Aesthetic Testimony

First published Wed Mar 13, 2024

Testimony is an important source of knowledge which is used ubiquitously in our daily lives (Coady 1992; Lackey 2008; Lackey & Sosa 2006; Matilal & Chakrabarti 1994; Faulkner 2011; Moran 2018; Wright 2019). Given this, it is particularly interesting that—despite the widespread general reliance on testimony—there are influential strands of thought which hold that we ought to avoid such reliance in certain atypical areas. The aesthetic domain has long been held to be one of these atypical areas (for discussion of other putative exception cases see, e.g., Hills 2009; Sliwa 2012; Sweeney 2007; Jay 2016; and Ranalli 2020). Indeed, ever since Kant’s Critique of the Power of Judgment (1790), it has been argued that when we engage with matters of an aesthetic character, first-hand experience of the aesthetic qualities in question is, in some sense, required (Kant 1790; Mothersill 1961; Tormey 1973). The central idea is that when determining, for example, whether the painting is harmonious, the dance graceful, or the sunset beautiful, we must experience the aesthetic character of the object of appreciation for ourselves. It simply will not do—though there has been considerably less consensus about why it won’t do—for us to rely on testimony.

1. Testimony in Aesthetics

1.1 Scope and Terminology

The precise nature of testimony is itself a matter of philosophical controversy and various different accounts have been offered. Elizabeth Fricker (2012: 254) takes testimony to be a very broad matter concerning “tellings generally”, similarly Sosa (1991: 219) describes testimony as a “statement [or expression] of someone”s thoughts or beliefs, which they might direct to the world at large, and to no one in particular’. Other plausible accounts build in the condition that the expression must be communicated with the intention to impart information that has the potential to tell us something new (Lackey 2008: Ch1) and still others build in certain positive epistemic aspects, such as that the testifier has some degree of competence regarding the issue at hand (Coady 1992: 42). In what follows, we will have little to say about these general debates but will focus, as the debate in aesthetics has tended to, on testimony in a very broad sense—aiming to accommodate the basic idea that when one testifies, one makes an assertion to the truth of some proposition.

In following the debate in aesthetics, it is also worth noting that we will—as is now standard—be confining ourselves to cases of “pure testimony”, that is cases where a testifier invites their audience to believe

that p on the basis that her informant T claims that p, and independently of any evidence that T offers for that claim. (Hopkins 2011: 138)

Someone offering pure testimony on the beauty of Matisse’s Appolon would simply state “Matisse”s Appolon is beautiful’ without adding further reasons or descriptions to defend their judgement.

With this notion of testimony in mind, the central controversy we will focus on concerns the suggestion that we should not defer to testimony in aesthetics. Deferential responses to pure testimony require accepting the invitation to form a judgement that p on the basis of the testifier’s testimony, even though the testifier has not added any supporting reasons for this judgement—and require one to do so without attempting to further verify the matter for oneself. Non-deferential responses are typically understood to be ones in which we, e.g., suspend judgement (Hopkins 2001: 167–169) on the matter and actively respond to the matter in question, using testimony as a prompt to investigate and try to form the judgements for ourselves (a less charitable interlocutor might simply disregard the testimony entirely but this isn’t required for being non-deferential in the relevant sense). One might still qualify as deferring if, when forming the judgement that p, one consults wider information about the testifier’s general competence and sincerity—one might, for example, take into consideration the testifier’s general track-record in the aesthetic domain, or consult any available information about the testifier’s tendency to lie for social gain—just so long as one does not attempt to specifically verify for oneself whether or not p is true. Those who take a negative view of deference to testimony in aesthetics will typically also—as we will see in §1.2 below—be sceptical of the role of other methods (such as inductive inference) other than first-person judgement in establishing aesthetic claims. However, we don’t take this to be definitive of the position itself.

