Notes to Tropes

1. Even to call one’s posits ‘tropes’ is by some considered problematic (cf. esp. Bacon 2011). ‘Trope’ was a label first suggested by D. C. Williams (1953a), presumably as a joke (at least according to Bacon 2011 and Schaffer 2001). The literature is ripe with alternative labels, including, but not limited to, abstract particular (Campbell 1990), moment (Mulligan et al. 1984), mode (Heil 2003), qualiton (Bacon 2011), quality instance (Segelberg 1999 [1945,1947,1953]), concrete property (Küng 1967), particular property (Denkel 1996), and unit property (Mertz 1996).

2. Near contemporaries to Williams who also posit tropes or trope-like entities include, Cook Wilson (1926), Strawson (1959), Geach (Geach and Anscombe 1961), Küng (1967), and Wolterstorff (1970) (for even more examples, cf. Mulligan et al. 1984: 293).

3. Mulligan et al. (1984) also note the important influence Brentano has had in this context, not just on Husserl, but on other students of his, including Carl Stumpf and Alexius Meinong.

4. G. F. Stout is well-known for his (1923) debate with G. E. Moore on whether properties are particular or universal. At the time, the general impression was that Moore turned out the ‘winner’ in that debate. But according to Fraser MacBride (2011), the impression is in fact the opposite if the discussion is looked upon with contemporary eyes.

5. Although little known by his contemporaries, Ivar Segelberg is arguably one of the clearest examples—after Husserl—of an early ‘trope’-theorist. Segelberg only published in Swedish. A translation into English of his complete works did not appear until 1999 (for a discussion of Segelberg’s work, cf. Hochberg 1999).

6. More precisely, to Mertz, tropes are fact-generating unifiers or “intensional-determined agent combinators” (Mertz, 2016: xii; cf. also his 1996). Mertz’s views are intriguing, but arguably too different from those of the ‘main-stream’ trope theorist for me to be able to do them justice here.

7. Garcia finds flaws with tropes both on the modifier- and on the module interpretation. If tropes are modules—i.e., if tropes have the character they confer on objects—this conferring must be either what he calls univocal or equivocal. If conferring is univocal, the trope and the object it characterizes ‘have’ the character they do ‘in the same way’, whereas if it is equivocal, they have it ‘in different ways’. If tropes confer their character onto objects univocally, first, this implies a systematic (and, thinks Garcia, problematic) duplication of character. If conferring is equivocal, matters are even worse. For, asks Garcia, what does it even mean to say of the trope and the object that they ‘have’ their respective characters ‘in different ways’? What does it mean to say that, although a mass trope and its bearer are both ‘massive’, they are massive in different ways (Garcia 2016: 510f.)? The alternative is that tropes are modifiers, which means that they do not themselves have the character they confer on objects. The problem with this view, according to Garcia, is that the nature of tropes then becomes something of a mystery. If a blueness-trope isn’t blue, then what is it? How can it make something blue, if it isn’t blue? In the end, Garcia seems to lean towards adopting the modifier view of tropes after all. Modifier tropes, he argues, are better than module tropes at serving as the powers (or dispositions) of objects (2015a: 639). They are also better at playing the role of relations and of fundamental determinables (ibid.). Most importantly to Garcia, if tropes are understood as modifiers this allows him to treat tropes as divine acts able to solve the problem of sustenance (2015b).

8. Note, though, that although most trope theorists are prepared to accept that some tropes are made up from other tropes, a majority still think that at bottom there are tropes that are simple also in the sense that they have no parts, period.

9. Some—a small minority—of the trope theorists seem to want to discard with the simple/complex distinction altogether. According to e.g., Molnar (who defends a theory according to which tropes are ‘pure’ powers) (2003: 37):

There are metaphysical facts about properties that cannot be fitted into a theory that recognizes the distinction between derivative and basic properties…, and first-order and higher-order properties… We can explain structural properties as derivative properties, we do not have to say that they are also, additionally, complex. The contrast between simple and complex properties is not needed. However, I am not arguing for the view that ‘all properties are simple’. I am rather claiming that the distinction between simple (= lacks parts) and complex (= has parts) does not apply at all to properties.

And (ibid., 44):

Ways and modes also cannot be divided into the mereologically molecular and the mereologically atomic. They are neither-simple-nor-complex, in the strongest sense. They have no proper parts and they do not even have themselves as parts. Perhaps what puts properties, ways, and modes altogether outside the scope of mereology is just the fact that they are dependent entities.

