Spinoza’s Modal Metaphysics

First published Tue Aug 21, 2007; substantive revision Tue Jun 6, 2023

Spinoza’s views on necessity and possibility, which he claimed were the “principal foundation” of his Ethics (Ep75), have been less than well received by his readers, to put it mildly. From Spinoza’s contemporaries to our own, readers of the Ethics have denounced Spinoza’s views on modality as metaphysically confused at best, ethically nihilistic at worst.[1] However, expressing matters this way implies that there is a consensus about Spinoza’s metaphysics of modality, with interpreters differing only to the extent to which they distance themselves from his outrageous position. A cursory reading of certain passages of the Ethics supports the belief that, if Spinoza is clear anywhere, it is surely in his views of necessity and contingency. After all, this is the philosopher who claims that “in nature there is nothing contingent, but all things have been determined from the necessity of the divine nature to exist and produce an effect in a certain way” (Ip29) and that “things could have been produced by God in no other way, and in no other order than they have been produced” (Ip33). Passages such as these suggest that Spinoza was a necessitarian, according to whom falsity and impossibility are co-extensive. The actual world, we might now say, is the only possible world. Events could not, in the strongest sense of that expression, have gone any differently than they in fact have gone.

And yet, such a picture of the interpretive landscape would be quite misleading. Spinoza studies have seen a renaissance of interest in his views on modality, spawning in recent years many articles and chapters devoted to his modal views. From this boon of research and interest (relative to Spinoza studies), considerable disagreement has emerged about Spinoza’s modal commitments. Much of this disagreement stems from larger interpretive disagreements about Spinoza’s metaphysics. By examining Spinoza’s views on modality, we will also explore several of his most central metaphysical views.

After a brief introduction, this entry begins with Spinoza’s views on the distribution of modal properties (section 2). With respect to substances (2.1), Spinoza claims that every possible substance necessarily exists. Spinoza’s argument for this conclusion is part of his larger argument for substance monism—the view that only one substance exists, God. Spinoza’s view about the modal status of modes, his other main ontological category, is far more controversial (2.2). Explaining this controversy leads into the heart of Spinoza’s metaphysics and involves his views on causation, inherence, God, ontological plenitude and the principle of sufficient reason. Although the question of whether Spinoza was a necessitarian is the predominant topic of discussion in the recent secondary literature on Spinoza’s modal views, Spinoza also sketches interesting accounts of the nature of modality (section 3) and the ground of modality (section 4) that shed fresh light on his modal commitments. Though understudied by recent interpreters, these topics were of interest to Spinoza’s peers and remain vibrant research questions in contemporary metaphysics of modality.

1. The Distribution of Modality

Spinoza’s list of the basic types of existing things is exceedingly short: substances and modes (Ip4d).[2] Spinoza gives two extremely different, but equally striking accounts of how many tokens exist under each of these two basic types. There is only one existing substance, God, and there are infinitely many modes. Without yet unpacking these claims, we might ask Spinoza, “But could there have been more substances or fewer modes than there in fact are?” Or, keeping the number of tokens fixed, “Could there have been a different substance or different modes than the ones that in fact exist?” Surprisingly, Spinoza seems inclined to answer “no” to these questions. If so, then Spinoza thinks the actual world is the only possible world. This is the position of necessitarianism, a belief that few in the history of Western philosophy have explicitly embraced. And for good reason — on the face of it, necessaritianism is highly counterintuitive. Surely the world could have gone slightly differently than it has gone. Couldn’t the Allies have lost WWII? Couldn’t a leaf have landed an eighth of a centimeter farther to the right than it in fact landed? Similarly, surely the world could have contained different individuals in different numbers than it in fact contains. Couldn’t Leibniz have had a sister or not been born at all?

Spinoza was aware of how deeply against the grain of common sense the truth of necessitarianism would run. If he nonetheless believed in its truth, he must have thought he had very compelling reasons for doing so. What might such reasons be? We will begin with substance necessitarianism (2.1) and then turn to the necessity of modes (2.2). Although the case for interpreting Spinoza as a mode necessitarian is strong, there are also Spinoza-friendly reasons for resisting such a reading. Seeing this tension will lead us into the middle of an interpretive controversy that has ramifications for understanding many of Spinoza’s other central metaphysical views. (In section 2, we will undercover one possible way of reconciling Spinoza’s drive towards necessitarianism with what might have been equally important reasons for avoiding it.)

1.1 Substances

In the case of substances, Spinoza claims that every existing substance necessarily exists (Ip7d). No existing substance could have failed to exist. He also claims that only one substance, God, actually exists and that only this one substance could have existed (Ip14). Putting these claims together, Spinoza believes that every possible substance necessarily exists. Since God is the only possible substance, it is impossible for any other substance besides God to exist.

Spinoza’s argument for these conclusions can be divided into two major stages:

  1. Every possible substance necessarily exists.
  2. God is the only possible substance.

Let us consider Spinoza’s reasoning for each of these steps in turn, as doing so will help us understand some of Spinoza’s most important and basic metaphysical commitments.

In arguing for (1), Spinoza relies on two implicit and related premises. One is the principle of sufficient reason (PSR) and the other involves his account of causation. Put roughly, the PSR states that every fact has a reason for obtaining; in slogan form, there are no brute facts. Most relevantly for our purposes, if something existed for no reason at all, the fact that it exists would be inexplicable, a violation for the PSR. And for parallel reasons, if something did not exist and there was no reason for its non-existence, the fact of its non-existence would also be a violation of the PSR. As Spinoza puts it, “For each thing there must be assigned a cause or reason, both for its existence [if it exists] and for its non-existence [if it does not exist]. For example, if a triangle exists, there must be a reason or cause why it exists; but if it does not exist, there must also be a reason or cause which prevents it from existing, or which takes its existence away” (Ip11d). Thus, according to the PSR, there must be sufficient reasons why each existing substance exists and also sufficient reasons why non-existing substances do not exist.

The second implicit premise of Spinoza’s argument for the claim that all possible substances necessarily exist is that causes provide (or just are) necessary and sufficient explanatory reasons. This idea appears in the previously quoted passage in which Spinoza claims that citing a “cause or reason” suffices for explaining facts about the existence and non-existence of a triangular object. Applied to the case of substance, the sufficient reason for why a substance exists is supplied by the causes of that substance.

Why does Spinoza think that an account of an object’s causes explains that object’s existence? His most revealing answer traces back to the PSR as well. Because facts about the nature of causation are facts, by the PSR, facts about causation require explanation too. In a case in which x causes y, the PSR demands an explanation of what it is in virtue of which the causal relation between x and y obtains. Although one may try to answer this question by appealing to other causes (say, z’s causing x to cause y), the PSR also demands an account of what it is in virtue of which x and y are causally related, as opposed to being merely sequentially ordered (or an account of why mere sequential ordering is sufficient for causal relatedness). That is, the PSR applies not only to facts about existence, but also to facts about relations between existents. (This point will be extremely important for correctly understanding Spinoza’s modal theory in section 2 below.) The PSR asks not only for an explanation of the fact that x causes y in terms of prior first-order causes, but also for an explanation of why there is a causal relation of dependence between x and y and why it is not some other kind of relation. As it would not get us very far to answer by appealing to yet further first-order causal relations, the PSR is really demanding an account of causation itself. Causation, if the PSR is true, cannot be a primitive metaphysical relation. So, to echo a question that lingers today, just what is causation? (For more on the contemporary discussion, see the entry on the metaphysics of causation. For more on the PSR and causation, see Della Rocca (2010)).

Unsurprisingly, Spinoza does not treat causation as a metaphysical primitive. Instead, he provides an account of causation in terms of something else. In Id1, Spinoza defines self-causation (causa sui) as “that whose essence involves existence or [sive] that whose nature cannot be conceived except as existing.” (Spinoza’s sive should not be read in a disjunctive sense, nor is it usually stating a mere equivalence. What follows the “or” is often a fuller account of what precedes it. Think of it as an “or better yet…”) Expanding his definition to cover causation in general, Spinoza’s idea is that causation is a matter of “involvement” or conceptual connection. If x causes y, this fact obtains in virtue of a conceptual connection between the concept of x and the concept of y.[3] Spinoza frequently suggests that the conceiving through relation is the paradigm of explanation (e.g., Ia5, IIp5, IIp7s). If so, then we can understand why Spinoza thinks causes serve as sufficient explanatory reasons for facts about existence. If causal relations are conceptual relations, and if conceptual relations are paradigms of explanation, then to give an account of an object’s existence in terms of its causes is to explain the fact that it exists in just the way the PSR demands.