Something like the generally negative view of deference to testimony just described has come to be known as “pessimism concerning aesthetic testimony” (the terminology was first employed by Hopkins (2007) to name the parallel position concerning moral testimony). The pessimist holds that we cannot legitimately form aesthetic judgements on the basis of testimony. By contrast, the pessimist’s opponent, the optimist concerning aesthetic testimony, maintains that—provided certain conditions are met—it can be perfectly legitimate to do so. These are (as we will see in §3) overly simplified versions of what are often very nuanced views on both sides but they will be helpful for the time being.

1.2 A Brief History of the Debate

The historical genesis of discussion of issues surrounding aesthetic testimony appears to be Kant’s third critique, where he notes that:

If a man […] does not find a building, a prospect, or a poem beautiful, a hundred voices all highly praising it will not force his innermost agreement… he clearly sees that the agreement of others gives no valid proof of the judgement about beauty […] that a thing has pleased others could never serve as the basis for an aesthetical judgement. (1790: Part I, Div. 1, §33 [1914: 157])

There have, of course, been earlier discussions of the legitimacy of testimony (for example in Augustine [Revisions I.3]; Locke 1689 [An Essay Concerning Human Understanding IV.16]; Reid 1764 [An Inquiry into the Human Mind on the Principles of Common Sense VI.24]) as well as of the means by which we form aesthetic judgements (Hume 1757; Hutcheson 1725/26) but Kant appears to have been the first to explicitly rule out testimony as grounds for specifically aesthetic judgement. (Or at least, if there are any relevant historical precursors to this, they have yet to be highlighted within the current literature on the topic.)

As with much of Kant’s work, though, his claim here has been subject to a range of radically different interpretations and has inspired a range of different forms of pessimism (Gorodeisky 2010; Hopkins 2001; Scruton 1974). A key part of the issue here is that Kant’s discussion of testimony is incredibly brief (including scarcely more than the material quoted above). He almost immediately moves on to highlight, what he takes to be, the even greater obstacles to founding our aesthetic judgements on the basis of “an a priori proof determine[d] according to definite rules” (1790, Part I, Div. 1, §33 [1914: 157]). And, in particular, he moves to denying the legitimacy of a specific kind of proof, that which is based on so-called “principles of taste”. For there to be a principle of taste would require

a principle under the condition of which we could subsume the concept of an object and thus infer by means of a syllogism that the object is beautiful. (Kant 1790, Part I, Div. 1, §34 [1914: 159])

Principles of this kind are certainly at least suggested by some of Kant’s precursors and contemporaries but much could be said exegetically about whether any of these writers are really committed to fully fledged principles of taste. Hutcheson (1725/26), for example, famously thought of beautiful objects as those displaying an appropriate ratio of uniformity to variety. However, it’s unclear whether (even if we accept this particular view of beauty) someone who lacked aesthetic judgement could independently identify the appropriate kind of unity in variety and so infer beauty from this. This debate surrounding principles of taste, or the lack of same, subsequently went on to become a mainstay of twentieth century analytic aesthetics (see, e.g., Beardsley 1962 and Mothersill 1961), leaving specific discussion of aesthetic testimony somewhat neglected. Similarly, there were significant debates concerning the kinds of broader principles we’ll discuss in Section 2. Principles which rule out basing one’s aesthetic judgements on testimony but also, inter alia, doing so on the basis of argument.

A prominent exception to the neglect of aesthetic testimony was Tormey’s (1973) discussion of critical judgement (which he takes [1973: 35] to be synonymous with “aesthetic judgement”) which explicitly, albeit briefly, notes (1973: 38) that cases of reliance on testimony should be excluded from the realm of legitimate critical judgement. This thought was later echoed, as we will explore further below, by Richard Wollheim (1980: 233) in his famous Acquaintance Principle, the second part of which maintains that aesthetic judgements are not, “except within very narrow limits, transmissible from one person to another”. As with the other aspects of this principle, Wollheim clearly took himself (1980) to be pointing to an established consensus within aesthetics rather than as proposing any kind of innovation. Something which might suggest that, even if it wasn’t often mentioned in print, pessimism was seen as something of common sense position at the time. Indeed, Zangwill (1990)—in one of the first extended discussions of the status of aesthetic testimony—goes so far as to list it as a “dogma” of Kantian aesthetics before going on to offer an extended argument against the pessimist.

