Editorial Information

Principal Editor: Edward N. Zalta, Senior Research Scholar, Center for the Study of Language and Information, Stanford University
Senior Editor: Uri Nodelman, Senior Research Engineer, Center for the Study of Language and Information, Stanford University
Associate Editor: Colin Allen, Professor, Department of History and Philosophy of Science, University of Pittsburgh
Assistant Editors: Paul Oppenheimer, Stanford University/The University of Adelaide
Jesse Alama
Emma Pease
Hannah H. Kim
Lauren Thomas
Principal Contributors: Editorial Board
List of Authors
Consulting Software Engineer: Paul Daniell
Other Contributors: Occasional Referees
Past Subject Editors
Faculty Sponsor: R. Lanier Anderson, Department of Philosophy, Stanford University
Advisory Board: Department of Philosophy, Stanford University
Publisher: Metaphysics Research Lab
Center for the Study of Language and Information
Stanford University
Stanford, CA 94305
Library of Congress Catalog: ISSN 1095-5054
Email Correspondence: editors@plato.stanford.edu

Information for Authors

Editorial Policies

  1. Editorial decisions concerning the Encyclopedia, including decisions concerning its content, format and distribution, are made by the Principal Editor in consultation with the Senior Editor, Associate Editor, and the members of the Editorial Board.
  2. The members of the Editorial Board are selected in consultation with the Stanford University Department of Philosophy, which serves as the Encyclopedia's Advisory Board. The Advisory Board also advises the Principal Editor on the basic policies governing the operation of the Encyclopedia.
  3. Contributions to the Encyclopedia are normally solicited by invitation from a member of the Editorial Board. However, qualified potential contributors may send, to editors@plato.stanford.edu, a preliminary proposal to write on an Encyclopedia topic (i.e., a one-page ‘pre-proposal’ that describes the topic and the literature that needs to be introduced), along with a curriculum vitae.
    • By qualified, we mean those persons with accredited Ph.D.s in Philosophy (or a related discipline) who have published refereed works on the topic of the proposed entry. By refereed works we mean either articles in respected, peer-reviewed journals or books which have been published by respected publishing houses and which have undergone the usual peer review process prior to publication. (Notes in newsletters, proceedings, unpublished dissertations, etc., do not count as much.) However, if a member of our Editorial Board is familiar with the work of the potential contributor, the latter may be certified as qualified.
    • By Encyclopedia topic, we mean a topic that is appropriate for a reference work in academic philosophy and is (a) either listed in our Projected Table of Contents or (b) falls within the area of expertise of one of the members of our Editorial Board. Since the Encyclopedia currently does not yet have subject editors for every specialized area of philosophy, some topics suitable for a reference work in academic philosophy might fail condition (b) -- we reserve the right to determine whether such preliminary entry proposals (in specialized areas for which the Encyclopedia lacks subject editors) should be pursued at this time.
    The members of the Editorial Board reserve the right to compare the qualifications of any person submitting an unsolicited request with those of other potential authors who would be qualified to write the entry in question.
  4. All entries, whether solicited or approved, will be refereed by one or more of the subject editors on our Editorial Board or by one or more external referees who have been approved by a member of the Editorial Board. Authors are expected to engage any constructive criticisms they receive during the referee process, prior to publication. Authors should note, however, that no matter whether they have been invited or approved by one of these subject editors, our goal of producing a high-quality reference work requires us to admit the possibility that some submitted entries may not be accepted for publication.
  5. Readers of the Encyclopedia are encouraged to contact authors directly with comments, corrections, and other suggestions for improvements.
  6. It remains the responsibility of authors to maintain their entries and to keep them current. Authors are expected to revise their entries in a timely way both (1) in response to important new research on the topic of the entry and (2) in response to any valid criticism they receive, whether it comes from the subject editors on our Editorial Board, other members of the profession, or interested readers. In connection with (1), authors should update the Bibliography and Other Internet Resources sections of their entries regularly, to keep pace with significant new publications, both in print and on the web. In connection with (2), the validity of criticism will be determined by the Principal Editor, typically in consultation with the relevant members of the Editorial Board. The length of time required for a "timely" revision will be negotiable and will both respect the author's current commitments and reflect how seriously the piece fails to accomodate new research or the seriousness of any valid criticism. Entries which are not revised within the negotiated timetable may be retired from the active portion of the Encyclopedia and left in the Encyclopedia Archives until such time as the entry is revised so as to engage the valid criticisms in question.
  7. The views expressed by the authors in their entries are their own and do not necessarily reflect those of Stanford University, the Stanford University Philosophy Department, the Encyclopedia's Editors or of anyone else associated with the Encyclopedia.
  8. Policy on Course Readers.
  9. The SEP does not charge authors a publication fee.

