Varieties of Modality

First published Tue Nov 27, 2012; substantive revision Tue Jan 31, 2017

Modal statements tell us something about what could be or must be the case. Such claims can come in many forms. Consider:

  1. No one can be both a bachelor and married. (‘Bachelor’ means ‘unmarried man’.)
  2. You could not have been born of different parents. (Someone born of different parents wouldn’t be you.)
  3. Nothing can travel faster than light. (It’s a law of nature.)
  4. One cannot get from London to New York in less than one hour. (Planes that fast haven’t been developed yet.)
  5. You cannot leave the palace. (The doors are locked.)
  6. You cannot promise to come and then stay at home. (It’s just wrong.)
  7. You cannot start a job application cover letter with “hey guys”. (It’s just not done.)
  8. You cannot castle if your king is in check. (It’s against the rules.)
  9. You cannot deduct your holidays from your taxes. (It’s against the law.)
  10. Fred cannot be the killer. (The evidence shows that he’s innocent.)

Each of these claims appears to have a true reading. But it also seems that ‘cannot’ needs to be interpreted in different ways to make the different sentences true. For one thing, we can, in the same breath, accept a modal claim in one of the senses illustrated by (1)–(10) while rejecting it in another one of these senses, as in the following dialogue:

  • Caesar: You’re lucky that I’m still here. The doors were unlocked. I could have left the palace.
  • Cleopatra: True. But then again, you couldn’t have left the palace. That would have been wrong, given that you promised to meet me here.

Moreover, the modal claims (1)–(10) appear to be true for completely different reasons. For example, it may be held that the truth of (1) is due to the meanings of its constituent expressions; that (2) holds because it lies in your nature to be born of your actual parents; that (3) is true because the laws of nature preclude superluminal motion; that (4) holds because of technological limitations; that (5) owes its truth to the presence of insurmountable practical obstacles; that (6)–(9) are made true by the demands of morality, etiquette, the rules of chess, and the law respectively; and that (10) holds because the known facts prove Fred’s innocence.

It is one of the tasks of a philosophical theory of modality to give a systematic and unified account of this multiplicity of modal concepts. This article discusses a few of the main issues that need to be addressed by anyone pursuing this goal. Sections 1 and 2 concern the question of what fundamental categories of modal notions there are. The focus will be on two contemporary debates: whether there are separate forms of modality that are tied to the epistemic and the metaphysical domains (section 1), and whether there is a special kind of necessity associated with the laws of nature (section 2). Section 3 discusses questions about the relations between different notions of necessity. Can some of them be reduced to other, more fundamental ones? If so, which concepts of necessity are the most fundamental ones? And if there are several fundamental kinds of necessity, what do they have in common that makes them all kinds of necessity?

1. Epistemic and Metaphysical Modality

There are many ways the world could have been. You could have gotten up later today. Your parents could have failed to meet, so that you were never born. Life could never have developed on earth. The history of the universe could even have been completely different from the beginning. And many philosophers believe that the laws of nature could have been different as well (although that has been denied, as discussed in section 2). Maximally specific ways the world could have been are commonly called ‘possible worlds.’ The apparatus of possible worlds allows us to introduce a set of modal notions: a proposition is necessary just in case it is true in all possible worlds, a proposition is possible just in case it is true in some possible worlds, and it is contingent just in case it is true in some but not all possible worlds. A sentence is necessary (possible, contingent) just in case it expresses a necessary (possible, contingent) proposition.

The modal notions considered in the last paragraph are not obviously epistemological. On the face it, we are not reporting a fact about what is or can be known or believed by anyone when we say that life could have failed to develop. But there is also a family of modal concepts that are clearly epistemological. These are the notions we employ when we say things like ‘Fred must have stolen the book (the evidence shows conclusively that he did it),’ or ‘Mary cannot be in London (she would have called me).’ These modal utterances seem to make claims about what the available evidence shows, or about which scenarios can be ruled out on the basis of the evidence. More formally, we can say that a proposition \(P\) is epistemically necessary for an agent A just in case the empirical evidence \(A\) possesses and ideal reasoning (i.e., reasoning unrestricted by cognitive limitations) are sufficient to rule out \({\sim}P\). This notion of epistemic necessity is agent-relative: one and the same claim can be epistemically necessary for one agent, but not for another agent with less empirical evidence. We obtain a notion of epistemic necessity of particular philosophical interest by focusing on a limiting case, namely that of a possible agent with no empirical evidence whatsoever.[1] A proposition \(P\) is epistemically necessary for such an agent just in case ideal reasoning alone, unaided by empirical evidence, is sufficient to rule out \({\sim}P\). A proposition that meets this condition can be called a priori in at least one sense of this term, or we can call it simply epistemically necessary (without relativization to an agent). Propositions that are not a priori are called a posteriori.[2]

It is an important and controversial question whether the necessary propositions are all and only the epistemically necessary (a priori) ones, or whether the extensions of the two concepts can come apart. One possible reason for thinking that the notions are coextensive derives from a very natural picture of information and inquiry. On this picture, all information about the world is information about which of all possible worlds is realized (i.e., about where in the space of all possible worlds the actual world is located). My total information about the world can be identified with the set of possible worlds that I cannot rule out on the basis of my empirical evidence and ideal reasoning. As I gather more and more empirical evidence, I can progressively narrow down the range of possibilities. Suppose, for example, that I am ignorant of the current weather conditions. The worlds compatible with my evidence include some where the weather is good and others where it is bad. A look out of the window at the rain provides information about the matter. I can now narrow down the set of possibilities by excluding all possible worlds with fine weather. On this account, a proposition \(P\) is epistemically necessary for \(A\) just in case \(P\) is true in all possible worlds that cannot be ruled out on the basis of \(A\)’s empirical evidence and ideal reasoning. \(P\) is a priori just in case it is epistemically necessary for a possible agent who has no empirical evidence. Since such an agent cannot rule out any possible worlds, a proposition is a priori just in case it is true in all possible worlds. In other words, the a priori propositions are all and only the necessary propositions.[3]

This approach is often combined with a certain account of semantic content. One of the main purposes of language is to transmit information about the world. Where \(P\) is any sentence used for that purpose (roughly speaking, a declarative sentence), it seems natural to think of \(P\)’s content (the proposition expressed by it) as the information that is semantically encoded in it. Combining this with the foregoing account of information, we can think of the content of a sentence as a set of possible worlds (namely, the set containing just those worlds of which the sentence is true) or, equivalently, as a function from worlds to truth-values.