While it was rare to see aesthetic testimony given explicit focus in the twentieth century (Scruton 1974 being another notable exception), this has been far from the case in the twenty-first. Following the publication of three highly influential papers in relatively quick succession—Hopkins (2000), Budd (2003), and Meskin (2004)—aesthetic testimony has quickly grown into a prominent area for debate. Something which parallels an increasing focus on testimony within philosophy more generally (Coady 1992; Lackey 2008; Lackey & Sosa 2006; Matilal & Chakrabarti 1994) as well as with other putatively exceptional areas such as ethics (Hills 2009) and religion (Jay 2016).

2. Broader Principles

It is common for those on all sides of the aesthetic testimony debate to discuss the claims they are making (or denying) in relation to certain putative broader principles of aesthetic judgement. In particular, the pessimist will often aim to use such principles as (partial) explanations for the truth of pessimism. In this section we consider the relationship between some of these key principles and the debate concerning aesthetic testimony.

2.1 The Acquaintance Principle

By far the most commonly appealed to principle here is Richard Wollheim’s (1980: 233) acquaintance principle (AP), according to which

judgements of aesthetic value, unlike judgements of moral knowledge, must be based on first-hand experience of their objects and are not, except within very narrow limits, transmissible from one person to another.

A principle which (at least modulo the tantalising mention of “very narrow limits”) appears to doubly rule out appeal to aesthetic testimony, since testimony cannot provide us with first hand acquaintance and clearly requires some kind of interpersonal transmission.

Appeals to AP as an explanation for pessimism are, however, fraught for two reasons. First, Wollheim’s principle, and his subsequent discussion of it, are sometimes rather difficult to interpret. Second, there are those who hold that AP itself is false. These two issues are, of course, related and it is common for both advocates and detractors of AP to argue that various interpretations of the principle clearly render it either trivial or implausible (Hopkins 2006; Budd 2003; Ransom 2019; Lord 2018). For example, it seems clear that a requirement that we must always engage with the work itself in order to make any aesthetic judgement of it is implausibly demanding and that a suitably accurate reproduction or sufficiently detailed photograph would allow for some aesthetic insight in many cases. Where these theorists differ is whether there are any versions of the principle which aren’t benighted in this way. And there have been further concerns about AP’s ability to handle certain kinds of art works such as conceptual art (for a discussion of these and some responses see Hanson (2015)). Some, such as Livingston (2003) take these concerns to undermine the prospects for any version of AP which is both true and non-trivial but others are more hopeful. Lord (2018), for example, has suggested that we should think about acquaintance not with a particular artwork but, rather, with some particular highly determinate aesthetic property which the object instantiates. Acquaintance with this property doesn’t, strictly, require acquaintance with the work itself but, rather, allows for acquaintance with reproductions or photographs. However, a principle of this kind would still rule out forming our aesthetic judgements on the basis of induction or testimony. Regardless of how we interpret the scope of the principle, though, there remains the question of how the “must” should be interpreted here. On some accounts, the demand is interpreted as an epistemic one, with acquaintance being a prerequisite for aesthetic knowledge (Pettit 1983; Budd 2003), but—as we will see in §3.2—even amongst pessimists there has been an increasing move towards interpreting the demand as relating to some manner of non-epistemic norm (Hopkins 2006).

