Spinoza’s Political Philosophy

First published Mon Apr 21, 2008; substantive revision Mon Apr 15, 2019

At least in anglophone countries, Spinoza’s reputation as a political thinker is eclipsed by his reputation as a rationalist metaphysician. Nevertheless, Spinoza was a penetrating political theorist whose writings have enduring significance. In his two political treatises, Spinoza advances a number of forceful and original arguments in defense of democratic governance, freedom of thought and expression, and the subordination of religion to the state. On the basis of his naturalistic metaphysics, Spinoza also offers trenchant criticisms of ordinary conceptions of right and duty. And his account of civil organization stands as an important contribution to the development of constitutionalism and the rule of law.

1. Historical Background

In order to situate Spinoza’s political writings, I will provide a brief overview of the theologico-political context of the United Provinces, followed by a sketch of intellectual background to these works.

1.1 Theological and Political Background

Despite being perhaps the most tolerant country in early-modern Europe—a sanctuary for free thinkers and members of religious minorities—the United Provinces were riven by religious conflict, as the Dutch sought to establish their identity after gaining independence from Spain. The confessional rifts of the seventeenth century were certainly an important part of context in which Spinoza composed his Tractatus Theologico-Politicus [hereafter: TTP].

The early part of the seventeenth century was marked by a religious schism that rapidly took on political significance. In 1610, forty-four followers of liberal theologian Jacobus Arminius—referred to as Arminians—wrote a formal “Remonstrance,” which articulated the ways in which they deviated from orthodox Calvinism, particularly with respect to the issues of self-determination and grace. The Arminians, or Remonstrants, defended religious toleration on the grounds that faith is expressed in the conscience of the individual, and so is not subject to the coercive power of the state. The doctrinal and political views of the Remonstrants were opposed by the conservative Gomarists (followers of Franciscus Gomarus), or Counter-Remonstrants. For a little over a decade (roughly 1607–1618), the dispute raged on, expanding outward from Holland and Utrecht. Finally, in 1618, a national synod convened (the Synod of Dort) to define the public faith more clearly. The fallout from the Synod of Dort was disastrous for the tolerant Arminians. The Advocate of the States of Holland, Johan Oldenbarnevelt, who staunchly defended the Remonstrants, was put to death. And Arminians throughout the country were purged from town councils and universities (Israel 1995, 452ff).

The second half of the century witnessed its own major theologico-political dispute in the United Provinces. At the center, once again, were two theologians: Johannes Cocceius, a liberal theology professor at Leiden, and Gisbertus Voetius, Dean of the University of Utrecht. Disputes between Cocceian and Voetians began over abstruse theological matters, but developed into a larger political and cultural affair. The Voetians led the assault on the Cartesian philosophy being taught in the universities. They thought that the new science advocated by Descartes, with its mechanistic view of the material world, posed a threat to Christianity in a variety of ways (Nadler 1999, 151–2 and 308–310). Spinoza’s philosophy was reviled not only by the Voetians, but also by moderate Cocceian-Cartesians, who sought to distance themselves from radicals.

Spinoza was no stranger to religious persecution. As is well known, he was himself excommunicated from the Jewish community in Amsterdam in 1656. While Spinoza apparently endured the excommunication with characteristic equanimity, fellow Dutch apostate Jew, Uriel da Costa, was unable to bear the indignity of excommunication from the Amsterdam Jewish community. In 1640—when Spinoza was only eight years old—da Costa, who had denied the immortality of the soul and challenged the status of the Torah as divine revelation, took his own life.

Da Costa’s suicide surely made a lasting impression on Spinoza, but it did not affect him as personally as did the treatment of his friend Adriaan Koerbagh at the hands of Dutch authorities in the years leading up to the publication of the TTP. In 1668 Koerbagh published two treatises that provoked the wrath of the Calvinist clergy. In the more scandalous of the two—Een Bloemhof van allerley lieflijkheyd (A Flower Garden of all Kinds of Loveliness)—Koerbagh ridiculed a number of traditional religious doctrines and practices, and, in the process, articulated his own religious and metaphysical views. Among the shocking views that he advanced were that Jesus is not divine, that God is identical with nature, that everything is necessitated by the laws of nature (the laws of God), and that miracles are impossible. These are all positions that Spinoza consistently endorsed. However, while Spinoza was famously cautious, Koerbagh was not, publishing the works in Dutch (thereby making them accessible to the general literate public) under his own name. Consequently, Koerbagh was tried and sentenced on charges of blasphemy. During his subsequent imprisonment under squalid conditions Koerbagh became ill. He died soon thereafter (in 1669). It is generally supposed that it was Koerbagh’s imprisonment and death above all else that precipitated the publication of the TTP (Nadler 1999, 170).

Liberal republicans were dealt a major blow in 1672. In this so-called disaster year (rampjaar), French troops, under the command of Louis XIV, invaded the United Provinces, capturing a number of Dutch cities (Nadler 1999, 305). Grand Pensionary (chief statesman and legal advisor) Johan de Witt shouldered much of the blame for this military embarrassment. De Witt was the leader of the States of Holland for much of the republican period that followed the death of Stadholder (a quasi-monarchical position held by the House of Orange) William II in 1650. After the French invasion, the stadholdership was reinstituted in the person of William III, and De Witt was forced to resign. Shortly afterward he and his brother, Cornelis, were brutally killed by a zealous mob. This incident evoked uncommon anger in Spinoza, who was an admirer of de Witt and the republican ideals for which he stood. According to one famous account, Spinoza had to be restrained by his landlord from taking a sign reading ultimi barbarorum [“ultimate of barbarians”] to the site of the massacre (Freudenthal 1899, 201). Spinoza’s Tractatus Politicus was composed in the aftermath of, and perhaps prompted by, the events of 1672.

1.2 Intellectual Background

Spinoza’s political thought draws from a number of sources, both classical and modern. As one commentator puts it, “Spinoza formed new conclusions from facts and concepts borrowed from others” (Haitsma Mulier 1980, 170). It is worth briefly considering some of the sources of the “facts and concepts” that he inherits.

At some point in the mid-1650’s (around the time of his cherem, or excommunication) Spinoza began studying Latin with Franciscus Van den Enden. Van den Enden was an ex-Jesuit and radical egalitarian with revolutionary tendencies. He was put to death in 1674 after having been found guilty of conspiring to depose Louis XIV in order to establish a free republic in Normandy. Van dan Enden was an anti-clerical democrat who appears to have profoundly influenced Spinoza. One commentator has gone so far as to call Van den Enden “the genius behind Spinoza,” claiming that Van den Enden’s writings “contain a political theory which is in fact the same as the one worked out by Spinoza” (Klever 1996, 26). Whether or not this assessment is fair, it is clear that Spinoza’s thinking was nourished through his association with Van den Enden and the larger radical Cartesian circle in Amsterdam (Nyden-Bullock 2007).

Hobbes’ influence on Spinoza is unmistakable. We know that Spinoza read De Cive carefully and that it was among his possessions when he died in 1677. He might also have read Leviathan, which appeared in Latin in 1668, as Spinoza was completing the TTP (Sacksteder 1980). I will discuss Spinoza’s work in relationship to Hobbes’ in some detail below (sections 2.1 and 2.2, below). Here I want to mention the impact of Dutch Hobbesians on Spinoza. Hobbesian thought was introduced into Dutch political discourse by Lambert van Velthuysen, an anti-clerical, liberal physician (Tuck 1979; Blom 1995). Velthuysen’s Dissertatio is an unabashed defense of Hobbes’ thought, in which the duty to preserve oneself is given pride of place (esp. Sect. XIII). Spinoza read and admired Velthuysen as a “man of exceptional sincerity of mind,” and was thus disconcerted when Velthuysen denounced the TTP as the work of a dangerous atheist (Epistles 42 and 43).

