. Individually free action and the social construction of the self are compatible, for Smith, even dependent on one another.

We can more fully appreciate what is distinctive in Smith by comparing him with Hume. Smith’s thought circles around Hume’s: there is virtually nothing in either TMS or WN without some sort of source or anticipation in Hume, although there is also almost no respect in which Smith agrees entirely with Hume. Take their accounts of sympathy, for example. When Hume describes the workings of sympathy, he says that emotions “readily pass from one person to another,” like the motion of a string equally wound up with other strings, “communicat[ing] itself to the rest” (Hume 1739–40, p. 576; see also pp. 317, 605). He then explains that we obtain our idea of the other person’s feelings by inference—from the effects (smiles, frowns) or causes of those feelings. In both cases, the other’s feeling, once inferred, communicates itself directly to us, and our imaginations only intensify our idea of that feeling so as to raise it to the level of an impression (Hume 1739–40, pp. 576, 319–20). For Smith, by contrast, we place ourselves in the other’s situation and imagine what we would feel if we were there. Imagination is essential to the production even of the “idea” of another’s feelings, and sympathetic feelings are no longer ones that the other person need actually have. (Smith points out that this explains how we sympathize with some people, like gravely ill infants or the insane, who do not actually experience the suffering we feel on their behalf [TMS 12–13]). This account allows for us to judge other people’s feelings against the background of our sympathetic feelings for them. Sympathy is thus not just a way of sharing feelings with others; it also opens a gap between their feelings and ours. And that gap gives us a grip on the notion—crucial to Smith’s theory—that certain feelings are appropriate to a situation, while others are not.

These seemingly slight shifts from Hume—understanding sympathy as 1) produced by the imagination and 2) a response to situations rather than something passed on, causally, from one person to another—have immense implications for the shape of Smith’s thought. The first of them leads him to give a central place to works of the imagination in moral development. He frequently brings in examples from poetry and drama to explain or give evidence for his points (e.g., TMS 30, 32–3, 34, 177, 227), twice recommends writers like Voltaire as great “instructors” in certain virtues (TMS 143, 177), and seems to see moral philosophy itself as a work of the imagination, a project that needs to draw on imaginative resources and that properly aims at extending and enriching the moral imaginations of its readers (compare Griswold 1999, chapter 1). It is therefore for him a project to which clarity, vivacity and elegance are as important as good argument, and Smith was in fact very concerned with finding the appropriate rhetoric—the appropriate appeal to the imagination—for his works (see Griswold 1999; Muller 1993; Brown 1994). Both of his books are beautifully written, and filled with vivid, memorable examples.

The second of the shifts enables Smith to be more of a moral realist than Hume. Smith finds an ingenious way of importing Samuel Clarke’s concern with “fitnesses” (Clarke 1703) into moral sentimentalism. On his view, we aim to have, and act on, just those feelings that an impartial spectator would have in our situations; the feelings we attribute to such a spectator are then the ones fitted to that situation. So our feelings have something to aim at, by which they can be judged or measured. This allows Smith to talk, as he does throughout TMS, of “fitness” (e.g., 149, 159, 165, 305, 311), of feelings being “suitable to their objects” (16–20, 40, 70, 73, 102), and, by extension, of people being suited to the approval or disapproval bestowed upon them (58, 114, 118, 126). He thereby restores a meaning to our ordinary view of value judgments as correct or incorrect, and not merely as fostering or discouraging actions and qualities that may be useful to society. Relatedly, he sees our sentiments as more flexible than Hume does, and more responsive to criticism. As socialized human beings, we do not simply desire certain objects but desire to have just those desires of which an impartial spectator would approve. What are today called “second-order desires” accompany and shape all our first-order desires (110–11; compare Frankfurt 1971). This gives our emotions the internal structure they need to be able to change in response to norms.