More recently, though, debate has arisen as to whether AP should even be interpreted as supporting a (non-trivial) version of pessimism. Lopes (2014: 170), has claimed that “the controversy over the acquaintance principle ensues from an incorrect interpretation of it”. Many philosophers interpret “aesthetic judgement” as referring to some belief-like state—which might fail to meet some norm, epistemic or otherwise. According to Lopes “aesthetic judgement” should rather be interpreted as a certain kind of experiential / appreciative state which, by its very nature, cannot be entered into on the basis of, say, testimony. (Shelley 2023 offers a rather different, but equally revisionary, interpretation of AP.) Such exegetical moves certainly have precedent, consider the case of Frank Sibley. A number of discussions of aesthetic testimony (such as Gorodeisky [2010: 58–9], Laetz [2008: 356], and Meskin [2006: 111]) have taken Sibley to be endorsing some form of pessimism in his famous (1965: 137) claim that

To suppose indeed that one can make aesthetic judgments without aesthetic perception … is to misunderstand aesthetic judgment. (alongside similar remarks in, e.g., Sibley 1959: 424–6 and 1974: 16)

This interpretation is, however, controversial and it has been suggested (by, e.g., Livingston [2003: 268] and Lopes himself [2014: 174]) that Sibley is merely making a certain kind of stipulation and isn’t intending to endorse any kind of substantive pessimistic thesis. However, it seems difficult to regard Lopes’ proposals for a version of AP—regardless of what other merits they might have—as providing an accurate exegesis of Wollheim’s views. (Something similar also applies to Shelley’s (2023: 405) interpretation, but he clarifies that he isn’t particularly concerned with whether his interpretation of AP matches Wollheim’s own understanding and he does not suggest that others are making exegetical errors.) As Wallbank and Robson (2022: 42–4) point out, a number of Wollheim’s own remarks (1980: 231–2) make it clear that he is open to considering a number of different interpretations of AP, at least one of which is clearly epistemic in nature.

2.2 Further Principles

In addition to the Acquaintance Principle, there are two further (related) kinds of principles that those within the debate have most often appealed to. The first kind of principle, the Autonomy Principle, stresses the importance of forming one’s aesthetic judgements in an autonomous manner: “One ought to arrive at one”s aesthetic judgements through the application of one’s own faculties and abilities’ (Nguyen 2020a). This is taken (Nguyen 2020a) to derive from a related principle, “the Requirement”, introduced by Hopkins (2011) that: “Having the right to an aesthetic belief requires one to grasp the aesthetic grounds for it”. Nevertheless, the differences between the Autonomy Principle and the Requirement should not be overlooked. The thought behind the Autonomy Principle is that there is something valuable about autonomous aesthetic engagement such that our aesthetic lives are going well when we endeavour to examine the aesthetic value of an object for ourselves. The thought behind the Requirement is that there is something interesting about aesthetic belief formation which requires the possession of a certain kind of comprehension of the reasons why an aesthetic judgement has been made. The further assumption here is that such comprehension cannot be attained unless we have engaged with the object (or a relevant surrogate) for ourselves.

Whilst AP places demands that we gain direct access to the object of aesthetic judgement, the Requirement demands that we grasp the reasons why an aesthetic judgement has been made, and the Autonomy Principle demands that we at least attempt to grasp the reasons why an aesthetic judgement has been made, for ourselves. Of course, these principles are often related since, for example, we might think that firsthand acquaintance of a certain kind is required for grasping reasons in the relevant sense. Still, it is certainly possible to accept one principle while rejecting the others. Another common theme in terms of broader principles involves appeals to aesthetic understanding (Page 2022), claiming that there would be something problematic, or at least non-ideal, about forming aesthetic beliefs in the absence of understanding. For example, Hills (2022) argues that aesthetic understanding—where this is “factive and requires a grasp of the reasons for” (2022: 26) a judgement that a work has, or lacks, a certain kind of aesthetic value—is required for aesthetic virtue. Again, this can easily be linked with AP. Someone could, for example, maintain that direct acquaintance is required for forming aesthetic judgement since it is the only means for acquiring the requisite level of understanding (and it seems even more plausible that “grasping” aesthetic grounds in Hopkins’ sense is going to require understanding). It is, however, by no means guaranteed that a requirement for understanding would entail a requirement for acquaintance (or vice versa). One possible advantage of understanding-based principles is that they allow us—in a way which AP does not—to link pessimism in aesthetics with the parallel view in the moral case. While it is implausible to take acquaintance (at least as standardly interpreted) as a requirement for moral judgement, understanding has frequently been touted as just that (Hills 2009; McGrath 2011).