10. For even more reasons to prefer tropes over states of affairs, cf. Sect. 3 and 4 of this entry; cf. also Mulligan (2006) (discussed in Hochberg 2014).

11. Hochberg’s argument must be kept separate from what on the surface looks like the same argument, only delivered by Armstrong (and which he—a bit confusingly—names ‘Hochberg’s argument’). Hochberg’s argument rests on our accepting as true the principle that logically independent atomic propositions must have distinct truthmakers (HP), and shows that a trope theorist who insists on the simplicity of tropes is forced to reject precisely this principle. Armstrong doesn’t accept HP in full generality and therefore doesn’t regard a theory that contradicts it as necessarily flawed. Instead, he prefers to argue “simply from a case” (Armstrong 2004: 44; cf. also his 2005)—basically the same case as that set out by Hochberg—to the considerably weaker conclusion that trope theory is “counter-intuitive” (for a critique of Armstrong’s version of the argument, cf. Maurin 2016). A potential strengthening of Hochberg’s argument has been put forward by Ehring. On his version of the argument (2011: 179–180, cf. also Moreland 2001: 70–71):

If a and b are related by arbitrarily different internal relations then a and b are not simple. Trope t is numerically different from trope t* and t resembles t* exactly. Exact resemblance and numerical difference are internal relations that are arbitrarily different from each other. Hence t and t* are not simple.

By ‘arbitrarily different relations’ Ehring means relations such that realization or variation of one, does not necessitate the realization or variation of the other, and (2011: 178) “[t]hat numerical difference and exact resemblance for tropes are arbitrarily different relations is confirmed by the fact that tropes can be numerically different but exactly similar or not exactly similar to each other, and tropes can be exactly similar but identical or numerically distinct from each other”.) Ehring’s version of the argument constitutes a potential strengthening of Hochberg’s argument because, since it isn’t formulated in terms of truthmakers, it doesn’t depend for its success on our accepting a disputed view (truthmaker theory).

12. Cf. also Hakkarainen and Keinänen (2017) who distinguish between ‘ontological form’ and ‘ontological content’ (a distinction they claim was brought into the contemporary discussion from Husserl by Smith 1981 and Smith and Mulligan 1983, with its most prominent contemporary defender being Lowe 2006: 48). It is not entirely clear if and how much this distinction differs from that to which MacBride refers.

13. Giberman hence belongs to the camp of those who take the abstract/concrete distinction to be one concerning whether or not an entity is spatiotemporally located. As we have seen (introduction to sect. 2), this way of conceiving of that distinction is different from how it is conceived by those who characterize the trope as abstract. That tropes are ‘concrete’ in Giberman’s sense is therefore perfectly compatible with their being ‘abstract’ in the sense proposed by e.g., Williams or Campbell.

14. All of the principles of individuation discussed in what follows hence concern intra- not inter-wordly trope-individuation (a circumstance that will become relevant when we discuss swapping and piling). Note also that, with the exception of the primitivist principle of individuation (PI), these principles only concern exactly resembling tropes. This latter restriction is due to the fact that we want our principle of individuation to allow for what seems clearly possible: distinct (and different) tropes characterizing the same object (or, in the case of SI, inhabiting the same spatiotemporal position).

15. Other reasons cited against SI include: (1) SI rules as impossible the existence of enduring stationary and moving tropes, enduring time-travelling tropes, and tropes that extend over space without having any spatial parts (all of which, according to Ehring 2011: 25ff. are possible kinds of entities); (2) Given SI, the relation between tropes and their location either amounts to complexity in the trope (which is independently problematic) or it leads to the collapse of distinct yet exactly similar tropes or of distinct yet co-localized tropes (Moreland 1985: 39ff.); (3) SI entails a problematically substantial notion of space-time (Schaffer 2001: 251), and; (4) SI provides us with the means to individuate tropes only if we assume that such a principle of individuation is already in place (Stout 1952: 76–77).

16. Campbell later (1990: 56) abandons this idea in favor of an outright rejection of SI, mainly because he thinks it results in an individuating condition for non-spatiotemporal individuals that would be “too formal to carry conviction” (a claim that is criticized in Schaffer 2001: 252).