Aside from Velthuysen, the other primary Dutch conduits for Hobbesian thought prior to Spinoza were the De la Court brothers (Petry 1984; Kossmann 2000). Most of the De la Courts’ writings were published by Pieter De la Court after the death of his brother Johan in 1660. However, because it remains unclear how much Pieter added and how much he took credit for the work his studious younger brother, I will refer to these authors of these writings simply as the De la Courts, so as to avoid attribution problems. The De la Courts were ardent republicans who maintained good relations with Johan De Witt. Indeed, De Witt is thought to have written two chapters in the second edition of their book Interest van Holland (see Petry 1984, 152). The De la Courts adopted the basic features of Hobbesian anthropology, but eschewed juridical concepts like “right” and “contract” (see Malcolm 1991, 548), opting to analyze the civil condition in terms of the competing interests of participants. According to them, the aim of the state is to ensure that the interests of rulers are tied to the interests of the ruled, which is possible only if one adopts a series of institutional measures, such as the use of blind balloting, the removal of hereditary posts, and the rotation of offices. Republics, they argued, will be marked by greater checks against self-interested legislation than monarchies (see Blom 1993). Spinoza evidently studied these works carefully; his institutional recommendations in the Tractatus Politicus [hereafter: TP] reflect his debt to the De la Courts (Petry 1984; Haitsma Mulier 1980).

It was likely the writings of the De la Courts that impressed upon Spinoza the perspicacity of Niccolo Machiavelli. The notion of balancing the interests of competing parties was ultimately derived from Machiavelli (see Haitsma Mulier 1993, 254–255). Spinoza’s Political Treatise is shot through with Machiavellian insights and recommendations. Right at the outset of the work, Spinoza parrots Machiavelli’s critique of utopian theorizing, elevating statesmen over philosophers, since only the latter begin with a realistic conception of human psychology (TP 1/1; cf. Machiavelli, The Prince I.15). Machiavellian realism pervades Spinoza’s political writings, playing a particularly significant role in the constitutional theorizing of the TP. Spinoza, like Machiavelli, understood that prescriptions for improving the governance of a state can be offered only after one has a proper diagnosis of the problems and a proper grasp of human nature (see Steinberg 2018a).

2. Basic Features of Spinoza’s Political Philosophy

Three of the most striking and important claims of Spinoza’s Ethics are that (1) all things come to exist and act necessarily from the laws of God’s nature (e.g., EIP29 and EIP33), (2) nature does not act on account of some end or purpose (EI Appendix), and (3) nature is everywhere and always the same (EIII Preface). Collectively, these three claims entail that human behavior, like the behavior of everything else, is fully necessitated by, and explicable through, the immutable—and non-providential—laws of God or Nature. This forms a significant part of the metaphysical backdrop against which Spinoza develops his political theory. For the sake of simplicity, I will call the view that is constituted by these three theses Spinoza’s naturalism. This naturalism led him to adopt bold views about the source and status of rights, obligations, and laws that distinguished his work from that of other seventeenth-century political theorists.

Spinoza’s naturalism excludes the possibility of a transcendent God. Those who believe in a transcendent God “imagine that there are two powers, distinct from each other, the power of God and the power of natural things…. they imagine the power of God to be like the authority of royal majesty, and the power of nature to be like a force and impetus” (TTP 6/81). Of course, on Spinoza’s account, God is not a transcendent legislator, God is nature itself. Consequently, all accounts of right that are rooted in God’s legislating will are specious. This is a direct rebuke not only of defenders of the divine right of kings, but also of most accounts of natural rights as entitlements that were embraced by many seventeenth-century theorists.

Moreover, this naturalism also rules out the possibility of a normative order of things, or a way that things should be, distinct from the actual order of things. This undermines the teleological assumptions that form the basis of natural law theory, whether Thomistic or Protestant. Even those who wished to separate natural law from theology (e.g., Pufendorf), and those who de-emphasized the role of God’s will—as Grotius does in his famous etiam si daremus passage—still supposed that there is a way that things ought to be, a normative natural order that can be decoupled from the actual order of things. According to this view, humans act contrary to nature when they act contrary to the prescriptions of right reason. Spinoza attacks this view, according to which “the ignorant violate the order of nature rather than conform to it; they think of men in nature as a state within a state [imperium in imperio]” (TP 2/6). The phrase “imperium in imperio” famously appears also in the preface to Ethics III, where Spinoza is characterizing the non-naturalist view that he opposes. In both of these passages, Spinoza criticizes the assumption that man is governed by his own set of rational, normative laws, rather than the laws that govern the rest of nature. It is precisely this position that Spinoza undercuts when he writes in the Ethics that “the laws and rules of Nature…are always and everywhere the same” (EIII preface) and in the TP that “whether man is led by reason or solely by desire, he does nothing that is not in accordance with the laws and rules of nature” (TP 2/5).

In short, by adopting the view that nature is univocal and that man is governed by the same laws as everything else in nature, Spinoza rejects the natural law tradition (Curley 1991; A. Garrett 2003; for contrasting views, see Kisner 2010 and Miller 2012). And even if Spinoza’s naturalism is viewed as part of a larger naturalistic trend in Dutch political thought (Blom 1995), his disavowal of normative conceptions of nature and rejection of teleology indicates a clear break with tradition. To appreciate the depth and significance of Spinoza’s naturalism, it will be helpful to compare his views on natural right and obligation to Hobbes’.

2.1 Hobbes and Spinoza on the Right of Nature

One of the most notorious features of Spinoza’s political thought is his account of natural right. He introduces this concept in TTP 16, where he boldly writes:

By the right and order of nature I merely mean the rules determining the nature of each individual thing by which we conceive it is determined naturally to exist and to behave in a certain way. For example fish are determined by nature to swim and big fish to eat little ones, and therefore it is by sovereign natural right that fish have possession of the water and that big fish eat small fish. For it is certain that nature, considered wholly in itself, has a sovereign right to do everything that it can do, i.e., the right of nature extends as far as its power extends…since the universal power of the whole of nature is nothing but the power of all individual things together, it follows that each individual thing has the sovereign right to do everything that it can do, or the right of each thing extends so far as its determined power extends. (TTP 16, 195; cf. TP 2/4).

In claiming that the right of nature is coextensive with the power of nature and that this applies mutatis mutandis to the individuals in nature, Spinoza is simply rejecting non-naturalism, rather than making a positive normative claim. So although Spinoza is often seen as subscribing to the view that “might makes right” (see Barbone and Rice 2000, 19; McShea 1968, 139), this is misleading if it is taken as a normative claim. In fact, I take it that the coextensivity thesis is not to be understood as offering a new normative standard; rather, it is intended as a denial of any transcendental standard of justice (see Curley 1996, 322; Balibar 1998, 59). To say that something is done by right in Spinoza’s sense is just to say that there is nothing in virtue of which that action can be judged impermissible. So, even if Spinoza’s account implies that Cortés conquered the Aztecs by right, it does not follow that it was necessarily the right, or proper, thing to do (see TP 5/1; see section 2.3).

Spinoza’s brazen denial of natural proscriptions on what one can do roused the ire of early readers (e.g., Pufendorf 1934, 159). Of course, Thomas Hobbes, Spinoza’s great predecessor, had made a similar claim. Indeed, Spinoza’s account of natural right is often taken as evidence that he is a Hobbesian. Hobbes’ account of natural right has been the subject of much interpretative dispute, in part because it seems to undergo a shift between his early political writings and Leviathan. In De Cive Hobbes defines right as “the liberty each man has of using his natural faculties in accordance with right reason” (1.7). In other words, natural right is the liberty to do anything consistent with the natural law (ibid. 2.1). This includes the right to do anything that one judges to be necessary for one’s preservation (1.8–1.9). Hobbes adds one proviso here, which might be called the “sincerity clause,” namely that one violates the law of nature, or acts without right, when one acts in a way that one does not sincerely believe contributes to one’s preservation (1.10n). And later Hobbes suggests that because “drunkenness and cruelty” cannot sincerely be thought to contribute to self-preservation, drunken and cruel actions are not performed by right, even in the state of nature (ibid., 3.27). In short, as A. G. Wernham puts it, on Hobbes’ view, man’s natural right “covers only some of his actions” (Wernham 1958, 14). Specifically, it covers those actions that are not contrary to the law of nature.