This picture connects the modal, epistemic and semantic realms in a simple and elegant way, and various versions of it have informed the work of numerous contemporary philosophers (including David Lewis, Robert Stalnaker, David Chalmers, and Frank Jackson). However, the approach has come under pressure from data to be considered in the next section.

1.1 The Data

The idea that all and only the a priori truths are necessary was thrown into serious doubt by the work of philosophers including Hilary Putnam (1972) and Saul Kripke (1980). Kripke distinguishes between two different kinds of singular terms, rigid and non-rigid ones. A so-called rigid designator is an expression that singles out the same thing in all possible worlds. Kripke argues that ordinary proper names like ‘Al Gore’ are rigid. We can use this name to describe how things actually are, e.g., by saying ‘Al Gore became vice president in 1993.’ In such cases, the name picks out Al Gore. But we can equally use the name to describe how things stand in other possible worlds, e.g., by saying, ‘If Bill Clinton had chosen a different running mate, Al Gore would not have become vice president.’ In this case, we are talking about a non-actualized possibility, and we use the name ‘Al Gore’ to describe this possibility. Moreover, we use the name to say something about how things stand with Al Gore in that possibility. In general, when we use the name to describe any possible world, we use it to talk about the same person, Al Gore. Other examples of rigid designators include indexical expressions like the first-person pronoun ‘I,’ or the expression ‘now.’ When you use the term ‘I’ to describe any possible world, you are always picking out the same thing: yourself. Natural kind terms like ‘water’ and ‘gold’ can also be regarded as rigid terms, as they single out the same kinds in every possible world. Non-rigid singular term, by contrast, pick out different entities in different possible scenarios. The paradigmatic examples of non-rigid terms are descriptions that are satisfied by different objects in different possible worlds. For example, ‘the most annoying person in the history of the world’ may pick out Fred in the actual world, while picking out Cleopatra in some other possible worlds.

Singular terms can be introduced into the language with the help of descriptions. There are two ways in which that can be done. On the one hand, we can stipulate that the singular term is to be synonymous with the description, for example by laying down that ‘the morning star’ is to mean the same as ‘the last celestial body to be seen in the morning.’ When we use the expression to describe another possible world, the new expression will single out whatever celestial body is the last one that can be seen in the morning in that world. Since different things meet this condition in different worlds, the expression is non-rigid. On the other hand, we may introduce a term with the stipulation that it is to be a rigid designator referring to whatever object actually satisfies the description. For instance, we may lay it down that ‘Phosphorus’ is to refer rigidly to the object that is actually the last celestial body visible in the morning. Since that object is Venus, the name will pick out Venus, not only when we use it to describe the actual world, but also when we (in the actual world) use it to describe other possible worlds, including worlds where Venus is not the last planet visible in the morning.When a description is used to introduce a singular term in the second way, it merely serves to fix the reference of the term, but is not synonymous with it.

Now consider a true identity statement that involves two rigid designators, such as

  • (1) Mark Twain (if he exists) is Samuel Clemens.

Since ‘Mark Twain’ and ‘Samuel Clemens’ pick out the same entity in every possible world where they pick out anything, this identity statement is a necessary truth. (Note that the statement is conditionalized on Mark Twain’s existence, which makes it possible to avoid the question whether (1) is true in worlds where the two names pick out nothing.) But it is far from immediately obvious that (1) expresses something that can be known a priori. At least on the face of it, we may think that someone who knows her neighbor by the name of ‘Samuel Clemens,’ who has read several stories by an author named ‘Mark Twain’ and who fails to realize that her neighbor and the author are identical may not know that which is expressed by (1). Moreover, it may seem that her ignorance is irremediable by reasoning alone, that she requires empirical evidence to come to know that which is stated by (1).

Another type of apparent counterexample to the thesis that all and only the a priori truths are necessary concerns sentences like

  • (2) If gold exists, then it has atomic number 79.

It seems plausible that it is an essential property of gold to have atomic number 79: gold could not have (existed but) failed to have that property. (A substance in another possible world that fails to have atomic number 79 simply isn’t gold, no matter how similar it may otherwise be to the gold of the actual world.) And yet it seems clear that it can only be known empirically that gold has that atomic number. So, while (2) is a necessary truth, what it says cannot be known a priori. For another illustration of this phenomenon, suppose that I point to the wooden desk in my office and say:

  • (3) If this desk exists, it is made of wood.

It is arguably essential to this desk to be made of wood. A desk in another possible world that isn’t wooden simply can’t be this desk, no matter how similar it may otherwise be to my desk. But it seems that we need empirical evidence to know that the desk is made of wood. So, (3) is another apparent example of a necessary a posteriori truth.

Just as Kripke claims that some truths are necessary without being a priori, he argues that a truth can be a priori without being necessary. To use an example of Gareth Evans’s (1982), suppose that I introduce the term ‘Julius’ by stipulating that it is to refer rigidly to the person who is in fact the inventor of the zip (if such a person exists). Then it may appear that I don’t need further empirical evidence to know that

  • (4) If Julius exists, then Julius is the inventor of the zip.

But (4) does not seem to be a necessary truth. After all, Julius could have become a salesperson rather than an inventor.