Accordingly, it makes much more sense for Smith than for Hume that we ought to assess our sentiments critically. Hume grants that we correct our sympathy for partiality by adopting in imagination a “steady and general point of view” (Hume 1739–40, p. 581), but for Smith this concession comes too late. Smith sees sympathy as building an aspiration to make one’s sentiments harmonize with the sentiments of others into those sentiments themselves. If they did not already have such an aspiration, we would have neither motivation nor reason to take up the “steady and general point of view.” It makes little sense to treat our sentiments as baldly given natural reactions, impervious to reason, but then add that they may need “correction.” If sentiments are bald natural reactions, they can be neither correct nor incorrect; if they are impervious to reason, then we can have reason, at most, to appear to have sentiments other than the ones we happen to have, not truly to change those sentiments. For Smith, the aspiration to be worthy of approval belongs to our sentiments from the beginning, and we have, accordingly, both motivation and reason to change our sentiments if they keep us from this aspiration.

Relatedly, for Smith but not for Hume there is a lot to learn about what sentiments we should have. In neither the Treatise nor the second Enquiry does Hume spend any significant time on how we might learn to acquire new sentiments or alter the ones we have. By contrast, the first five parts of TMS—almost two-thirds of the text—are devoted to a delineation of the various ways in which we learn to assess our sentiments, and in which learning to assess them enables us both to express them with propriety, and to change them.

There is also for Smith, far more than for Hume, a place for moral history. Smith’s deep interweaving of individuals with their society, and of socialization with moral development, alerts him to the many ways in which moral norms and ideals are indexed to historical circumstances (see Schliesser 2006). This comes out in the detailed accounts he gives, in his lectures on jurisprudence, of how notions of property, contract, marriage, and punishment have arisen and changed in various societies. The idea of a history of morals opens up here, and Smith—via his student John Millar, who attended the lectures on jurisprudence—was an important source of later sociological and anthropological accounts of normative change.

Finally, Smith is further from utilitarianism than Hume. Both the notion of sentiments as having or lacking an intrinsic propriety independently of their effects, and the arguments, in Books II and IV, against reducing our interest in justice and beauty to our interest in their useful effects, are meant to counteract the utilitarian tendencies in Hume. Smith’s particularist conception of moral judgment, and his playing down of the effects of actions in favor of their motivations, keep him far from consequentialism. He believes that our faculties of moral evaluation are always directed toward the motivations and well-being of particular individuals in particular situations, not to goods that might be possessed jointly by groups of human beings, and he rejects the idea that our assessments or decisions should aim at the greatest happiness for the greatest number of people (TMS 237). In addition, he sees happiness as so shaped by the possession of morally appropriate dispositions that it cannot serve as a nonmoral goal that might help us define those dispositions. It is essential to the hedonic calculus that happiness be defined independently of morality, so that it can bestow content on moral claims (see McDowell 1998a). That is impossible, for Smith. Smith sees meeting the demands of the impartial spectator as intrinsic to happiness; there is no happiness independent of morality.

4. Objections to Smith’s Moral Philosophy

Smith’s moral theory has been accused of three major failings. First, it offers us no clear procedure for deciding which actions we should take in specific circumstances, no guidelines for how we can tell, in specific cases, what the impartial spectator has to say. Second, the impartial spectator seems too enmeshed in the attitudes and interests of the society in which it develops for it to be free of that society’s biases, or to help us care impartially for all human beings. And third, even if Smith’s analysis of moral claims is correct, even if it is true that moral judgments in ordinary life consist in attempts to express how an impartial spectator would feel about our conduct, it remains unclear what justifies these judgments. Why should we heed the demands of the impartial spectator?

Smith would probably dismiss the first of these objections, as based on an erroneous notion of what moral philosophy ought to do. Moral philosophy can deepen our love for virtue, refine our understanding of the virtues, and enrich our understanding of ourselves, all of which can conduce to a firmer moral disposition and to a wiser, more careful approach to moral decisions, but it cannot and should not replace the common-life processes by which we actually make those decisions. Philosophy is an abstract, intellectual, and solitary activity, while moral decision-making is and should be concrete, driven by emotion as much as by the intellect, and shaped by our interactions with the people affected by our actions.

The second and third objections constitute what we might call a tribalist or relativist and a skeptical challenge. The tribalist sees no reason to extend moral sentiments or modes of judgment to people outside his society, and no reason to criticize the basic structures of moral sentiment in his society. He thereby seems to miss a basic feature of moral demands. But where is the room for a universalist morality in Smith’s account? Since we construct the impartial spectator within us out of attitudes in the society around us, how can that spectator reach beyond our society sufficiently to achieve a sensitive and impartial concern for members of other societies, and to recognize where our society’s sentiments are biased or corrupt?