In Leviathan, however, Hobbes seems to advance an account of natural right that is apparently not bound by such normative constraints (Ch. 14). But while it may seem that in the later work Hobbes strips the concept of natural right of all normative content, even the view expressed in Leviathan may be seen to be at odds with a thoroughgoing naturalism. To see this, consider Spinoza’s reply to his friend to Jarig Jelles, when asked what sets his views apart from Hobbes’:

With regard to political theory, the difference between Hobbes and myself, which is the subject of your inquiry, consists in this, that I always preserve the natural right in its entirety [ego naturale jus semper sartum tectum conservo], and I hold that the sovereign power in a State has right over a subject only in proportion to the excess of its power over that of a subject (Epistle 50).

What Spinoza is criticizing here is the Hobbesian view of contracts (covenants) or the transference of one’s natural right. The transferability or alienability of one’s natural right to judge how to defend oneself serves as the foundation of Hobbes’ political theory; it allows him to explain the formation of the commonwealth and the legitimacy of the sovereign. In Spinoza’s view, however, Hobbes violates naturalism here. By conceiving of one’s natural right as something like an entitlement that can be transferred, which in turn leads him to drive a wedge between right and power in the commonwealth, Hobbes never fully rids his account of the vestiges of the juridical tradition that Spinoza sought to overturn.

2.2 Hobbes and Spinoza on Obligation

The difference between Hobbes and Spinoza on right bears directly on their distinct accounts of obligation. Hobbes thinks that we incur binding obligations when we make pledges under the appropriate conditions. By contrast, Spinoza maintains that “the validity of an agreement rests on its utility, without which the agreement automatically becomes null and void” (TTP 16/182; cf. TP 2/12). To demand otherwise would be absurd, since men are bound by nature to choose what appears to be the greater good or lesser evil. We are bound by nature to act on our strongest interest and cannot be obligated by previous agreements to break this inviolable psychological law of nature.

By adhering to a strict naturalism about right and obligation and maintaining that “the sovereign power in a State has right over a subject only in proportion to the excess of its power over that of a subject” (Epistle 50), Spinoza, unlike Hobbes, places the burden of political stability on the sovereign rather than the subject (see Wernham 1958, 27). The commonwealth must be structured so as to promote compliance; when there is excessive vice or non-compliance, the blame must be “laid at the door of the commonwealth” (TP 5/3). So, whereas Hobbes argues that the sovereign is always vested with nearly absolute legislative authority, Spinoza claims that “since the right of a commonwealth is determined by the collective power of a people, the greater the number of subjects who are given cause by a commonwealth to join in conspiracy against it, the more must its power and right be diminished” (TP 3/9). If a sovereign is to maintain its right, it must legislate wisely, so as not to incite insurrection. So while Spinoza does not accord to the people a proper right of revolution, he proposes a naturalistic equivalent, since the right of the state is essentially constituted, and limited, by the power of the people (TP 2/17) (see Sharp 2013).

Thus, when Spinoza points to the differences between his view of natural right and Hobbes’ in his letter to Jelles, differences that might appear negligible to the casual reader, he is identifying a significant distinction (see Wernham 1958, 35). Spinoza’s thoroughgoing naturalism leads him to reject the sharp distinction that Hobbes draws between civil state—the product of artifice—and the state of nature, along with the concomitant conception of obligation that arises with the inception of the commonwealth. But given his naturalism and repudiation of rights and obligations as traditionally understood, one might be left wondering how or whether Spinoza could offer a normative political theory at all.

2.3 Spinoza and Normativity

As Edwin Curley rightly points out, to deny that there is a transcendental standard of justice is not to deny that there is any normative standard by which we can evaluate action (Curley 1996). Even if one can act irrationally without violating nature that does not mean that all of one’s actions have the same normative status. As Spinoza puts it, “it is one thing, I say, to defend oneself, to preserve oneself, to give judgment, etc., by right, another thing to defend and preserve oneself in the best way and to give the best judgment” (TP 5/1). The goodness of an action is to be judged in relation to whether the action aids one’s striving to preserve and augment one’s power (see EIVP18S; TP 2/8; TTP 16/181). The striving to preserve and augment one’s power, which constitutes one’s actual essence (EIIIP7), provides a standard for moral judgments: things are good or bad to the extent that they aid or diminish one’s power of acting (Curley 1973). And just as the individual ought to do those things that maximize his or her own power or welfare, Spinoza takes it as axiomatic that the state ought to do those things that maximize the power of the people as a whole (e.g., TTP 16/184).

3. The Tractatus Theologico-Politicus

As indicated above, throughout the seventeenth century the United Provinces were torn apart by disputes concerning, among other things, the political authority of the church. Spinoza’s Tractatus Theologico-Politicus can be seen as an intervention in this broad dispute. The stated goals of this work were to parry charges of atheism (Spinoza was hilariously unsuccessful in this respect), to oppose the prejudices of the theologians, and to defend the freedom to philosophize (Epistle 30). My exposition of the political claims of the TTP will focus on the last two goals. Specifically, I will look at the political significance of Spinoza’s critique of superstition and consider his arguments for the freedom of philosophizing. This will be followed by an analysis of the role of the social contract in the TTP.

3.1 Countering Superstition

The TTP contains a good deal of what has come to be known as biblical criticism. Through careful linguistic and historical exegesis Spinoza identifies numerous textual inconsistencies, which, with some philosophical buttressing, lead Spinoza to deny the exalted status of prophets, the objective reality of miracles, and ultimately the divine origin of the Pentateuch. The broad features of his critique are vital to our understanding of Spinoza’s response to the “theologico-political problem” (Smith 1997) that plagued the Dutch Republic. (For two recent first-rate monographs on the TTP that situate Spinoza’s critique of Scripture in historical context, see Nadler 2011 and James 2012)

Among the politically relevant claims that Spinoza makes in the first fifteen chapters of the work is that Scripture does not compete with philosophy as a source of knowledge; nor do the injunctions of Scripture compete with the commands of civil authorities. By separating faith from reason and making religion’s role in the public realm subordinate to that of the state, Spinoza tries to sanitize religion of its pernicious superstitious aspects. We may call the claim that faith is distinct from reason the separation thesis and the claim that religious law is dependent on and determined by civil law the single authority thesis.

3.2 Separation Thesis

At one point Spinoza calls the task of establishing the separation of faith from philosophy “the principal purpose of the whole work” (TTP 14/179). And a good deal of the biblical criticism in the TTP can be understood as paving the way for the separation thesis, since in the earlier chapters much of what Spinoza is doing is undermining the claim of Scripture as a source of genuine knowledge. The value of Scripture does not lie in its mysteries or its abstruse metaphysical content, since to the extent that it is concerned with these matters it is—by Spinoza’s lights—utterly confused. Rather, it lies in the simple moral truths that Scripture contains, which encourage obedience to the state (Ch. 13). The books of Scripture are written for an unsophisticated, uneducated audience and convey information in a way that is suited to such an audience, in the form of fantastical accounts and parables that appeal to the imagination rather than the intellect. And so, Spinoza argues, although Scripture may appear to reveal profound truths about God’s nature and his participation in our world, its salient message is not metaphysical, but moral: “Scripture requires nothing of men other than obedience, and condemns not ignorance, but disobedience” (TTP 13/173). The ethical message of loving God and loving one’s neighbor is the backbone of all religion (Ch. 12), the whole of divine law (TTP 14/178).