Behind this narrow agreement on the importance of understanding, though, there are some deep disagreements about why understanding is so important. And, of course, the pessimist needs more than merely the claim that aesthetic understanding is valuable (either in itself or as a means to attaining some other value quality or state). It is, after all, no part of the optimist’s position that everything valuable in aesthetics can be attained via testimony (we discuss the value of testimony further in §7). As Meskin (2004: 76) acknowledges, even the optimist will allow that “there are things that testimony may never provide—aesthetic experiences and artistic appreciation”. The pessimist must, therefore, also give some account linking the importance of understanding in aesthetics to their claims about the illegitimacy or reliance on testimony.

3. Different Concerns

One thing that has become increasingly clear in recent years (Andow 2019: 33) is that it is surprisingly difficult to specify precisely what claim the pessimist is making (and the optimist denying). We initially formulated pessimism as something like the claim that we cannot legitimately form aesthetic judgements on the basis of testimony. At least three elements of this claim need to be clarified though. First, what do we mean by “aesthetic judgement”? Second, why is it that we cannot form legitimate aesthetic judgements in this way? Third, how strictly should we interpret the “cannot” here? We will see below that it is surprisingly rare for a pessimist to maintain that we can never form a legitimate aesthetic judgement on the basis of testimony, what about the first two questions though?

In terms of the nature of aesthetic judgement, there is a clear general divide between two camps. The first takes aesthetic judgement to be belief, either in a narrow cognitivist sense (Hopkins 2006, 2011; Whiting 2015) or a broader sense which allows for certain expressivist or quasi-realist equivalents (Robson 2023: 16–8). The second takes the term “judgement” to capture something like a state of appreciation. Understood in terms of appreciation the debate is largely resolved as a matter of definition and no optimist would want to maintain that we can, say, achieve a state of appreciation—typically understood as something like experiencing the qualities of a thing’ in such a way as to find them “worthy or valuable” (Dickie 1974: 40)—on the basis of testimony alone (Konigsberg 2012 is an apparent exception but this is only because he understands “testimony” much more broadly than the kind of pure testimony we’re focusing on). It might easily seem that, as we have already seen Lopes (2014) suggest with regards to AP, the participants in this debate might merely be talking past each other, with optimists maintaining that we can legitimately form aesthetic beliefs on the basis of testimony and pessimists denying that we can legitimately appreciate aesthetic qualities on that basis. However, while we don’t deny that there might be some level of misunderstanding within these debates, we think that this irenic approach is mistaken for two reasons.

First, as highlighted by, e.g., Gorodeisky and Marcus (2018: 135–7) participants in this debate don’t typically take themselves to just be arbitrarily stipulating a usage of “aesthetic judgement” but, rather, to be picking out a certain kind of mental state which our aesthetic talk typically tracks. The substantive debate, then, will often concern whether we can legitimately form these states on the basis of testimony. Robson (2023: 16–8) maintains that these states are something like beliefs, Todd (2004) takes them to be appreciative states and Gorodeisky and Marcus (2018) opt for a hybrid view where these correlates are typical appreciative states but, in some non-standard cases, are beliefs (Briesen [forthcoming] defends a very different kind of hybrid view). Second, while it is clear why reliance on testimony would be ruled out on the second understanding of “aesthetic judgement”, it is far from a trivial matter to determine that testimony is a legitimate means for forming judgements in the first sense (Robson 2017 argues that optimism is entailed by treating aesthetic judgements as beliefs but this is controversial). On the contrary, some pessimists have explicitly endorsed the first interpretation.