Let us apply this point to the case of substances. Spinoza reasons that existing substances exist in virtue of having causes that bring about and explain their existence, and non-existing substances do not exist in virtue of causes that prevent their existence and explain their non-existence (Ip14). According to Spinoza’s account of causation, this means that existing substances exist in virtue of conceptual relations to whatever explains their existence, and, similarly, conceptual relations explain the non-existence of non-existing substances. What causes or explains the existence or non-existence of a substance?

Spinoza argues that substances are conceptually, and hence causally, isolated from one another (Ip2–Ip5). He infers from this that substances cannot be caused to exist or be prevented from existing by any other substance (Ip6). But since all existing substances must nonetheless have causes and reasons for their existence, the fact that a substance exists must be explained entirely by the substance itself. That is, all existing substances must be self-caused and hence self-explained (Ip7). For parallel reasons, the non-existence of a non-existing substance must be explained solely through facts about the non-existing substance. The concepts of non-existing substances must include the explanation for their own non-existence. What about the concept of a non-existing substance could explain that substance’s non-existence? Spinoza’s answer: a self-contradiction. Non-existing substances do not exist for the same reason that squared circles do not exist in Euclidean space: they are conceptually impossible (Ip11d). From the fact of non-existence plus the PSR, Spinoza concludes that non-existing substances do not exist because it is impossible for them to exist. They cannot cause themselves to exist because their very concepts contain a contradiction, and facts about causation track facts about conceptual involvement and explanation.

So, returning to our opening questions, could there have been more substances than there in fact are? Spinoza’s answer is “no,” which means that there are no merely possible substances. A substance either exists or its existence is impossible. Could an existing substance have failed to exist? Again, Spinoza’s answer is “no,” since the only available explanatory basis for its possible non-existence would be facts about the substance itself. But if an existing substance is completely causally isolated, what could bring about its non-existence? Only itself, Spinoza answers, which would amount to the concept of that substance containing an internal contradiction that would prevent such a substance from existing in the first place (Ip7). Spinoza even denies that a substance could exist for a certain length of time and then go out of existence, since that would imply that it caused its own self-destruction, a violation of Spinoza’s doctrine that “No thing can be destroyed except through an external cause” (IIIp4). In reaching all of these conclusions, Spinoza relies on the self-explaining or self-causing nature of substances and the explanatory demands of the PSR. Spinoza concludes that for any existing substance, it could not have failed to exist nor can it cease to exist. Hence, if a substance exists, it necessarily exists (Ip7d). On the other hand, if a substance does not exist, its existence is impossible. Combining these conclusions, we reach (1): every possible substance necessarily exists.

Here is a sketch of the main steps of this argument:

  1. There must be a sufficient reason why each existing substance exists and a sufficient reason why non-existing substances do not exist [PSR; see Ip11d].
  2. Causes provide necessary and sufficient reasons for the existence and non-existence of substances [nature of causation and PSR; see Ip11d].
  3. Substances are causally isolated [Ip6].
  4. If a substance exists, it is self-caused [3–5; see Ip7].
  5. If a substance is self-caused, its existence is necessary [nature of necessity and self-causation; see Ip7d and Id1].
  6. If a substance exists, it necessarily exists [6–7].
  7. If a substance does not exist, its non-existence is explained entirely by facts about the concept of its nature [3–5 and nature of causation; see Ip11d].
  8. If facts about the concept of a thing’s nature entirely explains its non-existence, then the concept of its nature contains a contradiction [nature of concepts and explanation; see Ip11d].
  9. If a substance does not exist, then the concept of its nature contains a contradiction [9–10].
  10. If the concept of a thing’s nature contains a contradiction, then its existence is not possible [intuition; see Ip11d].
  11. If a substance does not exist, then its existence is not possible [11–12]
  1. Therefore, every possible substance necessarily exists [8 and 13].

The second major stage of Spinoza’s argument is to prove that God is the only possible substance. We will not here rehearse all the details of Spinoza’s argument to this conclusion (for two discussions, see Lin 2007 and Della Rocca 2001). Like his argument for (1), Spinoza’s argument for (2) relies on the PSR. Here is one sketch of Spinoza’s overall argument for (2):

  1. At least one substance exists.[4]
  2. The concept of God is the concept of the most real substance with the most power and greatest reason for existing [Id6, Ip9, and Ip11d].
  3. The concept of God is internally consistent [assumption].
  4. It would be inexplicable if the internally consistent concept of the most real substance with the most power and greatest reason for existing was not instantiated while the concept of a substance with less power and less reason for existing was instantiated [Ip11d].
  5. Nothing is inexplicable [PSR].
  6. Therefore, the concept of God is instantiated [14–18].
  7. Therefore, God necessarily exists [1 and 19].
  8. The existence of God and the existence of other substances are not compossible [20 and Ip5].
  1. Therefore, God is the only possible substance [20–21].

Of these steps, premise (16) is the one for which Spinoza offers the least explicit justification:

Since, then, there can be, outside the divine nature, no reason or cause which takes away the divine existence, the reason [for its non-existence] will necessarily have to be in his nature itself, if indeed he does not exist. That is, his nature would involve a contradiction. But it is absurd to affirm this of a Being absolutely infinite and supremely perfect (Ip11d, emphasis mine).

The absurdity Spinoza points to is actually the absurdity of the non-existence of a being according to whose concept it is infinite and supremely perfect. But why accept that the concept of Spinoza’s God is internally consistent? If Spinoza fails to justify this assumption, his ontological argument would fall victim to Leibniz’s complaint that even if otherwise successful, (pre-Leibnizian) ontological arguments prove only a hypothetical truth: if God is a possible substance, then God necessarily exists. Spinoza’s argument, absent a justification of (16), fails to establish the possibility of God before asserting the necessity of God’s existence.

Even worse, Spinoza faces an especially thorny problem in justifying (16). For his account of the concept of God in (15) relies on commitments that even those friendly to theism, such as Descartes, would reject. Spinoza defines God in Id6 as “a substance consisting of an infinity of attributes, of which each one expresses an eternal and infinite essence.” Spinoza claims in Ip9, without any explicit argument, “The more reality or being each thing [unaquaeque res] has, the more attributes belong to it.” This definition of God and the supporting principle in Ip9 were highly controversial. According to Descartes, a substance cannot have more than one (principal) attribute.[5] To say that the concept of God is the concept of a substance with multiple (principal) attributes is, in fact, to appeal to an internally inconsistent concept. So, the objection runs, not only has Spinoza failed to justify (16), but (15) is outright false.

Spinoza’s defense of (15) would likely be to appeal to the self-containment of each attribute (Della Rocca 2001). Like substance, each attribute is a wholly self-contained and self-sufficient way of conceiving substance (Ip10). Given such rigid containment, Spinoza would press, how could the fact that a substance has one attribute preclude that substance from having additional attributes? If there are no explanatory or conceptual relations between the attribute of thought and the attribute of extension, the fact that a substance is thinking cannot explain why that substance could not also be extended. The lack of a reason for excluding an attribute is part of Spinoza’s reason for including all possible attributes as attributes of God. However, even if he can defend the rigid self-containment of attributes, Spinoza will also need a positive reason for including them all together as attributes of a single substance.

This brings us back to Ip9 and the other objectionable aspect of (16). Why should perfection or reality and strength of reason to exist correspond to possessing a greater number of attributes? Spinoza does not offer any explicit defense of this correlation. The demonstration of Ip9 simply refers readers back to the definition of an attribute (see also Ep9). Here is one possible way Spinoza might motivate the correlation between number of attributes and perfection / reason for existing. The principle in Ip9 may be that to the extent to which a single thing [unaquaeque res] can be expressed by a greater number of attributes, to that extent it is more perfect, and hence is more real (IId6) and has greater reason for existing (Ip11s). Spinoza’s emphatic “unaquaeque” may point to the idea that perfection involves both unity and diversity. To the degree to which one and the same thing can sustain a greater variety of expressions of it, to that extent it is more perfect. The maximal perfection and reality of God, on this account, is partly constituted by the fact that God’s self-identity is compatible with a plentitude of incommensurable expressions – infinitely many attributes – of it. This view of metaphysical perfection, one which tries to maximize both identity and diversity, is very similar to Leibniz’s account of perfection as harmony, a principle that Leibniz explains as “diversity compensated by identity.”[6] On this reading, God’s metaphysical perfection for Spinoza is the perfection of Leibniz’s most harmonious world, the perfection of maintaining both the one and the many (Newlands 2018).