17. The swapping objection can be put either in terms of object swapping (the two tropes swap object) or in terms of position swapping (the two tropes swap position). Armstrong (1989: 132) formulates the objection in terms of object-swapping, but as Ehring notes (2011: 79; cf. also Schaffer 2001: fn 8), the objection is even stronger if formulated in terms of position swapping. Reason: to rule out object swapping all you need to do is treat tropes as ‘non-transferable’, i.e., as having to belong to some specific object. Treating tropes as non-transferable doesn’t solve the problem with position-swapping, though: two exactly similar objects, including all the tropes that make them up, could still swap position, and with the same presumably problematic result.

18. Curious fact: Husserl thinks that what Armstrong calls ‘swapping‘ is a genuine possibility, and therefore presents it as a positive reason for positing what he calls ‘moments’ (cf. Denkel 1996: 173–174 for a discussion).

19. There are more ways of getting to the conclusion that swapping is impossible than via an acceptance of the Eleatic principle: if we accept e.g., anti-Haecceitism (cf. Lewis 1986)—the view that there can be no purely haecceistic differences between worlds—the same conclusion arguably follows (thanks to an anonymous reviewer for this entry for pointing this out).

20. Another argument in favor of SI has been provided recently by Giberman (2022). SI, he points out “fits naturally with the recognition that tropes themselves primitively have sizes and shapes” (a view Giberman defends, cf. end of section 2.2, this entry). Indeed, he argues, it is in part because tropes are spatiotemporally individuated that the trope theorist can respond to Ehring’s argument (also set out in section 2.2) to the effect that tropes must be complex, and that this is a problem for the view. For if SI is accepted “[i]f two tropes t1 and t2 exactly resemblance and are numerically distinct, then at any world where both exist, it will be settled whether they are co-located (namely, at every world they will not be co-located)” (ibid: 18). Therefore: “[N]o intrinsic ‘aspect’ of either t1 or t2 from outside the category trope is needed in order to explain that they are numerically distinct, even as their being the tropes they are explains why they exactly (intrinsically) resemble” (ibid.).

21. Although in the minority, there have been philosophers who accepted the existence of both tropes and universals. Among these are Husserl (2001[1900/1913]) and, more recently, Lowe (2006).

22. Another way to reject the existence of resemblance-relations is if one regards exact resemblance as a non-relational tie. That resemblance is a non-relational tie has not been explicitly defended by any trope proponent and it has been criticized by some trope critics. Hochberg (1988: 189f.) argues that it lends all of its support from a supposed analogy with the view that the exemplification which holds a substrate and a universal together in a state of affairs is a non-relational tie, but this analogy—for several reasons—fails. Indeed, even if the analogy is successful, the idea of a ‘non-relational tie’ remains obscure.

23. Other arguments against the resemblance class theory include those according to which holding that view would entail that the trope theorist would have to face versions of both the companionship and the imperfect community problems (first formulated by Goodman 1951 against classic resemblance nominalism). According to the original companionship problem, first, if everything that is F is G, and everything that is G is F then if having a certain property means belonging to a certain resemblance class, being F = being G, even in cases where—intuitively—we would say those properties are distinct. And according to the imperfect community problem, if we suppose the world contains only three things—one that is F and G, one that is F and H, and one that is G and H—then these three objects will resemble each other to an equal degree, and no non-member will resemble each member to the same degree. Still, the class they make up is hardly a natural class, since the only candidate for the property it picks out is disjunctive and gerrymandered. On the other hand, the class consisting of the object that is F and G and the object that is F and H might be thought to be just that: natural. For, intuitively, it picks out the property of being F. Problem is that that this is not a resemblance class. For the object that is G and H resembles the objects in that class to an equal degree. That these objections can be formulated also against tropes is perhaps not immediately obvious. Indeed, according to Campbell (1990: 32f.), both the companionship and the imperfect community problems arise precisely because the members of the relevant ‘similarity circles’ are complexly natured, something the trope is not. To show that tropes nevertheless fall prey to (versions of) these objections, Manley (2002; cf. also Moreland 1985, 1989, 1997) suggests we consider, first, a possible world in which every object is red. In this world, the class of all red tropes will coincide with the class of all colored tropes, yet it seems that the property of being red and the property of being colored are distinct. And (to get a version of the imperfect community problem) he asks us to imagine a possible world which contains only three things (trope-bundles): one pink, one baby-blue, and one deep purple. All these tropes (inexactly) resembles each other. Pink and purple are both reddish, purple and baby-blue are both bluish, and pink and baby-blue are both pale. Hence, together they pick out a resemblance class. But what property is that? Suppose the answer is ‘coloredness’. Then what resemblance class will we identify with being bluish? None seems available, for as soon as we set on a degree of resemblance high enough to group together the bluish colors, pink (which resembles purple and baby-blue to that very degree) comes along for the ride. In response to the first, companionship, problem, Manley admits that it may seem tempting simply to bite the bullet. After all, the sort of co-extension the trope theorist will have to live with seems much less problematic than that which the original argument points to. Manley still finds the suggestion “prohibitively odd”, though. Among other things because it follows it that whether two properties are distinct will depend on things that are completely external to the issue at hand, such as the existence (or not) of non-red things in the world (Manley 2002: 84). A similarly evasive strategy (if not a biting of the bullet) might seem feasible in the case of imperfect community. Perhaps the problem is that the example focuses on ‘higher-order’ or ‘constructed’ properties (like that of being bluish), yet the only properties there (really) are are absolutely determinate. According to Manley, this, too, is a dead end, however. For the same problems that could be formulated on the ‘manifest’ level, can now be formulated ‘further down the line’. For more suggestions on how to get around these problems, cf. e.g., Giberman (2014: 470) and Garcia (2015a: 152).