The skeptic represents a yet deeper problem. Smith says that when we issue a moral judgment, of others or of ourselves, we express the relationship of one set of sentiments—the cooler, more reflective sentiments characteristic of a spectator—to another. This seems a plausible account of what we actually do, when judging morally; it captures nicely the “feel” of ordinary moral judgments. But does it give us reason to heed such judgments? Does it explain the normativity of moral judgments, our sense that we ought to listen to them?

Smith clearly rejects any tribal limit to the reach of moral demands. He adopts the Stoic view that each person is “first and principally recommended [by nature] to his own care” (TMS 219), and that we similarly care more about members of our own society than about people far away from us (139–40, 227–8). At the same time, however—also like the Stoics—he thinks that our moral feelings extend, if to a lesser degree, to all rational and sensible beings: “our good-will is circumscribed by no boundary, but may embrace the immensity of the universe” (235). Indeed, he regards accepting harm to one’s local community, if that is necessary for the good of the universe, as a mark of the highest wisdom and virtue (235–6). As Amartya Sen has stressed, Smith also wants us to evaluate our conduct from the perspective of any human being anywhere, not just a member of our own society. Sen quotes a passage in TMS in which Smith says that we “endeavour to examine our own conduct as we imagine any other fair and impartial spectator would imagine it” (110), arguing that it implies we should seek to be informed by the views of people far outside our cultural communities. “The need to invoke how things would look to ‘any other fair and impartial spectator,’” says Sen, “is a requirement that can bring in judgments that would be made by disinterested people from other societies as well” (Sen 2009: 125). And Smith certainly did aspire to provide such a standard of moral judgment, a structure for morality that reaches out across national and cultural borders.

But is Smith’s impartial spectator capable of doing this? Consider two of its features. First, it uses sentiments rather than reason as the basis of its judgments. It is not like Roderick Firth’s ideal observer, dispassionately watching people from above the emotional fray (Firth 1952). Rather, Smith follows Hutcheson and Hume in tracing moral judgment, ultimately, to feelings. The impartial spectator is supposed to be free of partial feelings—feelings that depend on a stake it might have in a dispute, or on blind favoritism or dislike for one party or the other—but it is not supposed to be free of feelings altogether, nor to reach for a principle it might derive from reason alone, independent of feeling (see Raphael 2007, chapter 6). But our feelings are notoriously shaped by our societies, and it is not clear how a device that depends on feelings could correct for biases built into them.

Second, the impartial spectator develops within us as part of our efforts to align our feelings with those of the people immediately around us. The “chief part of human happiness,” for Smith, comes from the consciousness that we are “beloved” (TMS 41), but that is not possible unless our feelings, and the actions we take on those feelings, meet with other people’s approval. The search for feelings we can share—for mutual sympathy—is a basic human drive, and it leads among other things to the rise of morality. Of course, that eventually means that we correct the modes of approval of people around us for bias and misinformation; we seek the judgment of an impartial spectator within rather than partial spectators without. But Smith never suggests that this impartial spectator uses different methods of judging, appeals to different sorts of norms, than our neighbors do. It arises out of the actual process of moral judgment around us, and we heed it as part of our drive to find a harmony of feelings with our actual neighbors. It is very unlikely, then, to use a method of judging radically unlike those of our actual neighbors, or perceive, let alone correct for, a systematic bias in the sentiments of our society. If sentiments of condescension or dislike toward poor people, or black people, or gay people, pervade our society, then there is every reason to expect that many of us, especially in privileged groups, will build an impartial spectator within ourselves that shares those biases rather than rising above them.

These are the sorts of considerations that led Smith himself to worry about the danger that “established custom” can distort moral judgment (TMS 210), and that nature may lead people, foolishly and unjustly, to admire the rich and despise the poor (50–62). Smith also worried that political faction and religious fanaticism can “pervert” our moral feelings (155–6, 176–7), and did not suggest ways to correct for that danger. It is unclear how his moral theory might supply such a corrective.