Whether or not Spinoza fully succeeds in defending the consistency of his concept of God, the striking modal conclusion he draws from it is clear: “Except God, no substance can be or be conceived” (Ip14). This statement captures Spinoza’s substance monism and his substance necessitarianism: there is only one possible substance, God, and that substance necessarily exists.

1.2 Modes

Immediately after wrapping up his proof for substance monism in Ip14, Spinoza claims in the next proposition that “Whatever is, is in God, and nothing can be or be conceived without God” (Ip15). By the definition of a mode in Id5, Ip15 implies that everything that exists other than God is a mode or affection of God. To understand the import of this claim, it is important to understand what a mode is and what is it for a mode to be in a substance, for Spinoza.

A natural way to think about modes is as a certain kind of property. The circular shape of the coin is a mode of that coin. On this reading, being circular is a state of the coin, a particularized way that the coin is. Spinoza’s claim that modes are “in” their substances also suggests that modes inhere in substances akin to the way that properties inhere in things, and that modes are therefore predicable of substances as subjects of predication. Circularity, we might say, inheres in the coin and the coin is circular. Of course, there is an extremely wide range of views about properties and property-bearers (see the entry on properties), so claiming that modes are akin to properties that inhere in substances will not answer all questions. But even putting aside questions about inherence, property instantiation, and predication relations, it may seem like Spinoza has made a colossal blunder in Ip15. After all, how can a table or human being be anything like a property? How can I inhere in something else? What sense would it make to say of something — a substance — that it is Sam Newlandsish in the same sense in which I say of it that it is round? If there is such a thing as a “category mistake,” this may seem like an especially clear case of one.[7]

It would be disappointing if this objection simply assumed from the outset that (a) objects like tables and human beings are substances and (b) substances neither inhere in nor are predicable of other substances. Spinoza agrees with (b), but he has already argued pace (a) that there can be only one substance. It would be unfair to grant him that conclusion in Ip14 and then insist upon reading Ip15 that other things still ought to have all the features of substances. (Of course, these intuitive concerns may well provide reasons to reconsider Spinoza’s arguments for Ip14.)

Interpreters have tried to make sense of Spinoza’s identification of everyday objects with modes without presupposing the denial of his substance monism. One strategy would be to deny that Spinoza intends anything like property, inherence and predication by his identification of everyday objects with modes of God. On this interpretation, Spinoza’s claims about modes and “in” in Ip15 are really just claims about the causal dependence of all things on God (Curley 1969). Everyday objects inhere in God in the sense that they depend causally on God. When Spinoza claims, “Whatever is, is in God,” he really means only that everything is causally dependent on God, a fantastically unremarkable claim in the 17th century. Indeed, as others have objected (Bennett 1991, Carriero 1995, Melamed 2009), this proposal makes Spinoza’s claim in Ip15 so unremarkable that it is hard to see why Spinoza went to such obfuscating lengths to phrase his ontology in terms of modes and inherence in the first place, since he had the categories of efficient causation and dependent beings at his disposal.

A different strategy (Carriero 1995) preserves the inherence link between modes and properties, but understands Spinoza’s modes as particularized accidents or, in contemporary terms, tropes (see the entry on tropes). According to this reading, collections of particularized properties constitute everyday objects for Spinoza. Although such bundles of tropes inhere in substance, they are not predicable of substance. Hence, although I inhere in substance, it is not the case that substance is Sam Newlandsish, whatever that may mean. Whereas the first interpretation explained inherence as nothing but efficient causation, this reading tries to keep causation and inherence intensionally (though perhaps not extensionally) distinct metaphysical dependence relations.

Another, more circuitous option begins with a functional account of modes in Spinoza’s ontology. The function of modes, according to passages like Ip25c, is to provide ways of expressing or conceiving the power of substance. Perhaps Spinoza actually provides an analysis of inherence in terms of this expressive or conceptual relation, similar to the way in which he provides an analysis of causation in terms of conceptual connection. Consider, for instance, Id3, in which Spinoza defines substance as that which is “[a] in itself and [b] is conceived through itself, that is, [c] that whose concept does not require the concept of another thing from which it must be formed” (the brackets are mine). Instead of leaving inherence as an unprincipled primitive relation of metaphysical dependence (pace the PSR), one could read [c] as providing an analysis of both [a] and [b]. One thing inheres in another in virtue of being conceived through it, which, like causation, is a matter of conceptual involvement. That everyday objects are modes inhering in and predicated of substance is extensionally and intensionally equivalent to everyday objects being conceived through substance. Whereas Curley’s interpretation took causation to be Spinoza’s underlying account of inherence, this interpretation takes conceptual involvement to be Spinoza’s underlying account of both inherence and causation (for defense, see Newlands 2010a; for dissents, see DiPoppa 2013, Melamed 2012 and Laerke 2011).

Although we will not try to settle this debate here, different interpretations of Spinoza’s category of modes will yield different accounts of his views on the necessity of modes. For purposes of ease and neutrality, we will frequently refer to modes as “objects,” which are intended to be a neutral placeholder for “whatever else exists besides substance.”

1.2.1 The Modality of Modes: An Overview

Earlier, it was noted that Spinoza thinks infinitely many non-substantial objects exist: “From the necessity of the divine nature there must follow infinitely many things in infinitely many ways, i.e., everything which can fall under an infinite intellect” (Ip16). Although Spinoza means more by “infinite” than simply “exhaustive,” he clearly intends “exhaustive” as well. How many objects are there? “As many as there can be together” is Spinoza’s basic reply. That is, Spinoza endorses a principle of ontological plenitude (POP), according to which the greatest number of compossible non-substantial objects actually exists. Part of Spinoza’s motivation for POP may derive from the PSR itself, since if the actual world were sub-maximal, non-existing but intrinsically possible objects would have no reason for not existing, which would be a brute fact. Perhaps it would also be an undesirable brute fact if (per impossibile) a maximal world with fewer objects than the actual world existed; what would explain God’s realization of a smaller maximal collection when a larger maximal collection is possible (see Ip33s2)? In any case, Spinoza’s POP implies that the number of existing objects is necessarily fixed.

Although this is already quite a strong conclusion, it does not yet rise to the level of full-blown necessitarianism with respect to modes. There are still at least three possible sources of contingency for the maximally full world of modes, each of which would be compatible with POP. Alternative possibility 1 (AP1): There could have been a different collection of modes, equal in size to the actually existing collection, but with entirely different members. Alternative possibility 2 (AP2): For some proper subset of the collection of actually existing modes, there could have been a different, equinumerous proper subset of modes instead. Alternative possibility 3 (AP3): One or more of the actual modes could have had different characteristics than it in fact has.

To illustrate, let the collection of shirts hanging in my closet stand for the collection of modes. Suppose that my closet could not contain more or fewer shirts than it currently contains— my closet is as full as it can get and I’m the sort of person who could never have fewer shirts than the most that can all fit in there together. Still, couldn’t I have had an entirely different but equinumerous collection of shirts (AP1)? Or, keeping some of the shirts fixed, couldn’t I have had a modest blue shirt instead of the orange plaid shirt sitting there in the middle (AP2)? Or, keeping all the shirts in the closet fixed, couldn’t the orange plaid shirt have had a single pocket instead of having the two pockets that it actually has (AP3)?

Necessitarianism requires not only the necessity of the number of existents; it demands the necessity of each member and the necessity of all of its characteristics. Hence, even given POP and Ip16, it remains an open question whether Spinoza wants to deny that there are any alternative possibilities for modes. Am I really stuck with the exact shirts I’ve got, double-pocketed orange plaid and all?