Pessimists employing this understanding of “aesthetic judgement” have raised various objections against deference to aesthetic testimony, following (Hopkins 2011) these lines of resistance have typically been divided into two broad camps: “unavailability pessimism” and “unusability pessimism”. Unavailability pessimists hold that aesthetic testimony simply fails to meet the epistemic conditions that govern the formation of legitimate aesthetic judgements, such that aesthetic testimony fails to serve as a source of knowledge. Unusability pessimists, by contrast, hold that aesthetic testimony may well yield aesthetic knowledge but, nevertheless, there is a further non-epistemic norm which prevents us from using aesthetic testimony as a legitimate resource for forming such knowledge. Many theorists take there to be an intuitive asymmetry between the status of mundane testimony (that is, roughly, testimony about ordinary matters where those who are not inclined towards any general testimonial scepticism typically agree that testimony is unproblematic) and aesthetic testimony. Further, as we have seen, these theorists also typically take there to be a related intuitive asymmetry between the status of first-hand and second-hand sources of aesthetic judgement. Unusability pessimists take their further norm to explain these asymmetries. (For more on the viability of an appeal to such intuitions see §5.2.)

3.1 Unavailability Pessimism

There are two primary ways in which one might approach unavailability pessimism. One might hold that

we cannot attain knowledge, or even improve our epistemic standing, through deference to aesthetic testimony because epistemic terms such as truth and knowledge simply do not apply to this domain, we should be aesthetic anti-realists (Mackie 1977).

Or that

whilst we should be aesthetic realists, and whilst epistemic terms apply to the aesthetic domain, we cannot attain knowledge through deference to aesthetic testimony, and this is simply entailed by the nature of legitimate aesthetic judgement.

3.1.1 Anti-Realist Approaches

There are three notable ways in which one might launch an Anti-Realist form of Unavailability Pessimism in line with (a) (see Meskin 2006; Hopkins 2011). One might adopt an aesthetic error theory and hold that all aesthetic claims are systematically false. One might adopt aesthetic relativism and accept that there is aesthetic truth, but the truth would here be relative to some set of people. Alternatively one might adopt aesthetic expressivism and hold that aesthetic claims express some non-cognitive state (typically captured as pro- or con-attitudes) to the object in question..

The appeal of approaches aesthetic error theory to those who doubt the value of aesthetic testimony is clear, we can expect aesthetic testimony to have no epistemic value if aesthetic claims are incapable of being true. However, this position would equally entail that there can’t be true aesthetic claims on the basis of firsthand experience. As such, while it would meet the letter of how pessimism is often articulated, it would fail to capture a key asymmetry, between firsthand and second-hand aesthetic judgements, which most pessimists clearly take themselves to be committed to (see Meskin 2006).

An appeal to aesthetic relativism initially seems better able to capture the asymmetry since the obvious concerns with accepting testimony—about whether we, say, share a similar standard of judgement to the testifier—don’t apply in the case of firsthand judgement. Further, (as shall be explored in §5.1) it is possible that a generally held lay-person assumption of relativism may account for why aesthetic testimony is often intuitively assumed to be of little epistemic value. However, when it comes to more sophisticated forms of relativism, the situation becomes rather more complex (see §4.1.1).

Development of a sophisticated form of pessimistic appeal to expressivism and the optimistic response, will be discussed in §4.1.1. For now, let us observe that a very basic expressivist view has the power to accommodate certain pessimistic intuitions—upon this view no propositions have been expressed and as such there can be no propositional knowledge gained by such an expression. However, such a basic version of expressivism is, as we’ll discuss in §4.1.1, often unappealing to the pessimist and the link between more sophisticated versions of expressivism and pessimism is far less clear.