According to Kripke, our initial surprise at the divergent extensions of a prioricity and necessity should be mitigated on reflection. A prioricity (epistemic necessity) is an epistemological notion: it has to do with what can be known. That is not true of the concept of necessity. (2) is necessary because the atomic number of gold is an essential feature of it, and on the face of it, that has nothing to do with what is known or believed by anyone. This kind of necessity is a metaphysical notion, and we may use the term ‘metaphysical necessity’ to distinguish it more clearly from epistemic necessity.

Kripke’s examples are not the only ones that could be appealed to in order to shed doubt on the coextensiveness of necessity and a prioricity. Some other problematic cases are listed below (Chalmers 2002a; cp. Chalmers 2012, ch. 6).

  1. Mathematical truths. It is common to hold that all mathematical truths are necessary. But on the face of it, there is no guarantee that all mathematical truths are knowable a priori (or knowable in any way at all). For example, either the continuum hypothesis or its negation is true, and whichever of these claims is true is also necessary. But for all we know, there is no way for us to know that that proposition is true.
  2. Laws of nature. Some necessitarians about the natural laws (see section 2) believe that the laws hold in all metaphysically possible worlds. But they are not a priori truths.
  3. Metaphysical principles. It is often believed that many metaphysical theses are necessary if true, e.g., theses about the nature of properties (e.g., about whether they are universals, sets or tropes) or ontological principles like the principle of unrestricted mereological composition (which says that for any things there is something that is their sum). But it is not obvious that all truths of this kind are a priori. (For discussion, see Chalmers 2012, §§6.4–6.5; Schaffer forthcoming.)
  4. Principles linking the physical and the mental. Some philosophers hold that all truths about the mental are metaphysically necessitated by the physical truths, but deny that it is possible to derive the mental truths from the physical ones by a priori reasoning (see Hill & McLaughlin 1999; Yablo 1999; Loar 1999; and Chalmers 1999 for discussion). On that account, some of the conditionals that link physical and mental claims are metaphysically necessary but not a priori.

These examples are controversial. For any given mathematical claim whose truth-value is unknown, one could hold that it is only our cognitive limitations that have prevented us from establishing or refuting the statement, and that the question could be decided by ideal reasoning (so that the truth of the matter is a priori). Alternatively, it may be held that the truth-value of the mathematical statement is indeterminate. (Perhaps our practices do not completely determine the references of all the terms used in the mathematical claim). The same two options are available in the case of metaphysical principles. Alternatively, one may argue that the relevant metaphysical theses are merely contingent (see, e.g., Cameron 2007). Necessitarianism about the natural laws is highly controversial and may simply be denied. And in response to (iv), one may deny that the physical truths metaphysically necessitate the mental truths (Chalmers 1996), or one may hold that the mental truths can be derived from the physical ones by a priori reasoning (Jackson 1998).

Philosophers have paid more attention to the examples given by Kripke than to other possible cases of the necessary a posteriori, and for that reason the discussion in the rest of this section will mostly focus on Kripke’s cases. Two strategies for explaining these examples can be distinguished. Dualists about metaphysical and epistemic modality (dualists, for short) hold that the phenomena reflect a deep and fundamental distinction between two kinds of modality. Monists, by contrast, believe that all the data can ultimately be explained by appeal to a single kind of modality. They may agree that there are cases in which a single sentence is, in some sense, both necessary and a posteriori, or both contingent and a priori. But they insist that there is no similar distinction at the level of worlds or propositions. Rather, the phenomenon arises because a single sentence can be associated with two different propositions, one that is necessary and another that is contingent.

1.2 Dualism

Dualists distinguish between two concepts of propositional necessity, metaphysically necessity and epistemic necessity. The two notions are not coextensive. At least some of the sentences in Kripke’s examples express propositions that possess the one kind of necessity but not the other.[4]

Once the existence of a distinctively metaphysical form of propositional necessity is accepted, it is natural to wonder whether it is possible to say more about its nature. Kit Fine (1994) offers an account of it that appeals to the traditional distinction between those properties of a thing that it possesses by its very nature and those that it has merely accidentally. For example, it lies in the nature of water to be composed of hydrogen and oxygen—being composed in this way is part of what it is to be water—but it is merely accidental to water that we use it to brush our teeth. A proposition is metaphysically necessary just in case it is true in virtue of the natures of things. (Also see Kment 2014, chs. 6–7.) Other philosophers (Rayo 2013, §2.2.1, ch. 5; Dorr forthcoming) have discussed the idea that metaphysical necessity can be explained in terms of the idiom “To be \(F\) is to be \(G\)” (as in “To be water is to be H2O”). Yet another account ties the metaphysical notion of necessity constitutively to causation and explanation (Kment 2006a,b, 2014, 2015a; also see the exchange between Lange 2015 and Kment 2015b).

Dualism requires us to dismantle the picture of inquiry, information and content sketched in the introduction to section 1. Note that it is natural for a dualist to distinguish the space of metaphysically possible worlds from the space of epistemically possible worlds, i.e., from the space of (maximally specific) ways the world might be that cannot be ruled out on the basis of ideal reasoning alone, without empirical evidence (Soames 2005, 2011). The range of epistemically possible worlds outstrips the range of metaphysically possible worlds: there are some ways the world couldn’t have been, but which cannot be ruled by ideal reasoning alone. For example, there is no metaphysically possible world where gold has atomic number 78. But prior to carrying out the right chemical investigations, we don’t have enough evidence to exclude all scenarios where gold has that atomic number, so some worlds where gold has atomic number 78 are epistemically possible. Empirical evidence is not used only to rule out (metaphysical) possibilities, but is sometimes needed to rule out metaphysical impossibilities that are epistemically possible. Consequently, we cannot in general identify information with sets of metaphysically possible worlds, since we need to distinguish between states of information in which the available evidence rules out the same metaphysically possible worlds but different metaphysically impossible worlds. By the same token, the information encoded in a sentence cannot in general be identified with a set of metaphysically possible worlds, since two sentences may be true in all the same metaphysically possible worlds, but not in all the same epistemically possible worlds. If we wanted to identify information and sentential contents with sets of worlds, it would seem more promising to use sets of epistemically possible worlds. But the dualist may instead reject the possible-worlds account of information and propositions altogether (see, e.g., Soames 1987, 2003, 395f.).