This ethical understanding of religion is reflected in the way that Spinoza re-conceives of several crucial religious concepts. For instance, he claims that a text is sacred to the extent that it fosters devotion to God and charity to others (e.g., TTP 12/151) and that a person’s piety is measured in terms of her or his commitment to justice, charity, and obedience. Since the aim of religion is obedience and good works, and the aim of philosophy is truth, religion and philosophy ought not to be seen as rivals. By separating religion and philosophy, faith and reason, Spinoza distances himself both from those who—like Maimonides and Spinoza’s friend Ludwig Meyer—contort Scripture to make it conform to reason and those who claim that where Scripture conflicts with reason it is reason that we must renounce (TTP, Ch. 15). According to Spinoza, because reason and faith have separate domains, neither is subservient to the other. The separation thesis has profound political import, since by claiming that religion is not, like philosophy, a source of knowledge, Spinoza undercuts the grounds for the theological disputes that were the source of considerable unrest in the Dutch Republic. The dominant message of the separation thesis is that Scripture is not the source of metaphysical knowledge and so we ought not to treat it as authoritative in these matters.

3.3 Single Authority Thesis

However, since Scripture does have a positive socio-political function in promoting justice and charity, one might wonder how much authority the clergy has in public matters. Spinoza’s response is that “authority in sacred matters belongs wholly to the sovereign powers ” (Ch. 19, title). Like Hobbes, he embraces the Erastian position that religious law is realized through the will of the civil authority (TTP, Ch. 19). The crux of the single authority thesis is this: the sovereign is the sole civil and religious authority. Indeed, because piety consists in practicing justice and obedience, and because there is no standard of justice other than the will of the sovereign (TTP 19, 239ff; EIVP37S2), “it is also the duty of the sovereign authority alone to lay down how a person should behave with piety towards their neighbor, that is, to determine how one is obliged to obey God” (TTP 19, 242–3). The obvious, yet important, implication of the single authority thesis is that clerics are at best spiritual advisors with no real claim to political power. The problem of dual allegiances (divine and civil) is overcome, since the two authorities converge in the form of the sovereign.

The argument against ecclesiastical power here depends upon the supposition that there is no transcendental standard of piety. Of course, a sovereign could delegate authority to religious functionaries, but Spinoza cautions against this, using the case of the Hebrews to illustrate the dangers of priestly authority. The decisive turn that precipitated the decline of the first Hebrew state came with the ascendance of a priestly order. On Spinoza’s account, under Moses, civil law and religion “were one and the same thing” (TTP 17, 213) and the Jews lived peaceably. However, when the priests—chiefly the Levites—were given the right to interpret divine law, “each of them began seeking glory for his own name in religion and everything else...As a result religion degenerated into fatal superstition” (TTP 18, 231). The message here had clear application in the Dutch context, where, as we’ve noted, Calvinist theocrats—who formed a menacing alliance with the house of Orange—were increasingly wielding power to the detriment of peace and stability (see Nadler 1999, 283–4).

Spinoza punctuates his historical analysis of the Hebrew state by drawing four lessons about the theologico-political problem, three of which are relevant here: (1) civil stability requires the limitation of ecclesiastical power; (2) it is disastrous for religious leaders to govern speculative matters; and (3) the sovereign must remain the sole legislator. These historical observations support Spinoza’s principle of toleration, which I discuss below.

3.4 Positive Function of Religion

Despite its potential for harm, Spinoza thinks that religion can perform a positive social function. It can help to breed an obedient spirit, making people pliable to civil law—in this way religion plays a role in bolstering the state (e.g., TTP 14/168; cf. Moses’ use of a state religion, TTP 5/66). For instance, the ceremonial laws and practices of the Jews helped to foster and preserve cohesion among an ignorant, nomadic populace (TTP Ch. 3 and Ch. 5). The central moral message of religion—namely, to love one’s neighbor (e.g., TTP 14, 179)—may be understood through reason; but Scripture presents this message in a manner that is suited to the understanding of the masses (TTP 14, 184; see Strauss 1965, Ch. 9 and Smith 1997, Ch. 2). Religion also seems to play a crucial role in promoting compliance with the law. Michael Rosenthal has suggested that in Spinoza’s scheme “transcendental beliefs” assist in overcoming free rider problems; defections from agreements and non-compliance with the law would likely be widespread among human beings were it not for religion (Rosenthal 1998).

The salutary function of religion is undermined when sectarianism emerges. When groups like the Pharisees begin to regard themselves as special, disparaging and persecuting other groups, civil order is disrupted. In order to prevent such fissures, Spinoza puts forth a universal or civil religion that captures the moral core of a plurality of faiths, to which all citizens can subscribe, irrespective of what other private beliefs they hold (TTP 14, 182–3). Like Rousseau after him, Spinoza thought that a universal public religion could bolster civic solidarity, channeling religious passions into social benefits.

3.5 Spinoza’s Argument for Toleration

Spinoza is often remembered for his contribution to the liberal tradition, due, in large part, to his defense of the freedoms of thought and speech in TTP 20. However, the tolerationism expressed in TTP 20 appears to stand in tension with the Erastian claim of TTP 19. How can Spinoza be a liberal about religious practice while also defending the view that the state maintains full right over matters of religion (TTP, Ch. 19)? There are three things worth noting here. First, unlike Locke’s tolerationism, Spinoza’s defense of civil liberties in TTP 20 is not fundamentally a defense freedom of worship (Israel 2001, 265–266). Rather, it is essentially a defense of the freedom to philosophize; freedom of worship is at best an incidental byproduct of this primary aim. Second, Spinoza distinguishes between outward expressions of faith and one’s inward worship of God. Sovereign authority over religious expression concerns only the former, leaving the latter the domain of the individual, for reasons that we will examine in a moment. Both of these positions can be understood as lending support to the Arminian cause against Calvinist Theocrats (Nadler 1999, 12). Finally, it should be mentioned that Spinoza’s denial that freedoms concerning outward religious expression must be protected points to the limited nature of his brand of toleration. The sovereign retains full discretion to determine which actions are acceptable and what forms of speech are seditious. As Lewis Feuer ruefully notes, Spinoza does not offer anything resembling Oliver Wendell Holmes’s standard of “clear and present danger” to constrain sovereign intervention (1987, 114).

What are Spinoza’s arguments for his, albeit limited, defense freedoms of thought and speech? The first argument is that it is strictly impossible to control another’s beliefs completely (20, 250–51). Since right is coextensive with power, lacking the power to control beliefs entails lacking the right to do so. However, since Spinoza admits that beliefs can be influenced in myriad ways, even if not fully controlled, this argument amounts to a rather restricted defense of freedom of conscience.

Next, the argument shifts from considering what the sovereign can do to what it would be practical or prudent for a sovereign to do. Spinoza offers a battery of pragmatic reasons in defense of non-interference. For instance, he argues that “a state can never succeed very far in attempting to force people to speak as the sovereign power commands” (TTP 20, 251). Men are naturally inclined to express what they believe (ibid.), and so just as attempts to regulate beliefs fail, so do attempts to regulate the expressions of these beliefs. Moreover, even if a state were to regulate speech, this would only result in the erosion of good faith [fides] on which civil associations depend, since men would be “thinking one thing and saying something else” (TTP 20, 255). It is thus foolish to seek to regulate all speech, even if it is also “very dangerous” to grant unlimited freedom of speech (TTP 20, 252).