To understand why Spinoza might be attracted to mode necessitarianism, we need to consider a few additional details of his ontology of modes. I have been lumping modes together into a single ontological category: everything that is not a substance. But Spinoza sometimes distinguishes between two types of modes, infinite modes and finite modes. Unfortunately, Spinoza gives only a very sparse account of infinite modes in the Ethics, and he makes very few explicit textual references to them outside the Ethics.[8] When Georg Schuller wrote to Spinoza to ask him for examples of these curious entities, Spinoza replied with obscure gems like “the face of the whole universe” and “absolutely infinite intellect” (Ep64). If the best elucidation of a philosophical doctrine makes reference to “the face of the whole universe,” that may be a good sign that the doctrine needs further development. Unfortunately for Spinoza’s readers, infinite modes appear to do some significant work in his metaphysics, so they cannot simply be ignored if one wants to understand Spinoza’s modal commitments.

1.2.2 Infinite modes

The most salient feature of infinite modes is that they are more directly related to substance than finite modes are. Spinoza claims that infinite modes follow more or less directly from “the absolute nature of any of God’s attributes,” whereas finite modes do not follow from the absolute nature of God’s attributes (see Ip21–22 and Ip28d). According to some interpreters, understanding this distinction is the key to understanding whether or not Spinoza was a full-blown necessitarian.

At first glance, Spinoza’s picture seems clear enough. (We will continue to ignore the complicating role of attributes.) Some modes follow directly from the absolute nature of substance. Interpreters frequently call these immediate infinite modes (Ip21). Other modes follow directly from those immediate infinite modes. These are commonly called mediate infinite modes (Ip22). There is then a gap of some kind, and on the other side of the gap is the maximally full collection of finite modes. Unlike the infinite modes, particular finite modes do not follow, either directly or indirectly, from the absolute nature of substance.

The distinction between infinite and finite modes is relevant for Spinoza’s views on modality because of what he says about the modal status of infinite modes. Spinoza reasons that if an object necessarily follows from something that necessarily exists, then that object also necessarily exists (Ip21). This sounds similar to a familiar and widely accepted modal distribution axiom: \((\Box p \amp \Box(p \to q)) \to \Box q\). According to this reasoning, if God necessarily exists, and if the existence of a mode follows necessarily from the existence and nature of God, then that mode necessarily exists too. Of course, we need not and should not interpret Spinoza’s following-from relation as the strict logical entailment of contemporary modal logic. The main point is that necessity transfers down the following-from chain, according to Spinoza. If x necessarily exists and if y necessarily follows from x, then y necessarily exists too. For ease, one may call this the modal transfer principle. (Later, we will try to gain a better understanding of exactly why Spinoza thinks the modal transfer principle works.)

Notice that both conjuncts of the modal transfer principle must be satisfied for it to apply. That is, for the modal transfer principle to apply to some y, it must be the case that both (i) y follows necessarily from x and (ii) x exists necessarily. Hence, if God exists necessarily and if the existence of Bruce Springsteen follows necessarily from God’s existence, then Springsteen exists necessarily too. Whatever differences there may be between a thing that exists necessarily in virtue of its own nature and a thing that exists necessarily in virtue of following from something else that exists necessarily, that distinction is wholly internal to necessity. Differences between external and internal sources of necessity, a difference to which Spinoza sometimes draws attention (Ip33s), does not entail differences in type of necessity or even strength of necessity, and Spinoza nowhere says that it does.

Spinoza’s modal transfer principle appeals to the relation of following-from. To a contemporary reader, this might sound like a relation of logical entailment, but Spinoza clearly understands it to be some kind of causal relation (e.g., Ip16c, Ip28d). This means that Spinoza’s following-from relation shares the features of his causal relations, including the fact that causal relations involve necessary connections between relata (Ia3). That is, if y follows from x, then y necessarily follows from x. Furthermore, Spinoza claims that every mode follows from something else (Ip16 and Ip36). Therefore, every mode necessarily follows from something else, in which case condition (i) of the modal transfer principle is satisfied for every mode. This does not yet entail necessitarianism, however, for we still need to determine whether condition (ii) is universally satisfied as well. Each mode necessarily follows from something else, but does what it follows from exist necessarily?

In the case of existing infinite modes, Spinoza’s answer is clearly affirmative. In Ip22, Spinoza claims that so-called “immediate” infinite modes follow from something that exists necessarily, namely substance. Therefore, by the modal transfer principle, every existing immediate infinite mode exists necessarily. Furthermore, Spinoza claims that every so-called “mediate” infinite mode follows from something that exists necessarily (namely, an immediate infinite mode), so every mediate infinite mode exists necessarily as well (Ip23). In short, because there is a chain of necessary dependence stretching from substance to every existing infinite mode, every existing infinite mode exists necessarily.

Once again, even this strong modal conclusion is not equivalent to full-blown necessitarianism regarding infinite modes. Even if every existing infinite mode necessarily exists, could there have been other infinite modes as well? While there may not be any texts in which Spinoza explicitly rules this out, it is easy to imagine what he would say. Non-actual infinite modes do not exist necessarily, or else they would actually exist, on the plausible assumption that necessity entails actuality \((\Box p \to p).\) So, for reductio, consider a non-actual possible world, \(w^*\), that contains Sophia, one of these extra, non-actual infinite modes. What is the manner of Sophia’s dependence on substance? Spinoza’s discussion of infinite modes suggests that Sophia must, by definition, follow from God’s absolute nature (either immediately or mediately). If so, then Sophia follows from the absolute nature of God in \(w^*\), on the assumption that true definitions express necessary truths. But in that case, the modal transfer principle will apply to Sophia in \(w^*\), in which case Sophia’s existence is necessary. However, again assuming that necessity entails actuality, Sophia would be actual, pace our initial assumption. QED.

Of course, that reasoning relies on possible world semantics and some loaded (though plausible) theses about relations between possible worlds. Perhaps Spinoza could reach a similar conclusion without recourse to all that. Spinoza could instead appeal back to his plentitude principle and its basis in the PSR. If there could have been more infinite modes than there in fact are, these non-actual, merely possible modes must be compossible with the collection of necessarily existing infinite modes. (Another plausible assumption, expressed loosely: if something is not compossible with what necessarily exists, then its existence is not possible.) But if there were non-actual infinite modes that were compossible with the collection of necessarily existing infinite modes, what could explain their non-existence? Unless an answer can be given, Spinoza will infer falsity from a violation of the PSR. We again reach the conclusion of necessitarianism with respect to every infinite mode. Like substance, every possible infinite mode necessarily exists.[9]

1.2.3 Finite modes: A first pass

Infinite modes exist necessarily because they follow necessarily from something that exists necessarily, namely God. What about finite things like furniture and people? This much seems clear: if a finite mode follows from an infinite mode or from substance itself, then by the modal transfer principle, it exists necessarily too. But does any finite mode follow from an infinite mode or from substance? This is where the aforementioned “gap” between infinite and finite modes becomes modally significant. Consider what Spinoza says in the lengthy and important demonstration of Ip28:

Whatever has been determined to exist and produce an effect has been so determined by God (by Ip26 and Ip24c). But what is finite and has a determinate existence could not have been produced by the absolute nature of an attribute of God; for whatever follows from the absolute nature of an attribute of God is eternal and infinite (Ip21). It had, therefore, to follow either from God or from an attribute of God insofar as it is considered to be affected by some mode….But it also could not follow from God, or from an attribute of God, insofar as it is affected by a mode which is eternal and infinite (by Ip22). It had, therefore, to follow from or be determined to exist and produce an effect by God insofar as it is modified by a mode which is finite and has a determinate existence…and in turn, this cause or mode…had also to be determined by another which is also finite and has a determinate existence; and again…and so always (by the same reasoning) to infinity.

On a cursory reading of this passage, Spinoza seems to say that no finite mode follows from either an infinite mode or from “the absolute nature of an attribute of God,” lest that mode be “eternal and infinite,” pace the nature of finite modes. If so, then perhaps Spinoza’s point in this passage is that particular finite modes, like the desk, follow from only other particular finite modes, such as a pile of wood, which themselves follow from only other finite modes, such as some trees, and so on.[10] If so, then it appears that finite modes do not follow from anything that exists necessarily, in which case the modal transfer principle will not apply. Absent some other source of necessity for finite modes, it follows that Spinoza is not a necessitarian.

Suppose, however, that the causal history of the desk is traced all the way back to the very beginning of the world. Surely the starting point of the universe — that from which all the subsequent objects and events necessarily follow — surely the initial mode follows from God’s nature or from one of God’s infinite modes. If so, then by the modal transfer principle, the first finite mode will exist necessarily, and so everything that follows from it, including the desk, will exist necessarily too.