1.3 Monism

As mentioned above, monists explain the data described by Kripke by holding that the sentences that figure in Kripke’s examples are associated with two different propositions, one that is necessary and another that is contingent. This view comes in two main versions. According to the first version, both propositions are semantically expressed by the sentence. Proponents of this account need to formulate a semantic theory that explains how that is possible. According to the second version, only one of these propositions is semantically expressed by the sentence, while the other is the proposition that is communicated by a typical assertoric use of the sentence. A philosopher holding this view needs to explain the pragmatic mechanism by which an utterance of the sentence comes to communicate the second proposition.

The first version of monism has been developed by David Chalmers and Frank Jackson (Chalmers 1996, 1999, 2002a,b, 2004, 2006a,b; Chalmers and Jackson 2001; Jackson 1998, 2004, 2011), who build on earlier work by David Kaplan (1989a,b), Gareth Evans (1979) and Martin Davies and Lloyd Humberstone (1980), and others. On Chalmers’s and Jackson’s view, what explains the phenomena uncovered by Kripke is not a difference between two spaces of possible worlds. There is only a single space of possible worlds: the metaphysically possible worlds—the ways the world could have been—just are the epistemically possible worlds: the ways the world might be for all we can know independently of empirical evidence. What explains the data is a difference between two different ways in which sentences can be used to describe the worlds in that space, i.e., between two different notions of a sentence’s being true in a world. The distinction can be illustrated by appeal to our example of the proper name ‘Phosphorus.’ Suppose that we have just introduced this name by using the description ‘the last celestial body visible in the morning’ to fix its reference. Consider a possible world \(w\) where the description singles out, not Venus (as in our world), but Saturn. Assume further that in \(w\) (as in the actual world), Venus is the second planet from the sun, but Saturn is not. Consider:

  • (5) Phosphorus is the second planet from the sun.

Is (5) true in \(w\)? There are two different ways of understanding this question. On the one hand, it could mean something roughly like this: if \(w\) actually obtains (contrary to what astronomers tell us), is Phosphorus the second planet from the sun? The answer to that question is surely ‘no.’ ‘Phosphorus’ refers to whatever is actually the last celestial body visible in the morning, and on the assumption that \(w\) actually obtains, that object is Saturn, and is therefore not the second planet. As Chalmers would put it, (5) is not true at w considered as actual.[5] But we can also interpret the question differently: if \(w\) had obtained, then would Phosphorus have been the second planet? In considering that question, we are not hypothetically assuming that the object that actually satisfies the reference-fixing description is Saturn. Instead, we can draw freely on our belief that the object actually fitting the description is Venus, so that the name picks out Venus in all possible worlds. Since Venus is the second planet in \(w\), it is true to say: if \(w\) had obtained, then Phosphorus would have been the second planet. In Chalmers’s terminology, (5) is true at w considered as counterfactual.

The distinction between the two concepts of truth in a world can be explained within a theoretical framework known as two-dimensional semantics, which assigns to a sentence like (5) an intension that is a function, not from worlds to truth-values, but from pairs of worlds to truth-values. The intension of (5) is the function that assigns the true to a pair of worlds \(\langle u; w \rangle\) just in case the object that is the last celestial body visible in the morning in \(u\) is the second planet in \(w\).[6] This account makes it easy to define the two notions of truth in a world. A sentence \(P\) is true in \(w\) considered as actual just in case the two-dimensional function assigns the true to \(\langle w; w\rangle\). \(P\) is true in \(w\) considered as counterfactual just in case, where \(u\) is the actual world, the two-dimensional function assigns the true to \(\langle u; w\rangle\). Note that the two-dimensional intension of (5) determines whether (5) is true at a world \(w\) considered as actual. But it does not in general determine whether (5) is true at \(w\) considered as counterfactual. That also depends on which world is actual. Knowledge of a sentence’s two-dimensional intension is therefore not in general sufficient to know whether the sentence is true at \(w\) considered as counterfactual. Further empirical evidence may be required.

When combined with the conception of a sentence’s content as the set of worlds where it is true, the distinction between the two concepts of truth in a world yields a distinction between two different propositions expressed by a sentence. The first of these propositions is the function that assigns the true to a world \(w\) just in case the sentence is true in \(w\) considered as actual, while the second proposition is the function that assigns the true to a world \(w\) just in case the sentence is true in \(w\) considered as counterfactual. Jackson calls the former proposition the sentence’s ‘A-intension’ (for ‘actual’) and the latter its ‘C-intension’ (for ‘counterfactual’), while Chalmers calls the former the ‘primary intension’ and the latter the ‘secondary intension.’ The distinction between the two propositions expressed by a sentence yields a distinction between two notions of sentential necessity: primary necessity, which applies to sentences with necessary primary intensions, and secondary necessity, which applies to sentences with necessary secondary intensions. If a sentence has primary necessity, then that fact, and a fortiori the fact that the sentence is true, can be read off its two-dimensional intension. Therefore, if we know the two-dimensional intension, then that is enough to know that the sentence is true. No further empirical evidence is required. That motivates the thought that the notion of primary necessity captures the idea of a prioricity or epistemic necessity. The notion of secondary necessity, on the other hand, may be taken to capture the Kripkean idea of metaphysical necessity.