Spinoza also argues that in general the more oppressively a sovereign governs, the more rebellious the citizens will be, since most people are “so constituted that there is nothing they would more reluctantly put up with than that the opinions they belief to be true should be outlawed” (TTP 20, 255). The source of oppression and the resistance to it have a common root on Spinoza’s account, namely, ambition, or the desire for others to approve of the same things that we do (see EIIIP29; cf. Rosenthal 2001 and 2003). Men being constituted as they are, when differences of opinion arise—as they inevitably do—they are inclined to foist their standard on others and to resist others’ attempts to do the same. So, however common attempts to regulate the beliefs, speech, and behavior of others may be, it is politically unstable to do so. Moreover, Spinoza argues that it is often the least wise and the most obnoxious who initiate moral crusades, and just as it is often the wisest and most peace-loving who are the targets of such campaigns (TTP 20, 256–58).

It is worth noting that these arguments in defense of civil liberties are thoroughly pragmatic; they rely on psychological principles and empirical observations to illustrate the instability and imprudence of oppressive governance (see Steinberg 2010b). They are not principled arguments that depend on rights or the intrinsic value of liberty, much to the frustration of some commentators (Feuer 1987; Curley 1996).

3.6 Social Contract in the TTP

A good deal of scholarly attention has been placed on Spinoza’s account of the social contract in the TTP. Spinoza introduces the contract in Chapter 16, when considering how people escape the pre-civil condition. Here he claims that “[men] had to make a firm decision, and reach agreement, to decide everything by the sole dictate of reason” (TTP 16, 198), which requires, as he later makes clear, that each transfers one’s right to determine how to live and defend himself to the sovereign (TTP 16, 199–200); cf. EIVP37S2). He also cites the establishment of the Hebrew state, with Moses as the absolute sovereign, as an historical example of a social contract (TTP 19, 240). The social contract seems to confer nearly boundless authority on the sovereign. So long as we are rational, “we are obliged to carry out absolutely all commands of the sovereign power, however absurd they may be” (TTP 16, 200).

However, if Spinoza really relies upon the social contract as a source of legitimacy, several problems arise. First of all, it seems unlikely that such a contract could ever have been formed, since the legitimating strength of a social contract depends on farsighted rationality that Spinoza clearly thinks most people lack (see Den Uyl 1983).

But even if such a contract were possible, a much greater problem remains for Spinoza. How can we take seriously a legitimacy-conferring contract without violating the naturalism that is at the core of Spinoza’s metaphysics? What is this right that is surrendered or transferred? And how can one really transfer one’s right, given the coextensivity of right and power? Spinoza’s naturalistic, utility-based account of obligation (see 2.2, above) also seems to preclude the possibility of a binding social contract.

Some commentators take these problems with Spinoza’s social contract to be insurmountable, and for this reason they regard him as coming to his senses when he abandons the contract in the TP (Wernham 1958, 25–27). Others have tried to reinterpret the contract in a way that is makes it consistent with his naturalism. For instance, Barbone and Rice distinguish between two concepts that have been rendered in English as “power.” On the one hand there is potentia, which is the power that is essential to the individual (Barbone and Rice 2000, 17). This power in inalienable. What is transferable is one’s potestas, i.e. one’s authority (Barbone and Rice 2000, 17) or coercive power (Blom 1995, 211).

While this interpretation has the virtue of cohering with Spinoza’s claim that he “always preserve[s] the natural right in its entirety” (Epistle 50), since one’s right, or potentia, always remains intact, it leaves unexplained how potestas, which Barbone and Rice describe as a “super-added” capacity, fits into the natural order. What can it mean to possess, transfer, or renounce one’s potestas? And how can transferring or revoking it result in an obligation, given Spinoza’s utility-based account of obligation?

Perhaps the best way to understand what it means to possess or give up one potestas is in psychological terms. Curley suggests this when he looks to Hobbes’ claim in Behemoth that “the power of the mighty hath no foundation but in the opinion and belief of the people” (EW VI, 184, 237—cited in Curley 1996, 326) as a way of understanding Spinoza’s conception of sovereign formation. One could also cite Hobbes’ famous claim in Leviathan that “reputation of power is power” (Ch. 10) as an expression of the same point. These passages can be understood as supporting the view that power is not transferred by way of a speech act, but rather by standing in the psychological thrall of the sovereign. Sovereignty is the product of psychological deference rather than the formal transference of rights or titles.

Some evidence in support of this psychological interpretation comes in TTP 17, where Spinoza claims that sovereign power or authority derives from the will of its subjects to obey (TTP 17, 209–10; cf. TP 2/9–10). There are places in the text, however, when Spinoza seems to imply that we have obligations to the sovereign irrespective of our psychological or motivational state. In some of these instances, a careful reading reveals that nothing of the sort is implied. For instance, his claim that “we are obliged to carry absolutely all the commands of the sovereign power, however absurd they may be” (TTP 16, 200) is contingent on our behaving rationally and wanting to avoid being regarded as enemies of the state. Still, there are other places when he does imply that de facto obedience is neither necessary nor sufficient for establishing the legitimacy of a civil body. For instance, he claims that the sovereign alone has right over religious matters such as interpreting Scripture, excommunicating heretics, and making provisions for the poor (TTP 19, 239 - 40), despite the fact that the church had, in fact, been exercising power in these matters. But this too can be reconciled with Spinoza’s naturalism, provided that we understand that the power or authority of clerics devolves upon them from the power or authority of the sovereign.

4. The Tractatus Politicus

One might wonder why Spinoza, having published the TTP in 1670, spent the last years of his life (until his death in 1677) working on a second political treatise that covers some of the same ground as the first. It is tempting to suppose that he must have come to reject many of his earlier views. However, with the possible exception of his view of the social contract (see 4.1), there is little evidence that Spinoza came to reject any of the central claims of his earlier treatise. Rather, the TP is distinguished from the earlier treatise chiefly by its aims and rhetorical style. Whereas the TTP was an occasional piece, written for an audience of liberal Christian theologians to address the problems posed by officious Calvinist theocrats, the TP is concerned with the general organization of the state and was written for philosophers. In the later treatise, Spinoza abandons what has been described as the “theological idiom of popular persuasion” in favor of the dispassionate style of a political scientist (Feuer 1987, 151; cf. Balibar 1998, 50).

The TP is a fitting sequel to the Ethics (Matheron 1969). Whereas the Ethics reveals the path to individual freedom, the TP reveals the extent to which individual freedom depends on civil institutions (Steinberg 2018a). We should not be surprised to find Spinoza’s philosophy taking a civic turn near the end of his life. From his earliest writings, he claims that he is concerned not just to perfect his own nature but also “to form a society of the kind that is desirable, so that as many as possible may attain [a flourishing life] as easily and surely as possible” (TdIE, §14). The TP may be seen as Spinoza’s attempt to articulate some of the conditions for the possibility of such a society.

The work can be divided into three sections. In the first section (roughly through Chapter 4), Spinoza discusses the metaphysical basis of the state and the natural limits of state power. In the second section (Chapter 5), Spinoza lays out the general aims of the state. And in the third section (Chapter 6 to the end), Spinoza gives specific recommendations for how various regime forms—monarchy, aristocracy, and democracy—are to be constituted so as to satisfy the aims of the state as set out in section two.

4.1 Metaphysical Background

In the early chapters of the TP, Spinoza puts forth his naturalistic program, beginning with the premise that the state, like everything else, is a natural thing (res naturalis), governed by the laws of nature (see Bartuschat 1984, 30). It is in this light that we can appreciate Spinoza’s claim that “one should not look for the causes and natural foundations of the state in the teachings of reason” (1/7). It has seemed to some (e.g., Wernham 1958, 265n) that this statement indicates a sharp break with the contractarian conception of the state formation advanced in the TTP. This view is supported by the fact that virtually no mention of a social contract is made in the later treatise (Wernham 1958, 25; Matheron 1990). This would also fit with Lewis Feuer’s suggestion that the later treatise betrays a dimmer view of the masses, perhaps brought on by the events of 1672 (1987, ch. 5). At the very least, this passage illustrates a break with the ultra-rational conception of the social contract that appears to lie behind some of the claims of the TTP.