Spinoza rejects this reasoning. He has little sympathy with the traditional monotheistic idea that God created the world ex nihilo, and he denies that there is a true “in the beginning” style cosmogony. In the quotation from Ip28 above, Spinoza denies that the series of finite modes has an initial starting point. Spinoza thinks that the series of finite objects extends backwards in time in an infinitely long causal chain that contains no initial state. For every finite cause of the desk, there will always be a temporally prior finite cause of that cause. And a prior cause of the cause of that cause. And so on, ad infinitum. Prima facie, there is no PSR violation with this picture. For every particular finite object, there is a sufficient reason for its existence and characteristics in terms of its prior finite causes. Each finite object follows from and is thus explained by the prior state of the world, whose constituents are also explained by a prior state. If that is all Spinoza intended to say about the modal status of finite things, then one could read his fiery denials of contingency as defenses of mere causal determinism and not full-blown necessitarianism.

1.2.4 The problem of the gap

An important lesson from the previous section is that if there is a causal gap between finite modes and infinite modes, then Spinoza’s modal transfer principle will not apply to finite modes, since condition (ii) will remain unsatisfied in each case. Finite things will be causally determined solely by other finite things, none of which exist necessarily.

However tempting, this picture has trouble making sense of Spinoza’s repeated claims that everything is caused by God (Ip25–26), a claim Spinoza repeats in the very first sentence of Ip28d itself. Spinoza frequently emphasizes that God’s power or essence is the cause and explanation of everything that exists (Ip16, 17, 29s, 33, IAppendix). But if finite modes follow only from other finite modes, then it seems that they do not follow from God or substance, which violates one of the most basic features of modes, namely their dependence, qua modes, on substance (Id5).

This is a notoriously difficult question facing Spinoza’s metaphysics, one that was raised by Leibniz just a year after Spinoza’s death (Leibniz 1969, 203). Sometimes this worry was historically expressed as whether Spinoza can “derive” the finite from the infinite, but it is not really a question of logical deduction (Hübner 2014). The issue is whether Spinoza can consistently maintain that God is the cause of all things and that finite things follow only from other finite things.

One possible response would appeal to the close relationship between finite modes and the power of God. Spinoza sometimes describes finite modes as limited expressions of God’s own power (Ip36d; IVp4d), in which case perhaps being caused by other finite modes is a way of being determined by God’s power. The success of this response depends on the relationship between God and God’s modes for Spinoza, an interpretive point that is also heavily disputed. This reply would not work, for instance, if the fundamental connection between substance and modes is purely causal.

Curley has proposed a more elaborate and elegant solution for reconciling Ip28 and the claim that all modes follow from substance without positing any closer relationship between God and finite modes. (This is understandable since Curley is the leading advocate of the “causal only” interpretation of how modes depend on substance.) Curley suggests that Spinoza’s finite modes are only partially determined by other finite modes (Curley 1969). They are also partially determined by infinite modes, which Curley understands to be general features of the world described by the laws of nature. The desk follows partly from infinite modes and partly from other particular finite modes.

In more contemporary terms, Curley’s proposal is that every state of the world is determined by the laws of nature plus the prior state of the world. The laws of nature and the antecedent state each contribute to bringing about the desk, but neither is sufficient on its own. This division of labor would allow Spinoza to overcome the problem of the gap without violating Ip28. Particular finite modes do follow partly from God’s nature, in virtue of following partly from infinite modes – but only partly. They also follow partly from other finite modes. Admittedly, Spinoza does not say in Ip28 that finite modes follow only partially from other finite modes, but neither does he explicitly say that finite modes follow entirely from other finite modes.

If Curley is correct, then because finite modes are only partially determined by infinite modes, the modal transfer principle will not apply to finite modes. (One assumption here is that condition (i) requires following from entirely.) This blocks necessitarianism, since no finite mode would follow entirely from something that exists necessarily. Thus, Curley’s interpretation concludes, particular finite modes do not exist necessarily, despite (partly) following from God’s nature. Hence full-blown necessitarianism with respect to finite modes is false and AP1, AP2, and AP3 represent genuine alternative possibilities for Spinoza. This finds support in passages like IIa1:

The essence of man does not involve necessary existence, that is, from the order of Nature it can happen equally that this or that man does exist or that he does not exist.

Although the first half of that statement is thoroughly traditional, Spinoza’s claim that the order of Nature leaves the existence or non-existence of particular finite things undetermined seems to posit genuine contingency in the world. (In IIp10d, Spinoza cites IIa1 and claims that it would be “absurd” to conclude that a particular person exists necessarily, though it is unclear whether the absurdity lies in the modal conclusion itself or in the reasoning about finite essences that would lead to the modal conclusion.)

As for those passages in which Spinoza seems to profess full-blown necessitarianism (i.e., Ip16, 17, 29, 33, IAppendix), his appeals to necessity could be ambiguous between a strong form of determinism and full-blown necessitarianism. Yes, everything finite necessarily follows from something else and so everything finite is “necessary” in the sense of “being fully determined,” but nothing finite follows entirely from something that necessarily exists, and so no finite mode exists necessarily in the full-blown sense of that term.[11] Importantly, Curley defends Spinoza’s rejection of necessitarianism without positing a complete causal gap between finite modes and God’s nature; finite modes do partly follow from God and God’s infinite modes.

However, consider AP1 again, the possibility of an entirely different collection of finite modes. According to Curley, because no member of the collection exists necessarily, the collection itself is not necessary. That is, God could have brought about an entirely different series of finite modes. If so, what explains why this series of finite modes exists as opposed to one of the alternative possible series? (The question is not why God chose to create this series of modes rather than another possible series, a question that animated Leibniz. Spinoza denies that God has a will in the traditional sense, and so talk about choosing one possible world over another has no place in Spinoza’s system (Ip17s and IIp49c). Nonetheless, the PSR demands a reason in virtue of which God realizes this series of finite modes rather than another possible series.)

I noted earlier that Spinoza could explain why a particular finite mode exists by appealing (in part) to other particular finite modes, namely its actual causes. But Spinoza could not explain why this series, as opposed to some other series, exists by appealing to other particular existing modes. This would be akin to explaining why an entire series of causes exists by appealing to one of those very causes. We aren’t asking why any particular mode exists, but why this whole series, and not some other series, exists. Appealing to yet another contingent fact appears to get us nowhere towards accounting for the entire set of contingent facts.[12]

Nor could Spinoza appeal to substance or infinite modes to explain the entire series of finite modes, for two reasons. First, according to Curley’s own account, substance and its infinite modes do not fully explain or cause any particular finite mode (by Ip28). But as there seems to be nothing to the collection of finite modes beyond the individual members themselves, it is unclear how substance and its infinite modes could fully explain or cause the entire series without fully causing or explaining any individual member.

Second, if the entire series of finite modes were caused by God or something that necessarily followed from God, then the entire series would exist necessarily after all (pace AP1). Remember that causation, necessary connection, and following-from track each other, according to Spinoza. So if the entire series of finite modes follows from something that exists necessarily, then by the modal transfer principle, the series itself would also exist necessarily. If so, then there would not be any alternative possible series to the series of actual finite modes. Furthermore, it is hard to see how Spinoza could block the transfer of necessity from the series of finite modes to the individual members of that series, in which case both AP2 and AP3 would be ruled out as well.

This leaves us with an interpretive dilemma. On the one hand, Curley’s account respects both the demonstration of Ip28 and Spinoza’s frequent claims that all modes follow from God’s nature. A consequence of his account is that Spinoza is not a full-blown necessitarian. On the other hand, Curley’s Spinoza must reject very natural-sounding demands of the PSR. Spinoza would have to accept that there is no explanation why this entire series of finite modes exists rather than another possible series, a point Curley has conceded (Curley and Walski, 1999).

That concession might seem like too high an interpretive price to pay, especially since there is no independent reason to think Spinoza rejects the demands of the PSR when applied to the entire series of finite modes. It would be nice if Spinoza could accept an unrestricted version of the PSR and still preserve the claim in Ip28d that particular finite modes do not follow from infinite modes or the absolute nature of God without recreating the problematic gap. In the next section, we’ll consider an attempt to do just that. A consequence of this alternative reading will be that Spinoza endorses full-blown necessitarianism.