This account makes it straightforward to explain cases of a posteriori necessity: they are simply cases of sentences whose secondary intensions are necessary, but whose primary intensions are contingent. Suppose that ‘Hesperus’ and ‘Phosphorus’ were introduced, respectively, by the reference-fixing descriptions ‘the first celestial body visible in the evening (if it exists)’ and ‘the last celestial body visible in the morning (if it exists).’ Since the two descriptions single out the same object in the actual world, the sentence ‘If Hesperus exists, then Hesperus is Phosphorus’ is true in all worlds considered as counterfactual, and therefore has a necessary secondary intension. However, in some non-actual worlds, the two descriptions single out different objects. The sentence is false in such a world considered as actual. The primary intension of the sentence is therefore contingent.

An analogous account can be given of Kripke’s examples of the contingent a priori: these concern sentences whose primary intensions are necessary and whose secondary intensions are contingent. Assume again that the reference of ‘Julius’ is fixed by the description ‘the inventor of the zip (if such a person exists).’ Then in every world considered as actual, the name singles out the person who is the inventor of the zip in that world (if there is such a person) or nothing (if no such person exists in the world). The primary intension of (4) is necessary. However, when we evaluate (4) in a world \(w\) considered as counterfactual, ‘Julius’ picks out the individual who is the actual inventor of the zip (provided that there actually is such an individual and that he or she exists in \(w)\). And since there are possible worlds where that individual exists but is not the inventor of the zip, the secondary intension of (4) is contingent.

Chalmers (2002a, 2010) and Jackson (1998) have tried to support their modal monism by arguing that it is gratuitous to postulate two forms of modality, given that all the phenomena pointed out by Kripke can be accommodated by appeal to a single kind of modality. Dualists may reply that the greater simplicity in the view of modality has been achieved only by adding complexity to the semantic theory. That response could be answered by arguing that two-dimensional semantics can be motivated by independent considerations. That, of course, is controversial, as is the general viability of two-dimensional semantics (see the entry Two-Dimensional Semantics for detailed discussion).

In addition, it is not obvious that the view of Chalmers and Jackson can satisfactorily explain all the phenomena discussed in section 1.1. Some commentators have denied that it can give a viable general account of Kripkean examples (see, e.g., Soames 2005; Vaidya 2008; Roca-Royes 2011). In any case, it is clear that the view can only explain how necessity and epistemic necessity can come apart for sentences whose primary and secondary intensions differ. That may be true of the cases considered by Kripke, but it seems doubtful for the other examples considered in section 1.1 (mathematical and metaphysical truths, laws, and principles connecting the physical to the mental). In response, Chalmers has argued that none of the latter cases are genuine examples of the necessary a posteriori (1999, 2002a).

The second version of monism allows us to accommodate the phenomena considered in section 1.1 while staying much closer to the picture sketched in the introduction to section 1. On this view, the data can be explained by appeal to a single space of possible worlds and a single notion of truth in a world. The proposition semantically expressed by a sentence containing a proper name or natural-kind term is a function from individual worlds to truth-values. The proposition expressed by ‘Phosphorus exists,’ e.g., is a function that assigns the true to those worlds where Venus exists and the false to the other worlds. (If the reference of ‘Phosphorus’ was determined by a reference-fixing description together with the facts about which entity meets the description, then that fact itself is not a semantic fact, but a metasemantic one, i.e., it does not concern the question of what the meaning of the word is, but the question of how the meaning of the word is determined.) What explains the impression that a sentence like (1) expresses an a posteriori claim is the fact that the proposition asserted by a typical utterance of the sentence is not the one that is semantically expressed by it, but a different proposition that is contingent and can only be known empirically.

Robert Stalnaker (1978, 2001) has given a detailed account of the pragmatic mechanism by which a contingent proposition comes to be asserted by the utterance of a sentence that semantically expresses a necessary proposition. On his account, linguistic communication evolves in a context characterized by background assumptions that are shared between the participants. These assumptions can be represented by the set of worlds at which they are jointly true, which Stalnaker calls the ‘context set.’ The point of assertion is to add the proposition asserted to the set of background assumptions and thereby eliminate worlds where it is not true from the context set. To achieve this, every assertion needs to conform to the rule that the proposition asserted is false in some of the worlds that were in the context set before the utterance (otherwise there are no worlds to eliminate) and true in others (since the audience cannot eliminate all worlds from the context set). Now consider a context where the shared background assumptions include the proposition that the references of ‘\(A\)’ and ‘\(B\)’ were fixed by certain descriptions but leave open whether the two descriptions single out the same object. Suppose that someone says ‘\(A\) is \(B\).’ In every world in the context set, the sentence semantically expresses either a necessary truth (if the two descriptions single out the same object in the world) or a necessary falsehood (if they don’t). If the proposition that the speaker intends to assert were the one that is semantically expressed by the sentence, the aforementioned rule would be violated.[7] To avoid attributing this rule violation to the speaker, the audience will construe the utterance as expressing a different proposition, and the most natural candidate is the proposition that the sentence uttered semantically expresses a true proposition. (Stalnaker calls this the ‘diagonal proposition.’) By exploiting this mechanism of reinterpretation, a speaker can use the sentence to express the diagonal proposition. This proposition is true in just those worlds in the context set where the two descriptions single out the same object. It is clearly a contingent proposition, and empirical evidence is required to know it. Stalnaker suggests an analogous explanation of Kripke’s proposed cases of contingent a priori truth (1978, 83f.).

Stalnaker’s account of the necessary a posteriori requires that the proposition semantically expressed by the sentence and the proposition that the sentence semantically expresses a truth hold in different worlds in the context set. And that seems to require that the assumptions shared between the participants of the conversation don’t determine what proposition is semantically expressed by the sentence. It has been argued that that assumption is implausible in some cases of Kripkean a posteriori necessities (Soames 2005, 96–105). Suppose that I point to the desk in my office in broad daylight and say ‘That desk (if it exists) is made of wood.’ Unless the context is highly unusual, the shared assumptions, so the argument goes, uniquely determine what proposition is expressed by the sentence.