Moreover, much that is attractive about Smith’s theory is bound up with this limitation; his relativistic tendencies are not a mere mistake but a consequence of the structure of his theory. The absence of transcendental principles in favor of judgments rooted in our everyday sentiments, the view of individuals as aiming, by way of morality, for emotional harmony with their neighbors, the psychological insight of his view of moral development—all these things go together with a picture on which we are deeply shaped by our local societies in the way we make moral judgments, and can turn those judgments on our society only with difficulty. It has been suggested that Smith thought better information about the lives of poor people could help well-off people judge the poor more favorably (Fleischacker 2004, chapter 10), and perhaps he thought that slavery and other injustices could likewise be overturned by better information: information enabling people to project themselves into the lives of slaves, and other victims of injustice, and thereby to sympathize with them. Sometimes Smith also drops proto-Kantian hints that a concern for the equal worth of every human being lies at the basis of all moral sentiments (TMS 90, 107, 137), and Stephen Darwall and Remy Debes have brought out a latent egalitarianism in the structure of Smith’s moral theory that could be turned against inegalitarian social institutions (Darwall 1999; Debes 2012). But even a commitment to the equal worth of every human being can be interpreted in ways that support local biases—Kant, notoriously, maintained racist and sexist views long after coming up with his arguments for equal worth—and Smith in any case says little to justify his egalitarian tendencies. So it must be admitted that the tribalist challenge brings out a weakness in Smith’s theory, and cannot easily be answered without sacrificing some of its central elements. (For more on these issues, see Forman-Barzilai 2010).

Smith does better with the skeptical challenge. To the person who asks, “why be moral?,” Smith essentially provides what Christine Korsgaard calls a “reflective endorsement” argument (Korsgaard 1996: 19, 49–89). Reflective endorsement theorists—Korsgaard gives Hume and Butler as examples—substitute the question, “are the claims of our moral nature good for human life?” for the question, “are moral claims true?” They identify a certain faculty for approval or disapproval as giving force to moral claims, and then ask whether, on reflection, we can approve of that faculty of approval itself. This test requires in the first instance that the faculty of moral approval approve of its own workings. It then looks to whether our other faculties of approval can approve of the moral one: we seek a comprehensive endorsement, by all our modes of approval, of moral approval in particular. The second part of the test asks above all whether the faculty for prudential approval—the faculty by which we applaud or condemn things in accordance with self-interest—can applaud the moral faculty, since the latter often requires us to override our self-interest.

We should not assume that the first part of the test is trivial. Korsgaard quotes Hume’s declaration that our sense for morals

must certainly acquire new force, when reflecting on itself, it approves of those principles, from whence it is deriv’d, and finds nothing but what is great and good in its rise and origin, (Hume 1739–40, pp. 267–8)

and contrasts this with Hume’s earlier demonstration that the understanding, when reflecting on its own procedures, undermines itself (Korsgaard 1996, p. 62). So a faculty can fail a purely reflexive test: it can fail to live up to its own standards for evaluation. But the moral sense, for Hume, and the impartial spectator, for Smith, pass their own tests. Indeed, a good way to read TMS is to see Smith as demonstrating, to an impartial spectator in a moment of reflection, that the impartial spectator we use in the course of action operates in a reasonable and noble way—that, in particular, it is not just a tool of our self-interest.

At the same time, to meet the full reflective endorsement test, Smith needs to show that heeding the impartial spectator does not, overall, conflict with our self-interest. In order to show this he tries, like many ancient ethicists, to get us to re-think the nature of self-interest. If we consider our real interests, Smith maintains, we will see that the very question, “why should I be moral?,” with its implicit supposition that being moral is something I might want to avoid, is based on a misconception of self-interest. “The chief part of human happiness arises from the consciousness of being beloved” (TMS 41), Smith says, and being beloved normally requires acting in accordance with the demands of the impartial spectator. Violating those demands will also normally bring on internal unease—fear of discovery, pangs of conscience, and other disturbances—making it difficult to achieve the tranquility that Smith takes to be a prime component of happiness (TMS 149). Finally, if one fully incorporates the impartial spectator into oneself, one will discover that moral self-approbation is itself a great source of happiness. But if happiness consists so centrally in the approbation of others, and in self-approbation, there can be no reasonable conflict between pursuing happiness and pursuing morality. So the demands of our moral sentiments are justified, capable both of endorsing themselves and of being endorsed by our nonmoral sentiments.