1.2.5 Finite modes: a second pass

Let us return to Spinoza’s crucial claim about finite modes in Ip28. He states that particular finite modes (a) do not follow from “the absolute nature of an attribute of God,” even though (b) they follow from an attribute of God “insofar as it is considered to be affected by some mode.” (As a reminder: we will continue to drop the reference to attributes for ease of expression.) Two questions immediately arise:

What is the difference between following from the absolute nature of God and merely following from God in the second, more qualified manner?
Why should the way a particular thing is considered be relevant for this distinction?

According to one prominent interpretation (Garrett 1991 and 2018), to follow from the absolute nature of God is to follow in an unqualified, pervasive and permanent manner, as infinite modes do (Ip21–23). Spinoza denies that finite modes follow in that way. However, following from God’s nature in a more qualified way does not imply that finite modes do not follow from God at all – to infer that would be to reintroduce the problem of the gap. Rather, Garrett contends, Spinoza denies only that any particular finite mode follows from God’s absolute nature independently of its relations to other finite objects. This leaves open the possibility that although no particular finite mode follows from the absolute nature of God, the entire collection of finite modes as a whole follows from the absolute nature of God or from an infinite mode of God.

Garrett’s account presents a five-fold division of Spinoza’s expression “following from God’s nature”:

  1. The immediate infinite modes follow directly from God’s absolute nature.
  2. The mediate infinite modes follow indirectly from God’s absolute nature.
  3. The infinite collection of finite modes, considered as a whole, follows indirectly from God’s absolute nature.[13]
  4. Each particular finite mode, considered in relation to the other members of the series, follows from God’s non-absolute nature.
  5. Each finite mode, considered independently of its relation to the other members of the series, does not follow from God’s nature.

If we apply Spinoza’s modal transfer principle to this division, the objects described in [i] and [ii] exist necessarily. Similarly, the necessity of God’s nature in [iii] trickles down the following-from relation, and so even though the series as a whole follows only indirectly from God, its existence would nonetheless be necessary, as with mediate infinite modes.

What about particular finite modes described in [iv]? On Garrett’s proposal, their existence too will be necessary, which commits Spinoza to full-blown necessitarianism. To see why, notice that the difference between [iii] and [iv] is not a function of the presence or absence of the following-from relation itself. The difference is between following from God’s absolute vs. non-absolute nature, whatever that distinction amounts to. Spinoza’s modal transfer principle is indifferent to the difference between [iii] and [iv]. The principle is too coarse-grained to track the absolute/non-absolute distinction; it tracks only the following-from relation from a necessarily existing source. Since both conditions of the principle are satisfied in [iv], necessity is transferred from the entire collection of finite modes to the individual members themselves. Thus, the desk exists necessarily. If this is correct, Spinoza can consistently claim that every finite mode exists necessarily and follows from God’s nature in some way, while still maintaining that no particular modes follows directly or indirectly from the absolute nature of God.

The objects described in [v] do not follow from God’s nature at all, in which case the modal transfer principle will not be satisfied. Insofar as that is the only available source for their necessity, it follows that they do not exist necessarily. But what is the difference between the objects described in [iv] and the objects described in [v]? In one sense, nothing: they are the same finite modes! That cannot be the full story, however, lest there be no explanation why the modes in [iv] follow from the nature of God whereas those very same modes in [v] do not. The only difference between [iv] and [v] is how a mode is considered in each case. (Although Garrett himself uses this “considered” claim, he does not say whether he thinks there are any true ways of considering objects corresponding to [v].)

Hence, if the desk is considered in relation to the entire series of finite modes, it follows from God’s nature and exists necessarily. Considered independently of that relation — if such can be done — the desk does not follow from God’s nature and does not exist necessarily. This gives rise to a more precise version of our earlier question:

Why should the way a particular thing is considered in relation to other particular things be relevant for whether it follows from God?

And, since that difference also generates a modal difference, we should also ask:

Why should the way a thing is considered be relevant for its modal status?

Answering these questions in the next section will drive us yet deeper into Spinoza’s modal metaphysics. First, however, Garrett’s account faces an independent worry (Curley and Walski 1999, Huenemann 1999). Return to the relationship between [iii] and [iv]. There is supposed to be a significant difference between the manner in which the collection of finite modes follows from God as a whole and the manner by which any particular member of that collection follows from God. However, if the entire collection of finite modes follows indirectly from God’s absolute nature, that seems to imply that each individual member of the series also follows from God’s absolute nature. Imagine trying to cover the collection of objects on my desk in coffee without making it the case that each object on my desk is covered in coffee. This seems impossible, as there is nothing more to the collection of things on my desk being covered in coffee than each and every thing on my desk being covered in coffee. Even worse, it is hard to see how the entire series of finite modes could have the property following from God’s absolute nature if no member of the series has that property.

The most promising line of response denies that the series of finite modes is nothing above and beyond its individual members. Following others, the entirety of finite modes has been described as a “series” or “collection,” a label that naturally suggests that the properties of the entire collection will be posterior to and derivative from the properties of its individual members. Spinoza himself rarely refers to just the collection of finite modes with a single expression, though he sometimes includes them in his locution “the order of nature” and he describes them as a “series” twice, both outside the Ethics (C I/41 and C I/307). Regardless of the terminology, one could contend that the whole series is more than just the sum of its the members. Spinoza does sometimes suggest that wholes can be prior to their parts (Ep32, IIp13le7s), though other times he suggests that parts are always prior to wholes (Ip15). Whether the series of finite modes is more holist or atomistic, and whether, on a holist mereological account, one of the non-supervening properties of the whole series is following from God’s absolute nature, are still open interpretive questions. The soundness of this reply will likely turn on whether or not the collection of finite modes is itself an infinite mode, a point about which interpreters continue to disagree.

2. The Nature of Modality

We have now seen two competing accounts of Spinoza’s views about the modal status of finite objects. Some argue that Spinoza endorses a strong form of determinism that falls short of full-blown necessitarianism. On this reading, finite modes do not exist necessarily and there are alternative possibilities to the series of actual finite modes that God did not bring about. Others have argued that Spinoza’s account of the relationship between God and finite modes readily accommodates full-blown necessitarianism and that, given the large number of passages in which Spinoza appears to affirm necessitarianism without qualification, there is sufficient evidence that Spinoza intentionally endorsed full-blown necessitarianism.

Like almost all discussions of Spinoza’s modal commitments, this dispute focus on the distribution of modal properties: which things exist necessarily? Far less attention has been given to Spinoza’s account of the nature of modality. This section discusses whether Spinoza has an account of modality itself, and if so, what light that account sheds on the dispute over his alleged necessitarianism.

Spinoza is emphatic that particular modal ascriptions have reasons behind them: “A thing is called necessary either by reason of its essence or by reason of its cause” (Ip33s1). But we can also consider a higher-order question: for what reason(s) do modal ascriptions work in the way that Spinoza claims they do? For ease, let us focus on modal properties instead of modal ascriptions. The question is similar to the one raised earlier about causation. What explains causation itself? Arguably, Spinoza’s answer is that causal relations obtain in virtue of conceptual connections between causal relata. A parallel question can be raised about modality itself. Do basic modal properties obtain in virtue of other, non-modal properties or is modality primitive for Spinoza?

Given Spinoza’s embrace of the PSR and his efforts to explain other dependence relations (such as causation and, perhaps, inherence), it would be surprising and disappointing if modality got a free explanatory pass. Of course, we probably should not expect Spinoza to have anything like a full-blown theory of modality in the forms that contemporary metaphysicians now provide (for an example, see the entry on the possibilism-actualism debate). Only in recent decades have philosophers come to appreciate how complex and rich the metaphysics of modality is, and Spinoza would be in good company if he says things that seem, by today’s standards, mostly underdeveloped. Nonetheless, he may have the beginnings of an account that helps illuminate his other modal commitments.

A promising place to start is the modal status of God’s existence. In Ip11, Spinoza claims that God necessarily exists. But what is it in virtue of which God necessarily exists? This might sound like an odd question. Once explanations reach a necessarily existing object, are there further in virtue of questions to be asked about that object’s existence? More generally, when we reach necessity, haven’t we reached the end of explanations?[14] Not always: mathematics is full of asymmetrical explanatory relations among necessarily true propositions. Similarly, Spinoza thinks that substance causes and asymmetrically explains necessarily existing infinite modes. Hence Spinoza must believe that dependence and explanation are more fine-grained relations than modern logical entailment, since according to the latter, every necessary proposition entails and is entailed by every other necessary proposition.