2. Metaphysical and Nomic Modality

It often seems very natural to use modal terminology when talking about the laws of nature. We are inclined to say that nothing can move faster than light to express the fact that the laws rule out superluminal motion, and to state Newton’s First Law by saying that an object cannot depart from uniform rectilinear motion unless acted on by an external force. This motivates the thought that there is a form of necessity associated with the natural laws.[8] It is controversial, however, whether that form of necessity is simply metaphysical necessity, or another kind of necessity. The former view is taken by necessitarians (Swoyer 1982; Shoemaker 1980, 1998; Tweedale 1984; Fales 1993; Ellis 2001; Bird 2005), who believe that the laws (or the laws conditionalized on the existence of the properties mentioned in them) are metaphysically necessary. Contingentists deny that, but many contingentists hold that there is a kind of necessity distinct from metaphysical necessity that is characteristic of the laws (e.g., Fine 2002), and which may be called natural or nomic necessity. It is often assumed that nomic necessity is a weaker form of necessity than metaphysical necessity: it attaches to the laws and to all truths that are metaphysically necessitated by them, so that anything that is metaphysically necessary is also nomically necessary, but not vice versa.

Necessitarians have given several arguments for their position. Here are two.

The argument from causal essentialism (e.g., Shoemaker 1980, 1998). Some philosophers believe that the causal powers that a property confers on its instances are essential to it. Assuming that causal laws describe the causal powers associated with properties, it follows that these laws (or versions of them that are conditionalized on the existence of the relevant properties) are necessary truths. This is, in the first instance, only an argument for the necessity of causal laws, but perhaps it can be argued that all laws of nature are of this kind. Of course, even if this assumption is granted, the argument is only as strong as the premise that properties have their associated causal powers essentially. To support this view, Sydney Shoemaker (1980) has given a battery of epistemological arguments. He points out that our knowledge of the properties that an object possesses can only rest on their effects on us, and must therefore be grounded in the causal powers associated with these properties. But, he goes on to argue that, without a necessary connection between the properties and the associated causal powers, an object’s effects on us could not serve as a source of all the knowledge about an object’s properties that we take ourselves to possess.

The argument from counterfactual robustness (Swoyer 1982; Fales 1990, 1993; also see Lange 2004 for discussion). Natural laws are often believed to differ from accidental generalizations by their counterfactual robustness (counterfactual-supporting power). If it is a law that all \(F\)s are \(G\), then this generalization would still have been true if there had been more \(F\)s than there actually are, or if some \(F\)s had found themselves in conditions different from the ones that actually obtain. For example, it would still have been true that nothing moves faster than light if there had been more objects than there actually are, or if some bodies had been moving in a different direction. Contrast this with No emerald has ever decorated a royal crown. That may be true, but it is not very robust. It would have been false if some kings or queens of the past had made different decisions. Some necessitarians have argued that contingentism about the laws cannot provide a plausible explanation of the special counterfactual robustness of the laws. Note that a counterfactual “if it had been the case that \(P\), then it would have been the case that \(Q\)” is usually taken to be true if \(Q\) is true in those metaphysically possible \(P\)-worlds that are closest to actuality. On this view, the special counterfactual robustness of the law All \(F\)s are \(G\) amounts, roughly speaking, to this: of all the metaphysically possible worlds that contain some additional \(F\)s, or where some actual \(F\)s are in somewhat different circumstances, the ones where the actual law holds are closer than the rest. If the laws hold in some metaphysically possible worlds but not in others, then the reason why the former are closer than the latter must be that the rules we are using for deciding which worlds count as the closest say so. But which such rules we use is a matter of convention. The counterfactual-supporting power of the laws does not seem to be a purely conventional matter, however. Necessitarianism, the argument continues, offers a better explanation: the laws hold in the closest possible worlds simply because they hold in all metaphysically possible worlds. Conventions don’t come into it. The contingentist may reply that, even though the counterfactual robustness of the laws is grounded in a convention, that convention may not be arbitrary, but may have its rationale in certain features of the laws that make them, in some sense, objectively important (Sidelle 2002), e.g., the fact that they relate to particularly pervasive and conspicuous patterns in the history of the world.

Contingentism has often been defended by pointing out that the laws of nature can be known only a posteriori, and that their negations are conceivable (see Sidelle 2002). Necessitarians may reply to the first point that Kripke’s work has given us reasons for thinking that a posteriori truths can be metaphysically necessary (see section 1.1). In response to the second point, they may grant that the negation of a law is conceivable, but deny that conceivability is a good guide to possibility (see the entry Epistemology of Modality). Alternatively, they may deny that we can really conceive of a situation in which, say, bodies violate the law of gravitation. What we can conceive of is a situation in which objects move in ways that appear to violate the law. But that situation cannot be correctly be described as involving objects with mass. Rather, the objects in the imagined situation have a different property that is very similar to mass (call it ‘schmass’) but which is governed by slightly different laws. Contingentists may reply that the non-existence of schmass (or the non-existence of objects that move in the way imagined) is itself a law, so that we have, after all, conceived of a situation where one of the actual laws fails (see Fine 2002).

3. The Structure of the Modal Realm

The concepts of metaphysical, epistemic, and nomic necessity are only a few of the modal notions that figure in our thought and discourse (as should be clear from the long list of uses of modal terms given in the introduction to this entry). We also speak of

  • (6) Practical necessity
    Biological necessity
    Medical necessity
    Moral necessity
    Legal necessity

and of a whole lot more. One would expect that some of these modal concepts can be defined in terms of others. But how can that be done? And is it possible to single out a small number of fundamental notions of necessity in terms of which all the others can be defined?