It should be clear that this argument does not involve any reduction of morality to self-interest. For Smith, the agent who supposes that self-interest can be defined independently of morality, and morality then reduced to it, misunderstands the nature of self-interest. Such an agent lacks a well-developed impartial spectator within herself, and therefore fails to realize that acting in accordance with moral demands is essential to her own happiness. She will gain a better understanding of happiness only once she starts to engage in the pursuit of virtue. Smith explicitly says that the virtuous agent sees things that others do not (TMS 115–7, 146–8). Like the contemporary philosopher John McDowell, he thus suggests that the virtuous agent can properly see the point of virtue, and how virtue helps constitute happiness, only from a perspective within the actual practice of virtue. But, as McDowell says, there is no reason to think one can find better arguments, or indeed any arguments, for seeking virtue from a perspective outside of such practice (McDowell 1998a,b). There may therefore be a certain circularity to Smith’s defense of morality, as some of his critics have alleged, but the circularity is not a vicious one, and an entirely nonmoral defense of morality, which the critics seem to want, may be impossible.

Smith himself does not clearly spell out the responses proposed here to the philosophical problems that his theory raises. His strengths as a moral philosopher lie elsewhere. Moral philosophers need not be concerned solely with the grounds of morality. Displaying, clarifying, and showing the internal connections in the way we think about virtue is already a philosophical task, even if we set aside the question of whether that way of thinking is justified. There are indeed philosophers who reject the idea that philosophy is well-suited to offer justifications. Smith’s work fits in with the view of Iris Murdoch, who understood moral philosophy as consisting in the attempt “to fill in a systematic explanatory background to our ordinary moral life” (Murdoch 1970, p. 45). His astute and nuanced analysis of what goes into moral approval—of the sorts of factors the impartial spectator considers, of how it can deceive itself or otherwise go wrong, of how it develops and how it judges different virtues in different ways—is accomplishment enough, regardless of whether he adequately justifies the fact that we engage in such approval at all.

5. Smith’s Political Philosophy

It is clear from the end of TMS that Smith intended to complement it with a system of political philosophy, and it is clear from the Advertisement to the last edition of TMS that WN represents the partial but not complete fulfillment of that plan. Strikingly, what got left out was the part of political philosophy that most concerned Smith at the end of TMS, and that has most concerned other moral philosophers who turn to politics: a systematic account of justice. Smith’s lectures on jurisprudence dealt with this topic, and from the notes we have on those lectures, he seems to have hoped to build a comprehensive, universally-applicable theory of justice out of impartial-spectator judgments about property, contract, punishment, etc. But the manuscript drawn from these lectures was never finished, and he had it burned at his death. Some scholars speculate that the failure of this project was fore-ordained: the moral theory of TMS is too particularist to sustain a universally-applicable theory of justice (see Griswold 1999, pp. 256–8 and Fleischacker 2004, chapter 8). Others have tried to re-construct such a theory for Smith (see Haakonssen 1981 and 1996).

In any case, Smith concluded his lectures on jurisprudence with some extended remarks on “police”—public policy —and this he did, of course, work up into a book of its own. It is unclear, however, how much WN has to do with his philosophical concerns. Smith became increasingly interested in political economy after completing TMS, and WN can be seen as the fruition simply of a new direction in his research, unconnected to his moral system. He did come to a comprehensive, one might say philosophical, view of political economy: from his understanding of the workings of economics, he thought that states could foster the productiveness of their economies only by the rule of law, accompanied by a few limitations on banking practices, and should otherwise lift measures that restrict or encourage particular enterprises. The practical point of his treatise on economics was to urge this restrained, modest approach to economic intervention on governing officials. Smith did not favor as hands-off an approach as some of his self-proclaimed followers do today—he believed that states could and should re-distribute wealth to some degree, and defend the poor and disadvantaged against those who wield power over them in the private sector (see Fleischacker 2004, § 57)—but he certainly wanted the state to end all policies, common in his mercantilist day, designed to favor industry over agriculture, or some industries over others. Smith believed strongly in the importance of local knowledge to economic decision-making, and consequently thought that business should be left to businesspeople, who understand the particular situations in which they work far better than any government official (on this Hayek understood Smith well: see Hayek 1978 [1976] and C. Smith 2013). By the same token, governance should be kept out of the hands of businesspeople, since they are likely to use it to promote their particular interests, and not be concerned for the well-being of the citizenry as a whole: Smith’s opposition to the East India Company is based on this principle (see Muthu 2008).