However, Spinoza’s account of the state as the spontaneous product of natural passions is perfectly consistent with the psychological interpretation of the contract (§3.6, above). Indeed, he seems to support such a view in his work when he claims that individuals are under the right [sub potestate] of the commonwealth (3/5), regardless of whether they obey its laws from fear or love of civic order (2/10; 3/8). They stand under the right or power of the sovereign, because they are held (psychologically) in its sway.

But what exactly does it mean to deduce the foundations of the state from the nature of men? In the TP Spinoza tells us that men, who are individually weak and effectively powerless compared to the aggregated powers of others (2/15; Cf. EIVP5dem.), come together as a result of “some common emotion...a common hope, or common fear, or desire to avenge some common injury” (6/1; see Matheron 1969 and 1990). The state is thus an unintended, but salutary, outcome of the natural interplay of human passions. In this sense, the civil condition is a natural condition. Because, on this view, stable patterns of behavior emerge from blind interplay of the passions, thereby overcoming coordination problems, some have regarded Spinoza’s account as “evolutionary,” anticipating the theory of unintended consequences found in Mandeville, Smith, and Hayek (Den Uyl 1985 and 1983). However, Spinoza says precious little about the process of civil formation itself in the TP, making such an interpretation deeply underdetermined, at best. While one can, like Den Uyl (ibid.) or Matheron (1969, 1990), construct a genetic story on the basis of Spinozistic psychology, the account that Spinoza himself offers is quite thin.

4.2 General Aim of the State

Having established in the preceding chapters that anything that can be done is done by right, Spinoza turns directly the question of how the sovereign should exercise its power in Chapter Five, noting that there is an important distinction between doing something by right and doing it in the best way (5/1). Here his concern is just to delineate the general aim of the state on the basis of which he can give more fine-grained recommendations relative to regime forms (see 4.3). The fundamental aim of the state, according to Spinoza, is “peace and security of life” [pax vitaeque securitas] (5/2). To grasp what Spinoza means here we must try to understand what he means by peace. Spinoza rejects Hobbes’ definition of peace as the “absence of war” (De Cive 1, 12), calling it instead “a virtue which comes from strength of mind” (5/4), or a “union or harmony of minds” (6/4). It is one thing for a state to persist or to avoid the ravages of war, it is quite another for the state to flourish. Spinoza makes this point by way of an organic metaphor:

So when we say that the best state is one where men pass their lives in harmony, I am speaking of human life, which is characterized not just by the circulation of the blood and other features common to animals, but especially by reason, the true virtue and life of the mind. (5/5)

But if the aim of the state is peace, and peace consists in the “harmony of minds” or the rational activity, one might wonder how it is that the state could hope to achieve its end in light of Spinoza’s skepticism concerning human rationality (1/5; 2/5; 6/1). How is it that the state can promote the civic virtue or “strength of mind” [fortitudo] on which peace depends (5/2, 5/3)? This is perhaps the central normative question of the TP (see Steinberg 2009; Steinberg 2018a). Spinoza addresses this question by way of offering institutional recommendations for each regime type.

4.3 Constitutionalism and Model Regimes

To see how Spinoza provides a general response to the question of how peace or civic agreement is promoted, we must bear in mind that the relation of agreement comes in degrees (see Blom 1993; Steinberg 2009). Total agreement, what Blom calls “maximal agreement,” is possible only to the extent that men are fully rational (EIVP31–EIVP35). A society of free men would be a perfect union (EIVP67–73). However, the free man exists only as an ideal; all actual men are imperfectly rational. The concern of the state is to bring it about that the actual relationships between people most closely approximate the ideal society of free men. That is, the aim of the state is to make irrational, selfish men as rational and virtuous as possible. (For tension between idealist and realist features of Spinoza’s political thought, see Armstrong 2009).

Spinoza’s solution, in broad form, is to adopt constitutional measures and institutional procedures that channel the natural passions of men towards the common good. The vision here is one of mechanizing reason in much the same way the Venetian Republic is said to have mechanized virtù (Pocock 1975, 284), a vision much indebted to the works of the De la Courts. Civil rationality is the product of a republican set of institutions that encourage broad participation, public deliberation, and the adoption of a variety of accountability-promoting mechanisms. A rationally organized state will not only promote the common good, in so doing it will also strengthen the civic commitment of its citizens; this is one key way in which the state contributes to the reorientation of the affects of its citizens and increases the level of agreement between citizens, the product of which is harmony or peace (Steinberg 2009; Steinberg 2018a)

4.3.1 Monarchy

Given that the fundamental aim of the state is peace, the question that Spinoza seeks to address in chapters 6 and 7 of the Political Treatise is how a monarchy is to be organized so as to be maximally peaceful. He begins by repeating the claim that men are largely irrational and selfish. And since the passions of common men must be regulated, it is tempting to suppose, as Hobbes does, that heavy-handed governance is required. But Spinoza claims that even if a despot is able to minimize violence and dissent, as the Turkish Sultans were (6/4), this produces only “slavery, barbarism, and desolation,” not the sort of peace or agreement among men that is the true end of the state. Indeed, Spinoza claims that the more completely authority is vested in one man the worse off everyone is, including the despot himself (6/8). This is because the King is likely to look after his advantage alone, neglecting the general welfare, which will ultimately result in the weakening of the civitas. In order to overcome this condition, it is essential for there to be constitutional checks on the behavior of the monarch. These foundational laws are to be understood as the king’s “permanent decrees” [aeterna decreta], expressing his real interests, which are not to be contravened. Spinoza likens these “decrees” to Ulysses’ order that his oarsmen keep him bound to the mast of his ship even when he is beckoned by the Sirens’ song (7/1). One of the central constitutional checks is that the King deliberate with, and in some sense answer to, a large council composed of citizens (6/15–30). Moreover, since the council members too are likely to be selfish and venal, it is important that their private interests are bound up with the common good (7/4; cf. 7/27–29). As McShea puts it, a properly constituted state will be like a “homeostatic mechanism” (1968, 109), correcting divisive or destructive tendencies by ensuring that an individual’s interests is always tied to the interests of others. For instance, Spinoza writes that in a properly constituted state:

The king…whether motivated by fear of the people or by his desire to win over the greater part of an armed populace, or whether he is led by nobility of spirit to have regard to the public interest, will always ratify the opinion that is supported by most votes-i.e., (by Section 5 of this Chapter), that is of the greater advantage to the greater part of the state; or else he will try, if possible, to reconcile the differing opinions submitted to him so as to gain popularity with all (7/11).

Ultimately, a model monarchy will be a constitutional monarchy that will strongly resemble a democracy. This fits with Matheron’s suggestion that, because state power is fundamentally based in the power of the people, those states that deviate least from a democracy will be most powerful (Matheron 1997). Nevertheless, the fact that Spinoza countenanced the possibility that “a people can preserve a considerable degree of freedom under a king” (7/31), can be seen as a resignation to the reality of Orangism after the events of 1672 (Blom 2007; Steinberg 2008).

4.3.2 Aristocracy

Spinoza discusses two types of aristocracy and the best forms of each. The first is a centralized aristocracy that appears to have been modeled on the Venetian Republic (McShea 1968, 117; Haitsma Mulier 1980). The second is a decentralized aristocracy, in which sovereignty is held by several cities. This type of aristocracy, which Spinoza takes to be superior (9/15), is evidently modeled on the United Provinces. While Spinoza’s recommendations vary between these two types of aristocracy, many of the general features remain the same. Spinoza argues, in proto-Madisonian fashion, that the council of patricians must be sizable so as to reduce the potential for factionalism (e.g., 8/1; 8/38). He also claims that a large council will protect against selfish or irrational governance (8/6; 9/14). As is the case in Spinoza’s discussion of monarchy, the emphasis here is on finding mechanisms that balance the interests of participants and encourage cohesion (e.g., 8/19–8/24). One important way in which cohesion is encouraged is through the promulgation of the “universal faith” or civil religion set out in TTP 16 (8/46).