It may be helpful in approaching these questions to distinguish between two salient ways in which one modal property can be defined in terms of another (Fine 2002, 254f.).

  1. Restriction. To say that property \(N\) can be defined from kind of necessity \(N^*\) by restriction is to say that a proposition’s having \(N\) can be defined as the combination of two things: (i) the proposition’s having \(N^*\), and (ii) its meeting certain additional conditions.
  2. Relativization / quantifier restriction. To say that a property \(N\) can be defined from a kind of necessity \(N^*\) by relativization to a class of propositions \(S\) is to say that a proposition’s having \(N\) can be defined as its being \(N^*\)-necessitated by \(S\). A closely related way in which a modal property can be defined in terms of another is by quantifier restriction. Suppose that \(P^*\) is a kind of possibility that is the dual of \(N^*\) (in the sense that it is \(P^*\)-possible that \(p\) just in case it’s not \(N^*\)-necessary that not-\(p)\), and that we have at our disposal the notion of a \(P^*\)-possible world (a world that could \(P^*\)-possibly have been actualized). To say that the property \(N\) can be defined from \(N^*\) by quantifier restriction is to say that that a proposition’s having \(N\) can be defined as its being true in all \(P^*\)-possible worlds that meet a certain condition \(C\). (This is only the simplest way of defining a modal property from a kind of necessity by quantifier restriction. Much more sophisticated methods have been proposed. See, e.g., Kratzer 1977, 1991.) Given reasonable assumptions, every definition by relativization corresponds to a definition by quantifier restriction, and vice versa.[9]

Restriction allows us to define narrower modal properties from broader ones. For example, it seems natural to hold that mathematical necessity can be defined from metaphysical necessity by restriction. (Perhaps a proposition’s being mathematically necessary can be defined as its being both metaphysically necessary and a mathematical truth (Fine 2002, 255), or as its being metaphysically necessary because it is a mathematical truth.) Relativization and quantifier restriction, by contrast, allow us to define broader modal properties in terms of narrower ones. For example, it may be held that biological necessity can be defined as the property of being metaphysically (or perhaps nomically) necessitated by the basic principles of biology.

A modal property \(N\) is called alethic just in case the claim that a proposition has \(N\) entails that the proposition is true. Metaphysical, epistemic and nomic necessity are all alethic. By contrast, moral and legal necessity are not. It is both morally and legally necessary (i.e., it is required both by morality and by the law) that no murders are committed, even though murders are in fact being committed. A modal property defined by restriction from an alethic kind of necessity must itself be alethic. By contrast, relativization allows us to define non-alethic modal properties from alethic ones, by relativizing to a class of propositions that contains some falsehoods. Similarly, we can define a non-alethic modal property from an alethic one by restricting the quantifier over possible worlds to some class that does not include the actual world. For example, legal necessity can perhaps be defined from metaphysical necessity by restricting the quantifier to worlds where everybody conforms to the actual laws.

The properties listed in (6) can very naturally be called ‘kinds of necessity,’ and in some contexts they are the properties expressed by necessity operators like ‘must’ and ‘could not have been otherwise.’ But that is not true of every property that can be defined from some kind of necessity by relativization or restriction. For example, we can define a property by relativizing metaphysical necessity to the class of truths stated in a certain book, but it would not be natural at all to call this property a kind of necessity. It is not plausible that there is a special form of necessity that attaches to all and only the propositions necessitated by the truths in the book. Similarly, the property defined by restricting metaphysical necessity to the truths about cheddar cheese cannot naturally be called a kind of necessity. There is no form of necessity that applies to just those necessary propositions that deal with cheddar and to none of the others. It is a good question what distinguishes those properties defined by relativization and restriction that we are willing to count as forms of necessity from the rest. Perhaps the most natural answer is that the distinction is dictated by our interests and concerns, and does not reflect a deep metaphysical difference.

A more pressing question is whether some of the forms of necessity discussed in sections 1 and 2 can be defined in terms of the others by relativization or restriction. Consider epistemic and metaphysical necessity first, and suppose for the sake of the argument that dualism is true and the two properties are indeed different forms of necessity. Can one of them be defined in terms of the other by one of the aforementioned methods? Not if there are both necessary a posteriori and contingent a priori propositions, since relativization and restriction only allow us to define one property in terms of another if the extension of one is a subclass of that of the other. However, the existence of contingent a priori truths is more controversial than that of necessary a posteriori propositions, and someone trying to define epistemic necessity in terms of metaphysical necessity or vice versa may repudiate the contingent a priori and hold that the extension of epistemic necessity is included in that of metaphysical necessity. Then such a philosopher could try (a) to define metaphysical necessity from epistemic necessity by relativization to some suitable class, or (b) to define epistemic necessity from metaphysical necessity by restriction.

Such a definition may get the extension of the definiendum right. But a definition may be intended to do much more than that: it may be meant to tell us what it \(is\) for something to fall under the concept to be defined. Suppose that someone tried to define the property of being an equiangular triangle as that of being a triangle whose sides are of equal length. While this is extensionally correct, it does not give us the right account of what it is for something to be an equiangular triangle (what it is for something to have that property has something to do with the sizes of its angles, not with the lengths of its sides). It could be argued that definitions of type (a) and (b) face similar difficulties. For example, a definition of kind (a) entails that a proposition’s being metaphysically necessary consists in its being epistemically necessitated by a certain class of propositions. But that would make metaphysical necessity an epistemic property, and dualists typically want to resist that idea. Similarly for definitions of type (b). Whether something is epistemically necessary (in the sense of being a priori) seems to be a purely epistemic matter. A priori propositions may also be metaphysically necessary, but their metaphysical necessity isn’t part of what makes them a priori, and therefore shouldn’t be mentioned in a definition of a prioricity.