Smith’s political views tend more generally towards a minimalist state. He did not want the state to micro-manage the economy, and he also did not want it to promote religion or virtue. He was suspicious of the motives and skills of politicians, and their ability, even when well-meaning, to change society (see Fleischacker 2004, chapter 11). And he did not believe that the political life was the crown of the moral life, or that law or political institutions can help people develop virtue.

One might therefore wonder whether there is any connection between his politics and his moral philosophy. Aside from the construction of theories of justice—which, as we have noted, Smith wound up not doing—there are three main reasons why moral philosophers write political theories. Some, like Aristotle, see morality as the cultivation of virtuous character and believe that the state can help people with this cultivation. Others, like Jeremy Bentham, see morality as maximizing human pleasure and believe that legal and political reform can contribute significantly toward that end. And still others, like Hegel, see morality as the expression of freedom and believe that states can embody the highest expression of freedom. But Smith believes none of these things. His conception of morality is quite Aristotelian, but for him the state can do little to help people achieve virtuous character. He shares neither Bentham’s reduction of the good life to the pleasurable life nor Bentham’s optimism about the likely effectiveness, for moral or hedonic purposes, of even much-reformed governments. And he never describes the state as an expression of freedom.

That leaves us with the possibility that Smith tries in WN precisely to try to cure his readers of the illusion that states have a moral function. There is a strong Stoic component to TMS, and we might say, in Stoic vein, that in WN Smith wants to help us see how much the society around us is out of our control. WN shows us the great degree to which social institutions and policies have unintended consequences, the central role, in particular, of unforeseeable factors in the workings of the market, and the fact that uncontrolled markets on the whole do well by all their participants. This allows us to become reconciled to allowing markets, and other social institutions, to run unfettered.

Smith is more of an Enlightenment progressive than this reading suggests, more of a believer that an enlightened understanding of their circumstances can help people improve those circumstances, but he had less faith in this notion than did most of his contemporaries. There are deep roots in his thought for a sceptical attitude towards progressivism. His belief in local knowledge leads him to be suspicious of large-scale plans for the reform of society. He also provides a number of reasons for doubting whether we can successfully set for ourselves clear goals for such reform. For most enlightenment thinkers, including Smith’s predecessors Hutcheson and Hume, what human beings desire seemed fairly obvious. For Smith, this is not so obvious. Smith believes that it is very difficult for us to know our true intentions (TMS 156–9), and that our desires are heavily shaped by social interaction. He also casts doubt on the degree to which we seek things that are truly useful to our ends. In a famous passage, he says that we are more interested in a thing’s apparent conduciveness to utility than in its actual utility (179–80). This observation serves as the jumping-off point for his first foray into economics. The “poor man’s son, whom heaven in its anger has visited with ambition” pursues wealth without knowing what it is really like, because it seems—falsely—to be useful (181–3). In several ways, then, Smith pictures human desires and aims as more opaque than do most other Enlightenment thinkers. This picture informs his distinctive account of society and history, moreover, according to which unintended consequences tend to be more important than intended ones and the course of history is correspondingly unknowable in advance. On such a view, it is futile for politicians to try to determine the future development of their societies. They do better restricting their activities to protecting individual liberty against violence—to defense and the administration of justice.

We might call this the libertarian reading of Smith, and it certainly captures an important element of his political philosophy. Smith gives justice priority over the other virtues in TMS (86), he begins his lectures on jurisprudence by saying that the maintenance of justice is “the first and chief design of every system of government” (Smith 1978, p. 5), and he brings in justice as a constraint on economic activity many times in WN (e.g., WN 157, 539, 687). But he does not say that the enforcement of justice is the sole job of government. The third of the tasks he gives to government in WN consists in “maintaining and erecting” a broad range of “publick works and … publick institutions” for the good of the whole society (WN 687–8). In TMS, the chapter often quoted as claiming that justice is the only virtue that may be enforced actually maintains only that “kindness or beneficence, … cannot, among equals, be extorted by force” (TMS 81). In a state “antecedent to the institution of civil government,” Smith says, no impartial spectator would approve of one person’s using force to make another act beneficently. But once civil government has been established, people may legitimately be forced to carry out at least the greatest and most obvious duties of beneficence. Smith says that

