Notes to Abner of Burgos

1. The source of this opinion is Baer (1954) and Baer (1929: pp. 20–37). Also Gershenzon (1984: pp. 120–167) in trying to deepen this position. This opinion is also cited by a number of modern scholars like Idel; Lasker; Sainz…. Szpiech (2006: pp. 541–555) and Hecht (1993: pp. 471–480). Sadik (2010) critiques this opinion (this paragraph is based on Sadik 2010).

2. The influence of Neo-Platonic writers on Kabbalah explains why a researcher like Baer thinks that Abner used Kabbalistic sources.

3. In fact, he cites only a few times the general opinion of the Kabbalists, and not always in accord with them.

4. It is important to note that Abner tried to convince his Jewish audience that all the important rabbis of the past (including some of the ancient rabbis like Rabbi Akiba and Rabbi Ishmael, and more modern ones like Maimonides) were secretly aware of the truth of Christianity, and didn’t convert only because of pragmatic and not philosophical reasons. It is very probable that if Abner had known Kabbalistic sources, he would have wanted to make similar claims regarding Kabbalistic authors. We know that Rabbi Abner was well versed in the commentary of Nahmanides on the Torah, especially in the secret Kabbalistic part of this commentary in which this Rabbi explains Kabbalistic ideas to Rabbi Isaac from Acre. In the writing of Abner we don’t have any clear quotation from this commentary.

5. On his dream, see Sainz de la Maza Vicosio (1992).

6. Szpiech (2006) devoted his important work on Abner to a study of this book. On the Mostrador de Justicia see especially pages 147–289. In the beginning of the work there is a summary of each paragraph.

7. Edited by Hecht (1993) with an English translation. On the study of the Hebrew version, see also Gershenzon (1984).

8. The Castilian translation has been edited twice by Mettman and Sainz de la Maza Vicioso (1989).

9. These different letters are the bases of the latter philosophical work of Pulgar, Aid to Religion (Ezer Ha-Dat).

10. The extant part was published by Mettman with the Ofrenda de Zelos.

11. Published by Rosenthal (1967).

12. Published by Rosenthal (1961, 1962, 1964).

13. On this subject, see Chazan (1984, 2000).

In general, the majority of Christian philosophers (even the Christian polemists) argue that the Trinity is a belief that doesn’t contradict philosophy. They further claim that through faith they can find the true opinion amongst the philosophically possible opinions. In contrast, Abner argues that the existence of the Trinity is an obligatory opinion. .

15. On the deterministic opinion of Abner, see Ravitzky (1982).

16. For example, his work מגדל עוז, which he wrote during the Jewish part of his life.

17. The only reference to Christianity is a phrase at the end of the book that the opinions described therein are in accord with the Christian view of predestination.

18.Abner was the first thinker in this book to argue for a deterministic interpretation of Maimonides.

19. In fact, the four former chapters of the sixth part of the second speech (that Crescas devotes to the question of free will) are a paraphrase of Ofrenda de Zelos.

20. Rabbi Isaac Pulgar in the third part of his work (Ezer Ha-Dat); Rabbi Moses from Narbonne in a special philosophical response; and Rabbi Joseh Ben Shem Tov in a lost book that he quotes in his commentary of the Ethics to Nicomachus. In this book, the last author mentions the influence of Abner on Crescas

21. This part of the article is based on Sadik (2008, 2011).

22. At the end of chapter six of Mostrador de justicia, pages 91–93.

23. It is certain that more Jewish works deal with Abner’s arguments without explicitly stating so.

24. In this work, Crescas doesn’t take notice of the original arguments of Abner for Christianity. The reason for this lack of attention is, in my opinion, that the goal of Crescas in this book is to argue against the religion and theology of the majority of Christians, which is very different from the original definition of Christianity in the writings of Abner.

Copyright © 2016 by
Shalom Sadik <>

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