Supplement to Abduction

Peirce on Abduction

The term “abduction” was coined by Charles Sanders Peirce in his work on the logic of science. He introduced it to denote a type of non-deductive inference that was different from the already familiar inductive type. It is a common complaint that no coherent picture emerges from Peirce’s writings on abduction. (Though perhaps this is not surprising, given that he worked on abduction throughout his career, which spanned a period of more than fifty years. For a concise yet thorough account of the development of Peirce’s thoughts about abduction, see Fann 1970.) Yet it is clear that, as Peirce understood the term, “abduction” did not quite mean what it is currently taken to mean (see Campos 2011 and McAuliffe 2015). One main difference between his conception and the modern one is that, whereas according to the latter, abduction belongs to what the logical empiricists called the “context of justification”—the stage of scientific inquiry in which we are concerned with the assessment of theories—for Peirce abduction had its proper place in the context of discovery, the stage of inquiry in which we try to generate theories which may then later be assessed. As he says, “[a]bduction is the process of forming explanatory hypotheses. It is the only logical operation which introduces any new idea” (CP 5.172); elsewhere he says that abduction encompasses “all the operations by which theories and conceptions are engendered” (CP 5.590). Deduction and induction, then, come into play at the later stage of theory assessment: deduction helps to derive testable consequences from the explanatory hypotheses that abduction has helped us to conceive, and induction finally helps us to reach a verdict on the hypotheses, where the nature of the verdict is dependent on the number of testable consequences that have been verified. (As an aside, it is to be noted that Gerhard Schurz has recently defended a view of abduction that is again very much in the Peircean spirit. On this view, “the crucial function of a pattern of abduction … consists in its function as a search strategy which leads us, for a given kind of scenario, in a reasonable time to a most promising explanatory conjecture which is then subject to further test” (Schurz 2008, 205). The paper is also of interest because of the useful typology of patterns of abduction that it puts forth.)

As Harry Frankfurt (1958) has noted, however, the foregoing view is not as easy to make sense of as might at first appear. Abduction is supposed to be part of the logic of science, but what exactly is logical about inventing explanatory hypotheses? According to Peirce (CP 5.189), abduction belongs to logic because it can be given a schematic characterization, to wit, the following:

The surprising fact, C, is observed.
But if A were true, C would be a matter of course.
Hence, there is reason to suspect that A is true.

But Frankfurt rightly remarks that this is not an inference leading to any new idea. After all, the new idea—the explanatory hypothesis A—must have occurred to one before one infers that there is reason to suspect that A is true, for A already figures in the second premise.

Frankfurt then goes on to argue that a number of passages in Peirce’s work suggest an understanding of abduction not so much as a process of inventing hypotheses but rather as one of adopting hypotheses, where the adoption of the hypothesis is not as being true or verified or confirmed, but as being a worthy candidate for further investigation. On this understanding, abduction could still be thought of as being part of the context of discovery. It would work as a kind of selection function, or filter, determining which of the hypotheses that have been conceived in the stage of discovery are to pass to the next stage and be subjected to empirical testing. The selection criterion is that there must be a reason to suspect that the hypothesis is true, and we will have such a reason if the hypothesis makes whichever observed facts we are interested in explaining a matter of course. This would indeed make better sense of Peirce’s claim that abduction is a logical operation.

Nevertheless, Frankfurt ultimately rejects this proposal as well. Given, he says, that there may be infinitely many hypotheses that account for a given fact or set of facts—which Peirce acknowledged—it can hardly be a sufficient condition for the adoption of a hypothesis (in the above sense) that its truth would make that fact or set of facts a matter of course. At a minimum, abduction would not seem to be of much use as a selection function. One may doubt whether this is a valid objection, however. Echoing what was said in connection with underdetermination arguments, we note that it is by no means clear that “accounting for a given fact” is to be identified with “making that fact a matter of course.” For all Frankfurt says, for a hypothesis to account for a fact, it is enough if it entails that fact. But virtually no philosopher of science nowadays holds that entailment is sufficient for explanation. And it would seem reasonable to read the phrase “making a given fact a matter of course” as “giving a satisfactory explanation of that fact.” In response to Frankfurt’s objection, it could thus be argued that even if there is an infinity of hypotheses that account for a given fact, there may still be only a handful that could be said to give a satisfactory explanation of it. But it is for Peirce scholars to decide whether this proposed interpretation is plausible in the light of Peirce’s further writings.

Even if “making a given fact a matter of course” can be read as “giving a satisfactory explanation of that fact,” it is remarkable that there is no reference in Peirce’s writings on abduction to the notion of best explanation. Some satisfactory explanations might still be better than others, and there might even be a unique best one. This idea is crucial in all recent thinking about abduction. Therein lies another main difference between Peirce’s conception of abduction and the modern one.

Copyright © 2021 by
Igor Douven <>

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