24. Another reason to think that the regress isn’t vicious is provided by Campbell, who argues that the regress is benign because “[i]t proceeds in a direction of greater and greater formality and less and less substance” (1990: 35–36). Campbell’s is not a very good reason for thinking that the regress is unproblematic, however. It is hard to see why there should be any difference in ‘substance’ between the resemblances at the different stages of the regress. In fact, it is hard to understand what such a difference in ‘substance’ amounts to in the first place (Daly 1997: 151–152).

25. In William’s own words (1986[1959]: 7): “I reject it on the presently unfashionable ground that the set of tropes is not what I or any of the rest of us mean by ‘the universal character Humanness’, and it could not have been meant by persons who had no conception of trope sets, nor by anyone who speaks of the universal being ‘in’ its instances, nor by one who declares, as did the Neo-Realists and the Critical Realists, probably the most clear-headed patrons of the notion of universals, that universals (‘essences’, ‘neutral entities’) both are the constituents of things and the data of perception. When I deny that any of these constructs is what we have ‘meant’, therefore, I put us to looking, in the light of the apparatus of tropes, at what would happen, and must always have happened, when we perceive or conceive the abstract universal in the concrete particular”.

26. In a reply to Paul’s paper ‘A One-Category Ontology’ (2017: 32–61), van Inwagen recounts a luncheon conversation with her. There, van Inwagen asked Paul why she thinks there are properties, to which he reports she answered: because I can see some of them. Van Inwagen continues (2017: 348–9): “But Professor Paul, is it the particular greenness of this apple that is before you when you look at the apple or is it the universal greenness?” To which she responds (ibid.): “Both. The universal greenness is nothing other than the fusion of all particular greennesses. Or put the matter this way: a particular greenness is a connected part, or perhaps a maximally connected part, of the universal greenness. If we use the term ‘trope’ in the sense the word has in current analytical metaphysics, a trope—like the greenness of this apple—is a part of the object of which it is a trope. For an object like an apple to instantiate a universal is for it to overlap that universal, to share a part, a trope, with that universal” (for more on Paul’s view, cf. fn 28, below).

27. Not all parts are created equal, though. According to e.g., Robb (2005), trope-parts are not the sorts of parts that are “independent, additive, and arranged”, which means that at least some of the usual axioms of mereology will have to be given up or at least modified. Why call them parts, then? According to Robb (ibid: 471) we should call them parts because, on the most general conception of parthood, the parts of something exhaust its being in the sense that it is nothing more than its parts related in some way or other. According to Paul (2002: 578), moreover, thinking of the parts of an object, not just as its spatial parts, but also as its qualitative parts (she uses ‘logical part’ to cover both), results in a more “fundamental account”. According to her—not a trope theorist—thus understanding the structure of objects also allows us to, in a sense, ‘collapse’ the distinction between universals and tropes (Paul bid: 583; cf. also her 2017): “Logical parts allow us to argue that characterizations of properties as tropes and universals are just different sides of the same coin, and combine the benefits of tropes and universals without their attendant problems.” Take two cups that are both red. Some would say that we then have two exactly resembling tropes and some would say that we have the same universal instantiated in both. Paul says that they would all be right. When we have resembling tropes we have two different objects with overlap with respect to (at least one of) their logical parts. Once we subtract away the other parts of the objects, we are left with one object that has no location properties as parts. This object (R), partly overlaps objects that include location properties as parts. R itself does not have any particular location (Paul’s view is also—briefly—discussed in footnote 26 above). According to McDaniel (2001), finally, adopting a mereological trope theory can help solve a number of well-known puzzles for material constitution, including that involving the alleged colocation of material objects. He also thinks that both Heller’s argument for 4-dimensionalism (Heller 1992) and Van Inwagen’s argument against mereological universalism (Van Inwagen 1990) fail on his version of the bundle view.