3.1.2 Realist Approaches

If the pessimist wants to accept that there is aesthetic truth, and that testimony can generally be a valuable epistemic resource then one approach available to them is to defend the idea that there is something particular about aesthetic judgement such that it is formed in accordance with non-standard epistemic norms. Two plausible candidates for such a non-standard epistemic norm are the Acquaintance Principle and the Requirement (seen in §2.2). Although the plausibility of their candidacy rests on precisely how these principles are to be understood. They might, for example, reflect an epistemic norm which governs the formation of knowledge, or they might simply reflect a norm of use—such that we can form knowledge in this manner but we should not (Hopkins 2011 places them both in the latter category). Alternatively, Lopes (2014) and Shelley (2023) suggest they are a norm of an entirely different kind (we saw in §2.1 that Wollheim himself took AP to be at least compatible with an epistemic reading but our concern here is no longer with Wollheim exegesis but with which version of the principle, if any, is correct).

One way to develop the Requirement as a concern from unavailability pessimism is to say that the formation of aesthetic judgement requires a sufficient kind of understanding of that which we are invited to accept on the basis of testimony. In order to accept testimony that “x is p” where p represents some aesthetic property or quality requires one to grasp both “x” and “p”, and more specifically, “p as particularly instantiated in x”, and that this can only be attained through first-hand acquaintance (see Tanner 2003; Todd 2004). One way to develop this approach is to draw upon the idea that aesthetic qualities are dependent upon non-aesthetic qualities, and that there is no sufficient law-like connection between any set of non-aesthetic qualities and the aesthetic qualities (following Sibley 1959, 1965). On this line, each instance of an aesthetic property, beauty say, is manifested or instantiated in a unique manner. Drawing from this one might hold that we cannot truly comprehend the claim “x is beautiful” without having direct, first-hand acquaintance with x, and in turn one might insist that one cannot legitimately form an aesthetic judgement or attain aesthetic knowledge without this kind of comprehension.

3.1.3 “Moderately Optimistic” Approaches.

There is one final approach that might plausibly qualify as a form of unavailability pessimism, as defined above. The interesting feature of this approach, nevertheless, is that defenders typically label their arguments in terms of “optimism”.

The distinction between optimism and pessimism was defined roughly in Section 1 as reflecting a divide between those who think we can legitimately form aesthetic judgements on the basis of testimony, and those who think we cannot, respectively (a distinction used in Hopkins 2011; Whiting 2015; and Ransom 2019 amongst others). As we have seen (§3.1.1), this position has often been connected with a seemingly pessimistic claim that aesthetic testimony has an asymmetrical epistemic status to that of mundane testimony. However, it is important that we add some nuance here. There are some self-identifying pessimists who explicitly admit that there are rare cases where we may (legitimately) acquire aesthetic knowledge on the basis of testimony (Hopkins 2011:154; Wollheim 1980: 233). Moreover, there are certain self-identifying optimists who will happily endorse the idea that aesthetic testimony has an asymmetrical epistemic status to mundane testimony (and to firsthand aesthetic experience).

Hopkins (2007: 613; 2011: 139–32) has suggested that we mark the division between pessimism and optimism as follows: pessimists hold that there is a principle or norm which is active in the aesthetic case, but which is not active in the mundane case which thwarts the possibility for aesthetic testimony to serve as a source of legitimate aesthetic judgement while optimists deny this (see Robson 2023: 24–6 for discussion as to why this nuance may not be that helpful.) If we were to accept Hopkin’s suggestion, an approach which denies that there are any distinct/non-standard epistemic (or non-epistemic) norms which govern the formation of aesthetic knowledge, but which holds, nevertheless, that aesthetic testimony has an asymmetrical epistemic status to that of mundane testimony is relevantly optimistic. This is an approach which could insist that aesthetic testimony fails (or at least typically fails) to meet the standard conditions to serve as a legitimate source of aesthetic knowledge.

There are two main positions which take this kind of approach, both argue that the asymmetry between aesthetic and mundane testimony can be accounted for by acknowledging the circumstances surrounding aesthetic practice. The first holds that:

in assessing the evidence we find that aesthetic testifiers tend to be unreliable.