Publication Ethics

The following is adapted from the Code of Conduct and Best-Practice Guidelines for Journal Editors, published by the Committee on Publication Ethics, 2011.

The SEP Editors endeavor to meet the needs of its intended audience; constantly improve our reference work; have processes in place to assure the quality of the material we publish; maintain the integrity of the academic record; preclude business needs from compromising intellectual and ethical standards; and publish corrections, clarifications, etc. as needed in a timely way. The SEP Editors further endeavor to: actively welcome the views of authors, readers, reviewers, and editorial board members about ways of improving their SEP's processes; encourage and be aware of research into peer review and publishing and reassessing the SEP's processes in the light of new findings; support initiatives designed to reduce research and publication misconduct; support initiatives to educate researchers about publication ethics; and assess the effects of our policies on author and reviewer behavior and revising policies, as required, to encourage responsible behavior and discourage misconduct. Finally, the SEP Editors will: ensure that all entries are reviewed by suitably qualified reviewers; adopt processes that encourage accuracy, completeness and clarity of reporting; adopt authorship or contributorship systems that promote good practice (i.e. so that authorship information accurately reflects who did the work) and discourage misconduct (e.g. ghost and guest authors); and ensure that conflicts of interest are handled in an appropriate manner.

Copyright Information

Copyright Notice. Authors contributing an entry or entries to the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, except as provided herein, retain the copyright to their entry or entries. By contributing an entry or entries, authors grant to the Metaphysics Research Lab at Stanford University an exclusive license to publish their entry or entries on the Internet and the World Wide Web, including any future technologies or media that develop to supplement or replace the Internet or World Wide Web, on the terms of the Licensing Agreement set forth below. The rights granted to the Metaphysics Research Lab at Stanford University include the right to enforce such rights in any forum, administrative, judicial, or otherwise. All rights not expressly granted to the Metaphysics Research Lab at Stanford University, including the right to publish an entry or entries in other print media, are retained by the authors. Copyright of the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy itself is held by the Metaphysics Research Lab at Stanford University. All rights are reserved. Though authors retain copyright in their entries and reserve fixed media distribution rights, SEP entries may be used in compliance with the Terms of Use below. The other pages in the SEP (i.e., the non-entry pages) may not be reprinted, reproduced, stored, or utilized in any form, by any electronic, mechanical, or other means, now known or hereafter invented, including printing, photocopying, saving (on disk), broadcasting or recording, or in any information storage or retrieval system, other than for purposes of fair use, without written permission from the copyright holder.

Licensing Agreement. By contributing an entry or entries to the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy authors grant to the Metaphysics Research Lab at Stanford University a perpetual, exclusive, worldwide right to copy, distribute, transmit and publish their contribution on the Internet and World Wide Web. The authors also grant to the Metaphysics Research Lab at Stanford University a perpetual, non-exclusive, worldwide right to copy, distribute, transmit and publish any and all derivative works prepared or modified by the Editors from the original contribution, in whole or in part, by any variety of methods on all types of publication and broadcast media other than the Internet, now known or hereafter invented. Authors also grant to the Metaphysics Research Lab at Stanford University a perpetual, non-exclusive, worldwide right to translate their contribution, as well as any modified or derivative works, into any and all languages for the same purposes of copying, distributing, transmitting and publishing their work.