28. Why not internal? Because if compresence is internal the following possibilities are ruled out: First, that what happens to constitute this concrete particular could exist and not constitute any particular whatsoever. This is however a possibility most trope theorists wouldn’t mind if it came out empty (although some have defended the possibility of so-called ‘free-floaters’, cf. e.g., Campbell 1990 and Schaffer 2003). Second, that the tropes which constitute the concrete particular could exist and (partly) constitute some other concrete particular(s). This is a possibility most trope theorists regard as genuine. Because they do, they regard compresence as external.

29. Keinänen and Hakkarainen, although generally very positive to Simons’ way of understanding the nature of the concrete particular, nevertheless develop their own version of the theory, primarily in order to avoid what they see as three major weaknesses with Simons’ view (cf. esp. Keinänen 2011: 433): (i) that it allows that there can be objects solely constituted by a nucleus, but does not specify what kinds of nuclear tropes could make up an object of that kind; (ii) that it does not rule out the possibility of two or more tropes falling under the same determinable, making up the same object at the same time and; (iii) that the dependence relations it posits do not constrain the spatiotemporal location of tropes in any way, with the consequence that tropes must not be colocated with the objects they make up. Especially this third difficulty is a serious flaw according to Keinänen and Hakkarainen.

30. A rather different version of this response is given in (Lowe 2006). According to Lowe—who defends a substrate-attribute view of concrete particulars, and who accepts the existence of universals as well as tropes—the unity of Fa is effected, not by a compresence-relation, but by a non-relational trope which (asymmetrically) depends for its existence both on the existence of the universal of which it is an instance, and on the existence of the substrate it characterizes. Lowe’s view arguably struggles with what some trope theorists would consider an unnecessarily inflated ontology (although Lowe himself would argue that all his posits are independently justified).

31. Other solutions to the problem include the radical proposal that the regress is benign because it is infinite (cf. Orilia 2009; Orilia and Swoyer 2017). Cf. also the holistic view proposed in Schneider (2002) (inspired by Bacon 1995) and the view that compresence is ‘self-relating’ put forward in Ehring (2011).

32. According to some philosophers, events are tropes (Bennett 2002) or trope sequences (Campbell 1997[1981]) or relational tropes (Mertz 1996) or even higher-order tropes (Moltmann 2013b). If so, the fact (if indeed it is a fact) that every reason to posit tropes is also a reason to posit events is obviously not a problem for the trope theorist.

33. This is because McDaniel thinks his version of the trope-view solves the problems with 3-dimensionalism which Heller (1992) famously pointed out. And it does so by allowing you to deny that, if 4-dimensionalism is false, then if I exist after t, I have all of the same parts after t that I had prior to t minus the now detached particle. Reason: there were polyadic tropes inhering in the various particles that were my parts prior to t, including the then undetached particle, that do not inhere in them after t (precisely because one particle detached). After t, new polyadic tropes inhere in the particles that are my parts after t; these polyadic tropes are also parts of me after t.

34. Here’s his argument (Benovsky 2013): (1) a well-known objection to endurantism is the one from temporary intrinsics due to Lewis (1986: 202–5); (2) if the endurantist responds to this worry by accepting indexicalism—the view that all properties are always time-indexed (cf. van Inwagen 1990)—then properties, because they are (space)time-bound, must be tropes; (3) if the endurantist responds instead by accepting adverbialism—the view that properties are ‘had’ in a temporally modified way (cf. e.g., Johnston 1987 and Haslanger 1989)—then this ‘having’ (these exemplification relations), again because they are (space)time-bound, must be tropes; (4) therefore: if endurantism is true, properties (and relations) must be tropes.

35. Schneider agrees that couching your ontology in terms of (mathematical) bundles and cross-sections (i.e., fields) is productive. The only problem, from the perspective of trope theory, is that the best way to achieve all of that while staying mathematically adequate is in terms of an ontology that does not include anything that can in any obvious sense be categorized as tropes (2006: 11).

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