If this argument is correct, then it is impossible to define epistemic modal properties in terms of non-epistemic ones, or vice versa. But what about metaphysical and nomic necessity? Suppose for the sake of the argument that there is such a thing as nomic necessity (a form of necessity associated with the laws of nature) but that contingentism about the natural laws is true, so that nomic necessity is indeed distinct from metaphysical necessity. Can we define one of these properties in terms of the other? The most natural way of doing this would be to say that

  • (7) Nomic necessity can be defined as the property of being metaphysically necessitated by the laws of nature.

Such a definition may be extensionally accurate, and many philosophers would not hesitate to endorse it. But others have doubted that it captures what it \(is\) for a proposition to be nomically necessary (Fine 2002). Nomic necessity is a special modal status enjoyed by all and only the propositions that are metaphysically necessitated by the natural laws. Now, if \(P\) is metaphysically necessitated by the laws without itself being a law, then it may seem plausible to say, in some sense, that \(P\) has that special modal status because \(P\) is metaphysically necessitated by the laws. But the reason why being metaphysically necessitated by the laws confers that special modal status on \(P\) is presumably that the laws themselves have that modal status and that this modal status gets transmitted across metaphysical necessitation. But if we now ask what makes it so that the laws themselves have that special modal status, (7) does not seem to give us the correct answer: the special necessity of the laws doesn’t consist in the fact that they are metaphysically necessitated by the laws. Hence, (7) cannot be a correct general account of what constitutes that special modal status.

It is open to debate which kinds of necessity are fundamental, in the sense that all others can be defined in terms of them, while they are not themselves definable in terms of others. The monist view considered in section 1.3, when combined with (7), may inspire the hope that we can make do with a single fundamental kind of necessity. Others have argued that there are several kinds of necessity that are not mutually reducible. For example, Fine (2002) suggests (in a discussion that sets aside epistemic modality) that there are three fundamental kinds of necessity, which he calls ‘metaphysical,’ ‘nomic’ and ‘normative’ necessity.

The reduction of the various kinds of necessity to a small number of fundamental ones is an important step towards the goal of a unified account of modality. But those who believe that there are several different fundamental kinds of necessity need to address another question: What is the common feature of these fundamental kinds of necessity that makes them all kinds of necessity? Why do they count as kinds of necessity, while other properties don’t?

One strategy for answering this question, which centers on non-epistemic forms of necessity, starts from a certain conception of what (non-epistemic) necessity consists in: for a proposition to be necessary is for its truth to be, in a certain sense, particularly firm, secure, inexorable or unshakable in a wholly objective way. A necessary truth could not easily have been false (it could less easily have been false than a contingent truth). We may call this feature of a proposition ‘modal force.’ It is natural to apply this conception to metaphysical and nomic necessity. Each of these properties may be held to consist in having a certain grade of modal force, though if contingentism is true, the degree of modal force required for nomic necessity is lower than that required for metaphysical necessity. We could then say that a property is one of the fundamental forms of necessity just in case a proposition \(P\)’s possessing that property consists entirely in \(P\)’s having a specific grade of modal force. Other kinds of necessity, like those listed in (6) can be defined from the fundamental ones by relativization or restriction. Having these properties does not consist simply in having a specific grade of modal force (and these properties therefore aren’t among the fundamental kinds of necessity). For example, if a property is defined by relativizing metaphysical necessity to a class of propositions \(S\), then the fact that a proposition \(P\) has that property consists in the fact that the connection between \(S\) and \(P\) has a certain grade of modal force. But that is not the same thing as P itself having a certain grade of modal force. Similarly, if a property is defined from, say, metaphysical necessity by restriction, then having that property does not consist merely in possessing such-and-such a grade of modal force, but in the conjunction of that feature with some other property.

This approach evidently leaves the question how to understand the idea of modal force (of a proposition’s truth being very unshakable). Some authors have attempted to explain this notion in counterfactual terms (see Lewis 1973a, §2.5; Lewis 1973b, §2.1; McFetridge 1990, 150ff.; Lange 1999, 2004, 2005; Williamson 2005, 2008; Hill 2006; Kment 2006a; cp. Jackson 1998, Chalmers 2002a): the necessary truths are distinguished from the contingent ones by the fact that they are not only true as things actually are, but that they would still have been true if things had been different in various ways. To capture this idea more precisely, Lange (2005) introduces the concept of ‘stability’: a deductively closed set \(S\) of truths is stable just in case, for any claim \(P\) in \(S\) and any claim \(Q\) consistent with \(S\), it is true in any context to say that it would still have been the case that \(P\) if it had been the case that \(Q\). The different forms of necessity have in common that their extensions are stable sets.

Kment (2006a, 2014, chs. 1–2) argues that modal force, and hence necessity and possibility, come in many degrees (cp. Williamson 2016). We often talk about such degrees of possibility when we say things like ‘Team \(A\) could more easily have won than Team \(B\),’ ‘Team \(A\) could easily have won’ or ‘Team \(A\) almost won.’ The first utterance states that \(A\)’s winning had a greater degree of possibility than \(B\)’s winning, while the second and third simply ascribe a high degree of possibility to \(A\)’s winning. A proposition’s degree of possibility is the higher the less of a departure from actuality is required for it to be true. Suppose, e.g., that Team \(A\) would have won if one of their players had stood just an inch further to the left at a crucial moment during the game. Then we can truly say that the team could easily have won. More formally, \(P\)’s degree of possibility is the higher the closer the closest \(P\)-worlds are to actuality (also see Lewis 1973a, §2.5; Lewis 1973b, §2.1; Kratzer 1991). Similarly, a truth’s degree of necessity is measured by the distance from actuality to the closest worlds where it is false. What metaphysical necessity, nomic necessity and the other grades of necessity have in common is that each of them is the property of having a degree of possibility that is above a certain threshold. What distinguishes them is a difference in their associated thresholds.


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