Spinoza explains the necessity of God’s existence by appealing to God’s nature. This may sound like a non-answer, but it is not. Spinoza is not claiming that there are no explanatory grounds for God’s existence; he is claiming that facts about God’s nature explain the modality of God’s existence. What about God’s nature explains God’s existence? In Ip7 and Ip11, Spinoza appeals to an involvement relation between the concept of God’s essence and the concept of God’s existence. That is, God exists in virtue of the fact that the concept of God involves the concept of existence. Spinoza also thinks that the conceptual involvement relation between God and existence explains the fact that God necessarily exists. In Ip19d, Spinoza writes,

For God (by Id6) is substance, which (by Ip11) necessarily exists, that is (by p7), to whose nature it pertains to exist, or (what is the same) from whose definition it follows that he exists.

In Ip7, Spinoza equates “pertaining to its nature to exist” with “essence necessarily involving existence” and “causing itself.” Self-causation in turn is explained in Id1 as a “nature that cannot be conceived except as existing.” That is, what explains the necessity of God’s existence is the fact that the very concept of God involves the concept of existence. He repeats these connections in Ip24d, “For that whose nature involves existence (considered in itself) is its own cause, and exists only from the necessity of its nature.” In other words, Spinoza explains necessity in terms of conceptual connections. Although Spinoza does not develop a richer account of conceptual relations that Leibniz will later achieve, his general idea seems to be that conceptual relations are the relations that explain and ground necessary connections.

Spinoza makes similar appeals to conceptual relations when he invokes geometrical examples to describe the necessity with which other things follow from God:

…all things have necessarily flowed, or always follow, by the same necessity and in the same way as from the nature of a triangle it follows…that its three angles are equal to two right angles (Ip17s).

Spinoza later identifies this same geometrical relationship with the conceptual involvement relation (IIp49). What it is for things to follow from God necessarily is for those things to be (asymmetrically) conceived through God, whose concept involves (the concept of) existence. The necessity of God and the necessity of existing things are both explained by and grounded in conceptual relations. Spinoza makes this connection emphatic in Ip35, “Whatever we conceive to be in God’s power, necessarily exists.”

Conversely, contingency obtains in virtue of the lack of certain conceptual connections. In the case of contingent existence, an object exists contingently just in case its concept is neither connected to the concept of existence nor to something else whose concept is connected to the concept of existence. Hence if a mode is conceived in such a way that it is not conceived in relation to something involving existence, it will exist contingently and not necessarily (as per Ia7). The point is not just that it would be conceived as contingent. On this account, how a thing is conceived partly fixes its modal status. In explaining modal features in terms of an involvement relation between concepts, Spinoza provides an answer to (3) from the previous section and thereby identifies himself with a long and distinguished tradition of philosophers who explain modal facts by appeal to conceptual relations.

This account also explains why Spinoza is attracted to his modal transfer principle in the first place. Recall that the modal transfer principle states that necessity transfers along following-from chains whose nodes include at least one necessarily existing thing. We saw earlier that Spinoza’s following-from relation is a causal relation and that causal relations are conceptual relations for Spinoza. But we just saw that necessity is also partly a function of conceptual relations. Thus necessity transfers along following-from chains because both necessity and following-from are grounded in the same relations of conceptual involvement. The underlying conceptual nature of modality, causation, and following-from explains why Spinoza’s modal transfer principle works.

Another upshot of all this is that modality is not wholly extensional for Spinoza. The ways in which objects are conceived partly determines a thing’s modal status. In particular, whether a finite mode exists necessarily or not depends in part on whether it is conceived through something whose concept involves existence. (For further discussion, see Newlands 2010b and Newlands 2017.)

2.1 Necessitarianism Vindicated

With this analysis in hand, let us return to Garrett’s proposed account of Spinoza’s necessitarianism. Garrett claims in [iv] that each particular mode, conceived in relation to all the other particular modes, follows from God’s nature, and he concludes that therefore every finite mode exists necessarily. However, according to [v], the same finite mode conceived independently of the relation to every other finite modes fails to follow from God and so fails to exist necessarily. Spinoza’s conceptual account of modality explains why he thought modality works in this particular way.

Suppose the entire collection of finite modes, considered as a whole, follows from a necessarily existing infinite mode. Hence, the entire collection as a whole exists necessarily. In order for a particular finite mode in that collection to exist necessarily, it must be conceived as following from something that exists necessarily. How can a finite mode be conceived as following from something that exists necessarily? The answer is clear: by being conceived in relation to the whole collection. That is, when finite modes are considered in relation to all the other finite modes, the right conceptual connection obtains and Spinoza’s modal transfer principle is satisfied. This provides an answer to (2′) from the previous section. Whether a mode is considered in relation to the rest of the series is relevant to its modal status because (a) modal facts are sensitive to the conceptual relations that the considering relation picks up on and (b) considering a particular finite mode in relation to the whole series of finite modes tracks the relevant conceptual connection that satisfies the modal transfer principle.

Of course, not just any way of considering a finite mode will be relevant for its modal status. Considered as “the largest piece of furniture in the office,” the desk does not exist necessarily. By Spinoza’s lights, the way of conceiving the desk needs to involve something that follows from God’s nature if the desk is to exist necessarily. This is why, if Garrett is correct, considering the desk in relation to the rest of the entire series of finite objects is relevant for its modal status, whereas considering the desk in other, less causally relevant or more isolated ways, is not.[15]

2.2 Non-necessitarianism also vindicated

If particular finite things exist necessarily in virtue of being considered in relation to the whole series of finite things, two lingering questions remain:

(4) Can you and I ever grasp such all-encompassing ways of conceiving particular things?
(5) Are there other, less inclusive ways of considering a finite object in virtue of which it does not exist necessarily?

With the respect to (4), Spinoza’s answer is unfortunately negative. Spinoza sometimes describes the mental corollary of these very inclusive and complete ways of conceiving objects in terms of adequacy, and he is very pessimistic about our ability to have adequate ideas of particular things (see especially IIp24–31, though he holds out more hope in Part Five). Spinoza even links our natural tendencies to represent objects independent of their infinitely extensive causal networks with their contingency (IIp31c), just as the above interpretation predicts. So while we can understand the metaphysical principles which guarantee the necessary existence of a finite thing insofar as it is conceived in relation to every other finite thing, we tend to adopt far more limited concepts of finite things, in virtue of which necessitarianism is false. Spinoza remains confident that there is a complete way of conceiving a particular finite object in relation to all others, but it is unlikely that we will ever be able to psychologically grasp such complete and necessitating concepts. Spinoza’s metaphysics meets his psychology here, and psychology wins.

This is an unfortunately negative answer in the light of Spinoza’s ethical theory. As a systematic thinker, Spinoza thinks metaphysical conclusions about modality have consequences for ethics. Although pursuing the relations between Spinoza’s metaphysics and ethics are beyond the scope of this entry (see Newlands 2018), Spinoza clearly thinks that ethically relevant conclusions follow from his metaphysics of modality. For example, he writes in Vp6:

Insofar as the mind understands all things as necessary, it has a greater power over the affects, or is less acted on them.

Spinoza thinks we morally improve by gaining power over our passive affects and becoming more active (Vp4), so our inability to conceive finite things as related to everything else (and so as existing necessarily) means our prospects for moral perfection are quite dim.

With respect to (5), Spinoza suggests that there are more and less complete ways of genuinely conceiving objects (see, for instance, Ip24d and IVd3–4). If there are true but incomplete ways of conceiving objects, Spinoza will occupy the interesting position of consistently affirming both necessitarianism and its denial, relative to these different ways of conceiving objects. This pairing sounds like a contradiction until we appreciate the force of Spinoza’s conceptualist account of modality. If the truth-value of modal predications is sensitive to ways of conceiving objects (as a modern day anti-essentialist might agree), and if Spinoza endorses a variety of modally salient ways of conceiving objects, then he can consistently affirm both the truth and falsity of full-blown necessitarianism relative to different ways of conceiving finite objects.