[t]he civil magistrate is entrusted with the power not only of … restraining injustice, but of promoting the prosperity of the commonwealth, by establishing good discipline, and by discouraging every sort of vice and impropriety; he may prescribe rules, therefore, which not only prohibit mutual injuries among fellow-citizens, but command mutual good offices to a certain degree. (81, emphasis added)

Smith warns against taking this license for a general promotion of virtue too far—that, he says, would be “destructive of all liberty, security, and justice”—but he also says that neglecting it will lead “to many gross disorders and shocking enormities” (TMS 81). These enormities may well include the misery of the poor, a central concern of Smith’s in WN. Smith had no principled objections to government power being used to help the poor, and indeed proposed a number of policies with that in mind. It should be remembered that the idea that governments might massively re-distribute wealth out of fairness to the poor was not on the agenda in Smith’s time. Only in the 1790s, after Smith died, did Jeremy Bentham and Tom Paine offer their groundbreaking poverty programs; the socialism of Robert Owen and Charles Fourier lay another generation in the future. Until the late eighteenth century, most writers on the role of government vis-à-vis the poor maintained that governments should keep the poor in poverty, so that they show proper respect to their superiors and not waste money on drink. Smith had more influence than anyone else in changing this attitude—he was one of the earliest and most fervent champions of the rights and virtues of the poor, arguing against wage caps and other constraints that kept the poor from rising socially and economically (see Baugh 1983 and Fleischacker 2004, chapter 10).

Smith also had a more restricted conception of individual rights than do contemporary libertarians. Taxation does not count as any sort of threat to property rights, for him—he indeed describes paying taxes as “a badge … of liberty” (WN 857)—nor does the government’s mere support for certain ideas and values count as an infringement of the right to conscience. Although it may be inefficient and otherwise unwise, it is not unjust for the government to intervene in the economy on behalf of one or another commercial interest, to spread propaganda for one or another conception of virtue, or even to establish a religion. Smith of course opposes economic intervention of this kind and thinks it better if governments do not establish religions, but his views on these issues stem from concerns other than justice. Moreover, he favors militia training to instill courage in people, state incentives urging people to study science and philosophy, and state encouragement for secular amusements—the latter two as an “antidote to the poison of [religious] enthusiasm and superstition.” (WN 796) So Smith’s state is not a neutral one, in the modern sense, and it is not wholly uninterested in the promotion of virtue.

Why, then, does Smith recommend such a minimal state? The interventions just listed are practically the only ones he urges in WN, and even in those cases, Smith calls for limited state action. Why allow governments to go so far, and no farther?

The first answer to that is that Smith did not think government officials were competent to handle much beside the needs of defense and the administration of justice. Smith’s writings are permeated by a lack of respect for the sorts of people who go into politics: for the vanity that leads them to seek fame and power, for the presumption by which they regard themselves as morally superior to others, and for the arrogance by which they think they know the people’s interests and needs better than the people do themselves. He also believes that politicians tend to be manipulated by the preaching of merchants who do not have the good of the nation as a whole at heart (WN 266–7), and that they can rarely know enough to guide large numbers of people. Correlatively, Smith has a great respect for the competence and virtue of common people. He shows no trace of the thought, common at the time and strongly held by Hutcheson, that a class of wise and virtuous people ought to rule over the common herd.

In addition, Smith holds that social sanctions can do a better job at many tasks that other thinkers expected of political sanctions. His rich account in TMS of the way that spectators around us shape us morally enables him to hold that governments need not teach virtue. Society, independent of governmental power, will do that on its own. Thus sumptuary laws are unnecessary because the desire to maintain or increase one’s social status will keep most people prudent and frugal (WN 341–6). Thus religious groups that spontaneously arise without government assistance do a better job of inculcating virtues than their government-supported counterparts (WN 792–6). And thus—implicitly—the civic republican obsession with a citizen militia is overwrought because the habits of self-command inculcated by military service can also be achieved, for most people, by the social interactions of the market (see Fleischacker 1999, pp. 153–6, 169–72).

