Notes to Abhidharma

1. The Sautrāntikas and Dārṣṭāntikas appear to represent the same doctrinal party within the Sarvāstivāda that criticized orthodox Sarvāstivāda ontology (see section 5 below). On the groups within the Sarvāstivāda branch see Cox 2004B, 505.

2. On the history of the Buddhist schools see, e.g., Cousins 2001; Cox 1995, 29; Gethin 1998, 50–53; Lamotte 1988, 520–521.

3. For overviews of the extant Abhidharma literature see Hinüber 1996, 64–75, 149–153, and 160–165; Kragh 2002; Norman 1983, 96–107 and 151–153.

4. Based on these distinctions, the commentarial tradition forms a hermeneutic technique of distinguishing between two levels of truth: provisional and absolute. See Jayatilleke 1963, 361–368.

5. On the oral nature of early Buddhist literature and the role of mnemonic lists in it see Cousins 1983; Gethin 1992B.

6. For more detailed discussions of the changes in the Buddhist understanding of dharmas/dhammas see Gethin 2004; Ronkin 2005, 35–42; Waldron 2003, 28–33 & 50–52.

7. The different Buddhist schools, however, disputed the nature of dharmas and their interaction, and some interpretations paved the way for ontological conclusions about the existence of dharmas—see sections 3 and 4 below.

8. According to the basic princi­ples of Buddhist cosmology, there is a hierarchy of several different realms of existence: the lower realms of hell beings, of animals, of hungry ghosts, of human beings, of various kinds of divine being collectively known as the lower gods, and above the various heaven realms of divine beings known as Brahmās. Beings (not only human) are continually reborn in these realms in conformity with their actions. On Buddhist cosmology see Gethin 1997, esp. pp. 186–187.

9. See also Gethin 1992A, 151–152 and 1998, 209.

10. The theory of the consciousness process is discussed in section 6 below.

11. In the case of the Pali tradition, the term sabhāva features in five canonical or para-canonical texts (Paṭis II 177–183; BV II 167; Mil 149, 185, 241; Peṭ 104; Nett 78–79). These occurrences give only a very broad notion of sabhāva as the nature of clusters of dhamma, but it is by no means clear that a dhamma exists by virtue of this nature or that it necessarily defines what a dhamma is.

12. See also Dhs-mṭ 25; Vism-mhṭ I 347 on Vism VIII 246.

13. On the Sarvāstivāda theories of causes and conditions see Cox 1995, 90ff; Willemen et. al. 1998, 28–31.

14. The “mass of karma” that makes up sentient experience is governed by non-random sequences of coordinated factors. The relationship between these sequences is called dependent origination (Skt., pratītyasamutpāda, Pali, paṭiccasamuppāda) and is articulated by the stock twelvefold chain of links leading from ignorance to aging and death, which symbolize whatever types of unsatisfactoriness there are.

15. For a discussion of the Theravāda theory of causal conditioning and its interpretation within the context of the dhamma theory see Ronkin 2005, Ch. 5.

16. The following concise summary of the theory is based on its elucidation in Cousins 1981 and Gethin 1994, 17–22.

17. On the Buddha’s view of language see Gombrich 2009, Ch. 10, esp. pp. 144–155; Ronkin 2005, 244–250.

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Noa Ronkin <>

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