Given that there will generally be more checks on authority and a greater diffusion of political power in aristocracies than in monarchies, we should not find it surprising that Spinoza claims that aristocracies are likely to be more absolute than monarchies (8/7), since a state is “absolute” to the extent that it incorporates the rights of all its members and minimizes the basis for dissent (8/3, 8/4, 8/7; Steinberg 2018b). Absoluteness thus indicates a norm very much like peace, the cardinal civil norm; so to say that one regime form is more absolute than another amounts to declaring its superiority.

While Spinoza clearly indicates that aristocracies are, on the whole and in most cases, superior to monarchies, a more interesting and somewhat more vexed question is how aristocracies compare with democracies. Raia Prokhovnik, for example, has claimed that aristocracy is “the form of government [Spinoza] on mature reflection prefers” (2004, 210; cf. Feuer 1987 and Melamed 2013). I believe that there are strong reasons for denying that aristocracy displaces democracy in the TP as Spinoza’s preferred regime. Spinoza does note that the election of patricians as opposed to the birthright privileges of participants in a democracy gives aristocracies an advantage in theory (11/2). However, this advantage is offset by the biased, self-serving practices of most patricians (ibid.). And since Spinoza claims that democracy is the most absolute form of regime (e.g., 11/1), it would seem that—again, on the whole and in most cases—Spinoza favors democracy. Ultimately, though, Spinoza is less interested in rank-ordering regimes than he is in determining how each regime-type must be organized in order to maximize freedom and the common good.

4.3.3 Democracy

Spinoza had barely begun writing the first of what would likely have been two chapters on democracy when he died on February 21, 1677. His conception of democracy includes any system of popular governance in which the governing members acquire the right to participate by virtue of their civil status rather than by election. This conception of democracy is broad enough to include even variants of timocracy. Spinoza’s own model democracy excludes all those who are not sui iuris—e.g., women, servants (servos), and foreigners—as well those who do not lead “respectable lives” (honesteque vivunt) (11/3). These elitist and exclusionary aspects of Spinoza’s democracy taint what would otherwise appear to be a rather progressive form of democracy, from as much as we can glean from remarks scattered throughout the text.

The general tenor of Spinoza’s democracy is easy to infer from his discussions of monarchy and aristocracy, both of which include strong democratic elements. What is particularly interesting is how Spinoza defends these democratic features, since this gives us insight into how democracies are to be defended in general. In the TTP Spinoza seems to provides both principled and instrumental arguments in favor of democracy. The principled reason is that democracies preserve men’s natural equality (TTP 16, 202) and natural freedom (TTP 5/65). The major instrumental defense of democracy is that “there is less reason in a democratic state to fear absurd proceedings” (16/184). In the TP, Spinoza focuses exclusively on the instrumental defense, highlighting what has recently been called the epistemic advantage of democracy, i.e., the tendency of popular assemblies to legislate more wisely than other legislative bodies (e.g., Cohen, 1986; Estlund 1997; Steinberg 2010a; cf. entry on democracy. For instance, he repeats his claim that larger councils are more likely to be rational because collective decisions force members to “have as their objective what is honourable, or at least appears so” (8/6). He claims that the deliberative features of large governing bodies improve competency, since “men’s wits are too obtuse to get straight to the heart of every question, but by discussing, listening to others, and debating, their wits are sharpened” (9/14). Spinoza also rebuffs those who claim that there is “no truth or judgment in the common people” (7/27), claiming that “all men share in one and the same nature” and that differences in competency stem primarily from the fact that the masses are kept ignorant of the most important affairs of the state (ibid.; cf. 7/4). Contrary to Feuer’s suggestion that events such as the murders of the de Witts led to an anti-democratic turn in Spinoza’s thought, these passages reveal the depth of Spinoza’s commitment to democracy and his refusal to endorse the thesis that some men are innately more fit to govern than others. So despite the fact that the explicit discussion of democracy in the TP was largely preempted by the author’s death, this work remains a significant contribution to democratic theory.

5. The Place of the State in Spinoza’s Ontology

In recent years a lively discussion has emerged in the scholarly literature concerning whether or not Spinoza’s state is an individual with its own conatus. At issue in this debate is whether Spinoza was more of a collectivist or an individualist. The answer to this question is thought to carry implications for how we conceive of Spinoza’s relationship to the liberal tradition. Some of the strongest evidence in support of the conception of the state as an individual comes from the so-called physical digression between IIP13 and IIP14, where Spinoza directly discusses individuality. In this section, Spinoza tells us that an individual is a composite body whose parts “communicate their motion to each other in a certain fixed manner” (II/100, A2, def, A3). The parts of an individual may be replaced, but the individual will persist, provided that the “same ratio of motion and rest” is retained (ibid., L5, L4). Moreover, individuals who come together to act in a fixed way form larger individuals, terminating ultimately in the supreme-individual: the whole of nature (II/101-102, L7). Elsewhere in the Ethics, when remarking on the benefits of human associations, Spinoza claims that “if…two individuals of entirely the same nature are joined to one another, they compose an individual twice as powerful as each one” (IVP18S). Here, once again, Spinoza delineates a picture of composite, higher-order individuals, opening up the possibility of viewing the state itself as an individual.

Alexandre Matheron’s Individu et Communauté chez Spinoza contains perhaps the most influential interpretation of Spinoza’s account of individuality (1969, esp. Ch. 3). Matheron identifies political societies as individuals, characterized by their own “formal element,” i.e., their own unique ratio of motion and rest (see e.g., p. 42, 58). Following Matheron, Etienne Balibar views the state as a highly composite individual, as an “individual of individuals, having a ‘body’ and a ‘soul’ or mind” (1998, 64), a status that he calls elsewhere “transindividuality” (1997). Others who have espoused this view include Meinecke (1965) and Blom (2007).

This interpretation has been challenged in a number of ways. One argument against the view is that in the opening passages of TTP 17 Spinoza, in contrast to Hobbes, claims that individuals always retain a “considerable part” of their own natural right; in other words, human beings are never fully integrated into the super-individual, or state (Den Uyl 1983, 70). The problem with this objection is that there is no reason to suppose that all individuals are characterized by complete integration of parts. Matheron, for instance, describes the state as complex individual whose parts are only integrated to a limited degree (1969, 58). Balibar, too, claims that the “autonomy” of individuals is maintained even when one is a part of a larger collective whole (1997, 21). It is perfectly consistent to recognize the discrete individuality of humans while allowing that, under certain conditions of association, individuals can simultaneously be members of larger units. One can be both a collectivist and an individualist. The real anti-individualists are the idealists, who read Spinoza as maintaining that “human individuality is illusory and untrue” (Joachim 1901, 130).

A second objection to the view that the state is an individual is that, whereas singular things can only be destroyed by external causes (IIIP4), “a commonwealth is always in greater danger from its citizens than from its enemies” (e.g., TP 6/6). If we assume that all individuals are singular things (for a helpful discussion of the relationship between these concepts, see D. Garrett 1994), then the fact that states can ostensibly be destroyed by their parts (i.e., citizens) would be a sufficient basis for denying that they are individuals (Barbone and Rice 2000, 26–7). This is a forceful objection. However, it seems that an analysis of the apparent self-destruction of the commonwealth could be provided that parallels Spinoza’s attempt to explain how suicide is possible in light of the conatus doctrine (EIVP20S). An apparently self-destructive state could be regarded as one that is so affected by “hidden external causes,” so overwhelmed by destructive passions, that it takes on a new nature that is contrary to its original nature (ibid.). Specifically, Spinoza could explain cases of apparent civil self-destruction by maintaining that they occur only at the hands of poorly-integrated individuals who stand, at least to some degree, outside of the body politic. While this form of explanation is not without problems (see Bennett 1984, §56), it is not obvious that these problems are peculiar to collectivist interpretations of the state.