If this is all correct (a very big “if”!), then Garrett and Curley’s conclusions can both be right, though neither tells the complete modal story. Something less than full-blown necessitarianism will be true in virtue of ways of conceiving objects that do not include their relations to the entire, infinitely large and complex range of other particular things. At the same time, full-blown necessitarianism will also be true in virtue of ways of conceiving finite things that are maximally inclusive with respect to relations to the rest of the world. This middle ground provides an answer to Curley’s otherwise worrisome objection to the necessitarian interpretation: “If each particular feature of the universe, considered in itself, is contingent, then their totality is also contingent” (Curley 1988, 49).[16] This expansion of contingency from the part to the whole would be true only if the shift in the ways finite things are conceived did not sometimes entail a shift in their modal status. Although this is a very widespread essentialist assumption today, it is a false one according to this reading of Spinoza’s modal theory. Just as necessitarianism at the most expansive conceptual level does not jeopardize contingency at narrower levels, so too contingency at narrower levels need not bleed into the modal status of things conceived in the most expansive way.

3. The Ground of Modality

A final and underexplored topic in Spinoza’s modal metaphysics concerns what we might call the ground of modality. There was a lively dispute in the 17th century about the relationship between God and modality. Although there was a general consensus that modal facts – like so much else – depend on God in some way or other, there was considerable disagreement over exactly how to understand that dependence. Monotheistic metaphysicians disagreed over both (a) on what in God modal truths and modal truth-makers depend and (b) by what manner of dependence modal truths and modal-truth makers depend on God. The first set of issues concerns the divine ground of modality and the second concerns the grounding relation that modality bears to its ground (for some recent discussions, see Chignell 2012 and Newlands 2013).

Spinoza cannot accept two of the most prominent accounts proposed by his contemporaries. According to Descartes, (a) modal truths and modal truth-makers depend on God’s volitions and (b) the form of dependence is efficient causation. According to Leibniz, (a) modal truths and modal truth-makers depend on God’s ideas and intellectual activities and (b) the form of dependence is ontological and does not involve efficient causation. However, Spinoza denies that God’s nature contains a will and intellect in the sense required for these accounts (Ip17s).

Nonetheless, Spinoza thinks that all things depend on God (Ip15), and he points to an alternative account of how possibilities depend on God. He claims that non-existing modes are grounded in God’s actual attributes. “The ideas of singular things, or of modes, that do not exist must be comprehended God’s infinite idea in the same way as the formal essences of singular things, or modes, are contained in God’s attributes” (IIp8). He unpacks the “comprehension” or containment of non-divine formal essences in conceptual terms: “Essences [of non-existing things] are comprehended in another in such a way that they can be conceived through it” (Ip8s2). This suggests that the essences of all things, including non-existing things, are conceptually contained in God’s attributes.

In more general terms, Spinoza’s idea seems to be that possibilities are grounded in God by being actually exemplified by God, a view that fits nicely with interpretations of Spinoza’s modes as things that inhere in God (see section 1.3 above). Thus, it is possible for something to be thinking because God is actually a thinking thing (IIp1d). The grounding of possibility in actuality is a very attractive metaphysical thesis in its own right, and Spinoza’s God has a sufficiently rich nature to ground all possibilities by actually exemplifying them all (Ip15 and Ip16).

Spinoza’s account of the grounds of modality also presents an interesting challenge to anyone attracted to the thesis that God grounds possibilities, but who wants to deny that God directly exemplifies every possibility (Newlands 2016). Those unhappy with Spinoza’s expansive divine nature would need to explain how it is that God grounds some possibilities, such as being extended, without actually being extended. One could follow Descartes in harkening back to the Scholastic notion of “eminent” containment, but Spinoza reads that appeal as the name of the problem, not its solution. Leibniz was sometimes attracted to the idea that every basic creaturely possibility is formed from God’s non-mental perfections, but he will have a hard time explaining how every creaturely possibility can be constructed out of the sparse set of traditional divine perfections.

Without reducing creaturely possibilities to God’s actual perfections (as idealists do with extension), Spinoza presents an alternative grounding thesis and a challenge. Let every possibility be grounded in God via actual exemplification, even if this requires expanding the divine nature beyond its traditional boundaries. For those unwilling to follow Spinoza on this expansion, Spinoza’s challenge is for proponents of nearby alternatives to provide a non-metaphorical explanation of how God grounds certain basic possibilities without actually and directly exemplifying them. Until such an account is given, Spinoza’s biting conclusion offers an unmet challenge: “But by what divine power could [extension or any property not exemplified by God] be created? They are completely ignorant of that. And this shows that they do not understand what they themselves say” (Ip15s). At the very least, Spinoza’s challenge highlights how his modal metaphysics extends beyond the topic of necessitarianism and continues to invite wider investigation.


[All references to Spinoza’s Ethics use the form of PartTypeNumberSubtype (so “EIp4d” means Part One, Proposition Four, Demonstration). Other variants of types include “d” for definition, “a” for axiom, and “le” for lemma. Other subtypes include “s” for scholium and “c” for corollary. Spinoza’s letters are cited as Ep, using their standard numbering. All other citations from Spinoza’s corpus are cited by volume/page of Edwin Curley’s Collected Works, from which all translations are also taken.

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  • –––, 1984. A Study of Spinoza’s Ethics, Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing.
  • Carriero, John P., 1995. “On the Relationship between Mode and Substance in Spinoza’s Metaphysics,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 33: 245–73.
  • –––, 1991. “Spinoza’s Views on Necessity in Historical Perspective,” Philosophical Topics, 19: 47–96.
  • Chignell, Andrew, 2012. “Kant, Real Possibility, and the Threat of Spinoza,” Mind, 121: 635–675
  • Curley, Edwin, 1988. Behind the Geometrical Method: A Reading of Spinoza’s Ethics, Princeton: Princeton University Press.
  • –––, 1969. Spinoza’s Metaphysics: An Essay in Interpretation, Cambridge, Mass: Harvard.
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  • Garrett, Don, 2009. “The Essence of the Body and the Part of the Mind that is Eternal,” in A Companion to Spinoza’s Ethics, Olli Koistinen (ed.), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • –––, 2018. Nature and Necessity in Spinoza’s Philosophy, New York: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 1979. “Spinoza’s ‘Ontological’ Argument,” Philosophical Review, 88: 198–223.
  • –––, 1991. “Spinoza’s Necessitarianism,” in God and Nature in Spinoza’s Metaphysics, Yirmiyahu Yovel (ed.), 191–218, Leiden: E.J. Brill.
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  • –––, 2011. “Spinoza’s Cosmological Argument in the Ethics,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 49(4): 439–462.
  • Leibniz, G.W., 2005. Confessio Philosophi and Papers Concerning the Problem of Evil, 1671–1678, Robert Sleigh (trans.), New Haven: Yale University Press.
  • –––, 1969. Philosophical Papers and Letters, L. Loemker (ed.), 2nd ed., Dordrecht: Reidel.
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  • Lovejoy, Arthur O., 1936. The Great Chain of Being, Cambridge, Mass: Harvard University Press.
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  • Mason, Richard, 1986. “Spinoza on Modality,” The Philosophical Quarterly, 36(144): 313–342.
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  • –––, 2012. “Spinoza on Inherence, Causation and Conception,” Journal of the History of Philosophy, 50(3): 365–386.
  • –––, 2013. “Spinoza’s Metaphysics of Thought: Parallelisms and the Multifaceted Structure of Ideas,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 86(3): 636–683.
  • Miller, Jon A., 2001. “Spinoza’s Possibilities,” Review of Metaphysics, 54(4): 779–815.
  • Newlands, Samuel, 2010a. “Another Kind of Spinozistic Monism,” Noûs, 44(3): 469–502.
  • –––, 2010b. “The Harmony of Spinoza and Leibniz,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 81(1): 64–104.
  • –––, 2013. “Leibniz and the Ground of Possibility,” The Philosophical Review, 122(2): 155–187.
  • –––, 2016. “Backing Into Spinozism,” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research, 93(3): 511–537.
  • –––, 2017. “Spinoza’s Relevance to Contemporary Metaphysics,” in Oxford Handbook to Spinoza, Michael Della Rocca (ed.), 601–626, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • –––, 2018. Reconceiving Spinoza, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Spinoza. The Collected Works of Spinoza, Volumes 1 and 2, Edwin Curley (trans. and ed.), Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1985 and 2016.
  • –––. Opera, Carl Gebhardt (ed.), 4 vols., Heidelberg: Carl Winter, 1925.
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