Statement of Liability and Indemnity. By contributing an entry or entries to the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy authors grant, to the Principal Editor, the Senior Editor, the Associate Editor, members of the Advisory and Editorial Boards, the Metaphysics Research Lab, CSLI, Stanford University and its officers, trustees, agents and employees (“Stanford Parties”), immunity from all liability arising from their work. All authors are responsible for securing permission to use any copyrighted material, including graphics, quotations, and photographs, within their entries. The Principal Editor, Senior Editor, Associate Editor, members of the Advisory and Editorial Boards, CSLI, and the Stanford Parties therefore disclaim any and all responsibility for copyright violations and any other form of liability arising from the content of the Encyclopedia or from any material linked to the Encyclopedia. Authors agree to indemnify and hold the Stanford Parties harmless from any claims of copyright infringement or other alleged wrongdoing in connection with the author's entries.

Take Down Policy. Every effort has been made by the individual contributing authors to discover and contact copyright holders of artwork and content used in this website. To the extent that a copyright holder could not be found or an inadvertent permissions or copyright error was made, the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy stands ready to remove content upon notice and request by a copyright holder. Alleged copyright violations should be brought to the attention of the author and the Principal Editor, so that such issues may be dealt with promptly.

Terms of Use

Preamble. The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (SEP) is an edited open access work produced by a collaborative community of scholars. SEP entries (i.e., the articles contributed by SEP authors) are regularly revised—although fixed version are available from our Archives. In order to preserve the integrity of the SEP—to sustain it as a free resource for the long term and to ensure clarity regarding what content is current—some distribution rights are limited.

  1. User Rights. The Board of Trustees of the Leland Stanford Junior University (“Stanford”) grants each individual user (“User”) a royalty-free non-exclusive limited license to read, download, make copies, print, search, or link to the full text of each SEP entry, crawl each entry for indexing (subject to reasonable network usage constraints), and distribute each entry only as permitted below provided that the purpose of the distribution is non-commercial.
  2. Limited Electronic Distribution Rights.
    1. A User may electronically distribute an SEP entry to computers and mobile devices that are owned and controlled by the User.
    2. A User may electronically distribute an SEP entry to others only for private electronic correspondence. This includes communications between the User and an individual, and communications, postings or file-sharing to closed, invitation-only groups of individuals with no archives publicly available, provided that the group consists of no greater than 30 individuals.
    3. A User may electronically distribute a link to an SEP entry.
    4. No other electronic distribution rights are granted.
  3. Limited Fixed-Media Distribution Rights. Users may distribute printed copies or copies on fixed media (e.g., CD-ROM) only with prior written permission of the author of the SEP entry.
  4. Course Reader Policy. Since students should have free access to all entries at the SEP website https://plato.stanford.edu/, we encourage instructors to distribute a link to the relevant content on our site to their students instead of distributing copies of SEP entries in course readers.  Students (a) may prefer to read SEP entries on their electronic devices without incurring any costs, and (b) may be able to print SEP entries for themselves more cheaply than the amount charged for reproducing those pages in a course reader. Despite this recommendation, the inclusion of SEP entries in course readers is allowed under the following conditions:
    1. If the course reader containing an SEP entry is to be distributed in fixed-media (e.g., print), permission of the author must be secured.
    2. If a course reader containing an SEP entry is to be distributed electronically, it must be done in compliance with 2(b).
  5. General. The SEP, Stanford, its trustees, officers, faculty, staff and students (including affiliates) are not liable for indirect consequential, incidental, special, punitive, exemplary damages, including lost profits. Failure to enforce these terms of use does not constitute a waiver. Entries are provided “as-is” and Stanford disclaims all warranties with respect to the SEP website and SEP entries, including express warranties, and implied warranties of merchantibility, fitness for purpose, title and non-infringement. No warranty is provided that the website or SEP entries or access to them, are secure, uninterrupted, timely, accurate, error-free or virus-free. These terms of use and any dispute that may arise out of them, SEP entries or the website may only be brought in State or Federal court located in Santa Clara County, California, United States.