A third challenge to the collectivist interpretation is that if the state is an individual, it should have a mind of its own. But Steven Barbone points out that references to the mind of the state are typically preceded by qualifying phrases like veluti (“as it were”) and quasi (“as if”), indicating that the state has a mind only in a metaphorical sort of way (Barbone 2001, pp. 104–105). This objection might be mitigated by arguing that individuality is itself a matter of degree and that states are at best “loose” individuals (Della Rocca 1996, Ch. 2), with limited cohesion or regularity of action. This is consistent with the claim, noted above, that integration into a larger union is itself a matter of degree.

Ultimately, it seems to me that far less hinges on the success or failure of the collectivist interpretation than has been assumed by its opponents. The primary concern expressed by critics like Den Uyl and Barbone seems to be that Spinoza not be understood as treating the state as an individual with its own interests that might trump the interests of its constituents. Isaiah Berlin condemned Spinoza along with other positive liberty theorists precisely because he took Spinoza to be reifying the state and putting state interests above individual interests (1969). But even if the state is an individual, it does not follow that its interests would supersede the interests of its citizens. Certainly from the perspective of a citizen, there is no reason why one would have to put the interests of the state above one’s own interests if these two were genuinely to come into to conflict. In short, the collectivist can embrace the normative primacy of the individual human being. If this is allowed, the matter of whether the state is a literal or merely metaphorical individual seems to matter far less than many scholars have supposed.

6. The Reception and Influence of Spinoza’s Political Philosophy

In is difficult to assess adequately the scope of influence of Spinoza’s political thought. Even where Spinoza’s influence on subsequent political thinkers is direct and indisputable, it is not always easy to tease out the extent to this influence is due to his own political philosophy, as opposed to his metaphysics. Further complicating the assessment is the fact that Spinoza and Spinozism remained a bugbear throughout Europe for much of the late 17th and 18th centuries, during which time Spinozism was widely associated with atheism. For this reason, even sympathetic philosophers often sought to distance their views from Spinoza’s, positioning themselves as critics or downplaying familiarity with his texts. Nevertheless, we find traces of the influence of Spinoza’s political writings throughout the Enlightenment, along with an array of hostile responses.

The publication of the unfinished TP in Spinoza’s posthumous Opera was met with relative indifference, upstaged as it was by the simultaneous appearance of Ethics (Laerke 2010, 122). However, the TTP was read, discussed, and condemned in the decades following its publication. The critical reception tended to focus on the perceived anti-religious features of the work—for instance, the refutation of miracles and the denial of the divine origin of the Pentateuch—but the naturalistic account of right and law and the arguments for the freedom to philosophize also provoked debate.

Jakob Thomasius, Leibniz’s teacher in Leipzig, composed a work, Adversus Anonymum, de Libertate Philosophandi, devoted entirely to the refutation of the TTP and its underlying naturalism. Leibniz too seems to have regarded Spinoza’s views on right and law as more dangerous even than Hobbes’, for while Hobbes at least allowed conceptual space for a divine legislator, Spinoza did not (Laerke 2010, 125). Even relatively liberal natural lawyers like Lambert van Velthuysen (1622–1685) and Samuel Pufendorf (1632–1694), regarded Spinoza’s treatment of right and obligation as fundamentally destructive. Velthuysen objects that, without a divine legislator, there is “no room left for precepts and commandments” (Ep. 42) in Spinoza’s philosophy. And Pufendorf maintains that Spinoza’s conception of right is defective in that it fails to produce a “moral effect” or to put others under obligations (Pufendorf 1934, 391; see Curley 1995).

While Spinoza’s views on right and law were generally met with contempt, his views on the freedom to philosophize [libertas philosophandi] provoked a more balanced reaction. The doctrine had its critics (see e.g., Israel 2010, 81–2), but it also had its admirers, perhaps including some of the most prominent early-modern tolerationists. Bayle, Locke, and Toland, for instance, were familiar with Spinoza’s defense and likely found some inspiration in it, even while they denied deep acquaintance (Locke) or situated themselves as critics (Bayle and Toland). Toland’s use in Pantheisticon of the same epigram from the opening of Tacitus’ Histories—“rare are the happy times when we may think what we wish and say what we think [rara temporum felicitas ubi sentire quae velis et quae sentias dicere licet]”– that Spinoza draws from in the title of TTP, Ch. 20 indicates an affinity between the two thinkers on matters of freedom of speech and thought (for more on the use of this epigram in the 17th and 18th centuries, see Paul Russell 2010, Ch. 7),

Later enlightenment thinkers reprise Spinoza’s claim that whereas the freedoms of thought and expression should be protected, one ought to obey the sovereign’s decisions on matters of action (TTP 20, 251–2). Echoes of this view may be found in Moses Mendelssohn’s separation of action and conviction in Jerusalem (Mendelssohn 1983, 40; Gottlieb 2011, 50), a work for which one scholar maintains that the TTP “serves, if not as model, at least as decisive subtext” (Goetschel 2004, 168). This division was even adopted by Frederick the Great, whose policy that men may argue about whatever they wish, provided that they obey is famously celebrated in Kant’s essay “What is Enlightenment?” [Was ist Aufklärung?].

Finally, it is worth mentioning Spinoza’s influence on the democratic thought of the French Enlightenment. Jonathan Israel has examined the myriad ways in which Spinoza’s philosophy shaped egalitarian political thought, including, perhaps most significantly, the political thought of the encyclopédistes (Israel 2011). Spinoza’s influence here is primarily due to his naturalism, which inspired the materialist metaphysics that underpinned French democratic thought, rather than to his political arguments. And Spinoza’s realist and arguably anti-revolutionary political method suggests that even if Spinoza’s philosophy influenced revolutionary democratic thought, it may have had little to do with his actual political philosophy. (For divergent assessments of Spinoza’s attitude towards revolution, see Rosenthal 2013 and Sharp 2013). Nevertheless, one finds more than a whiff of Spinoza’s absolutist conception of democracy in the accounts of the general will [volonté générale] found in Rousseau (see Ekstein 1944; Williams 2010) and Diderot (Israel 2011).

More recently, Spinoza’s political philosophy has figured prominently in post-1968 leftist French political thought (for a survey, see van Bunge 2012). However, in the United States, few political philosophers have seriously engaged Spinoza’s work, even while scholarly interest has grown. There is reason to hope, however, that as Spinoza continues to emerge from Hobbes’ shadow, political philosophers here may begin to appreciate the rich, consistent, and resourceful arguments contained in his political writings.


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Note: All English quotations from the TTP are from the Silverthorne and Israel translation. Citations refer to the chapter, followed by page number (e.g., TTP 20, 232 refers to chapter 20, page 232). All references to the TP are to Shirley’s translation. Citations of the TP refer to the chapters/sections (e.g., 5/4 refers to chapter 5, section 4). All references to the Ethics and to the Treatise on the Emendation of the Intellect are to The Collected Works of Spinoza, vol. I. ed. and trans. E.M. Curley (1985). I adopt the following abbreviations for the Ethics: Roman numerals refer to parts; “P” denotes proposition; “C” denotes corollary; “D” denotes definition; “dem.” denotes demonstration; “S” denotes scholium (e.g., EIIIP59S refers to Ethics, part III, proposition 59, scholium). All Latin passages refer to Spinoza Opera, ed. Carl Gebhardt, 4 vols. (Heidelberg: Carl Winter, 1925).

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Other Internet Resources

[Please contact the author with suggestions.]


I wish to thank Michael Rosenthal, Steven B. Smith, and an anonymous reviewer for many helpful comments and suggestions.

Copyright © 2019 by
Justin Steinberg <jsteinberg@brooklyn.cuny.edu>

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