Finally, Smith limits the activities of governments because he considers it crucial to the development of virtue that people have plenty of room to act, and shape their feelings, on their own. Becoming a good human being is ultimately a task that each individual must take up for him or herself. People develop better moral judgment by actually making moral judgments (WN 782–3, 788), and virtue requires the practice of virtue (TMS 324); we cannot achieve these things simply by following the say-so of an authority. So exercises of power tend to be inimical to moral development, and governments should use their power mostly to minimize the degree to which power gets exercised elsewhere.

Indeed, for Smith, governments can best encourage virtue precisely by refraining from encouraging virtue. In TMS, the person who merely tries to appear virtuous, whether out of fear of the law or out of fear of social disapproval, is not really virtuous. But there is a sliding scale here. One who acts virtuously out of concern for the praise and blame of her neighbors is not as virtuous as one who is concerned to be praise-worthy in the eyes of an impartial spectator, but one who acts virtuously out of concern for legal sanctions is worse than either of the other two. As long as neighbors know each other reasonably well, their approval and disapproval will normally take into account the particular circumstances, the peculiar history and psychology, of the individuals they judge—their judgments will reflect, say, the difference in gratitude due to a loudly self-pitying parent as opposed to a truly long-suffering one. Legal sanctions are blunt instruments that cannot attend to such subtleties. So social approval is more likely than legal approval to pick out the right sort of actions to mark for moral worth. Furthermore, since social sanctions are milder than legal sanctions—it is much easier to ignore a neighbor’s disapproval than a threat of imprisonment—people who care about social sanctions display better character than people who can be motivated to good action only by the law. The pressure of social sanctions is more like, and more likely to draw one towards, the pressure of conscience. Even if concern for social approval is not the ideal motivation for moral action, therefore, it is at least some sign of good character, and a step along the way to the motivations of the fully virtuous person. Legal sanctions by contrast affect our physical well-being and social standing so severely that they drive out all thought of the sanctions of conscience. A government concerned to foster virtue in its citizens should therefore aim as much as possible to remove its own sanctions from the pursuit of virtue. Governments foster virtue best where they refuse, directly, to foster virtue at all: just as they protect economic development best where they refuse, directly, to protect that development. This ironic conception of government power runs through Smith’s political thinking. Accordingly, his main political object in writing WN is to instill modesty in policy-makers, to urge them to take on only very limited, well-defined tasks, and to recognize that the flourishing of their society does not, on the whole, much depend on them.

In sum, if Smith’s political philosophy looks like libertarianism, it is a libertarianism aimed at different ends, and grounded in different moral views, than that of most contemporary libertarians. Today, many libertarians are suspicious of the notion that individuals ought to develop virtues expected of them by others: beyond, at least, those virtues that are needed for the functioning of the market and the liberal state themselves. Smith does not share this attitude. He is far from an agnostic about what a good human life looks like, let alone an enthusiast for a conception of the good life that eschews virtue in favor of preference-satisfaction. He is not a positivist sceptical of the significance of moral argument, like Milton Friedman, nor a hedonist, like Bentham and his followers, nor a radical individualist, like the followers of Ayn Rand. Any decent human life, he believes, requires certain virtues, and depends on a respect and love of individuals for the people around them. If he encourages governments, nevertheless, to refrain from promoting virtue, that is because he thinks that social forces can effectively achieve that end without government help, and that legal sanctions are in any case useless or counter-productive for the promotion of virtue. So he may arrive at some libertarian conclusions, but not in the way that most libertarians do.

6. Conclusion

Smith has an account of the nature of moral judgment, and its development, that is richer and subtler than Hume’s; he offers a prototype for modern Aristotelianism in morality; he brings out the importance of the imagination to moral development as few other philosophers have done; he is an early and forceful promoter of the notion that history is guided largely by unintended consequences; and he derives from these views an unusual variant of liberal politics. Few of these contributions are spelled out with the clarity and tight argumentation that contemporary philosophers demand of their canonical figures, but Smith compensates for this weakness by the humanity and thoughtfulness of his views, by their detachment from metaphysical commitments, and by an abundance of historical and imaginative detail. The richness of his ideas, and their quiet plausibility, earn him a place among the most important of modern moral and political philosophers.


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