The second holds that:

as receivers of testimony we struggle to assess first-order evidence available, we experience difficulty in determining the reliability of such evidence, and this in turn may provide us with sufficient reason to doubt that we can justifiably believe the testimony.

The first kind of claim has been made by Aaron Meskin (2004, 2006). He argues that aesthetic testifiers are more likely than non-aesthetic testifiers to be both insincere (for reasons of snobbery) and incompetent (for reasons of education)—and thus aesthetic testimony is on the whole unreliable (Meskin 2004, 2006). He argues that aesthetic testimony could, in principle, have the same epistemic standing as the testimony of other domains but he insists that aesthetic testimony on the whole tends to be inferior to the testimony of other domains due to the fact that testifiers are typically unreliable.

The second kind of claim (Wallbank 2021) holds that the real problem with aesthetic testimony, is not that aesthetic testifiers are typically unreliable, but rather that we don’t know how reliable they are, we don’t have sufficient resources to test this. Standard monitoring techniques aren’t available to us in aesthetics (Nguyen 2020b; see also §1.2 on aesthetic principles of taste). That is not to say that there is no evidence at all available, if testifier T makes an aesthetic judgement that “x is beautiful”, and the receiver of testimony R also experiences x as beautiful, then, R will have some direct evidence to support the idea that T has expertise (Sibley 1965). Yet whilst this evidence is available, it does not seem to provide sufficient support for our belief in the competence of the testifier, it only provides sufficient support for the idea that the purported expert has a similar standard of aesthetic taste to oneself, and it is not clear why we should think our faculties of aesthetic taste are accurate. (Irvin 2007 discusses a similar challenge, and possible methods for addressing it, in a different context).

3.2 Unusability Pessimism

Unusability pessimists will accept that, under the right conditions, knowledge can be attained via aesthetic testimony. Indeed, they could go so far as to accept that there is no significant epistemic difference between aesthetic and mundane testimony (though they are by no means committed to doing so). However, they will nevertheless argue that deference to aesthetic testimony violates a non-epistemic norm which prevents the use of such knowledge. These theorists can accept that one can form aesthetic beliefs, and indeed aesthetic knowledge, through deference to aesthetic testimony, they argue instead that (there are at least pro tanto reasons why) one ought not to. Others take a more moderate view and argue that, while acquiring knowledge in this way is perfectly permissible, doing so would deprive of us some important value or goal.

3.2.1 Norms of Use

One of the most influential attempts to give a non-epistemic (but still cognitive) version of pessimism is Hopkins’ (2011) appeal to what he terms “norms of use”. Roughly speaking, these are norms which determine whether it’s permissible to form a belief on a particular subject but which don’t concern whether the belief in question would count as knowledge. In Hopkins’ view, testimony can often make aesthetic knowledge available to us but some further norm (or norms) of belief still makes it impermissible to form a belief on this basis. Hopkins doesn’t take any clear position on what norm this might be but considers some possibilities including a non-epistemic version of AP (Hopkins 2011: 150) and the other possibilities for the unusability pessimist we look at below could also be taken as ways to fill in this gap (though, as we will see, some of these make rather weaker claims than Hopkins’ contention that the beliefs in question would be impermissible).

3.2.2 Autonomy

An approach developed by Nguyen (2020a) rests on the Autonomy Principle mentioned in §2.2. It broadly emphasises the importance of asserting aesthetic agency. Key to Nguyen’s argument for this claim is the assumption that what we primarily value about our aesthetic practice is forming judgements as opposed to “getting our judgements right” (Nguyen 2020a: 1129). On this account, the activity of forming judgements is the point and purpose of our aesthetic engagement, not epistemic gain; and whilst deference to aesthetic testimony can enable us to improve our epistemic standing, it can thwart our aesthetic engagement. One thing that emerges as important for this account is the prolongation of appreciative aesthetic activity. Such prolongation is purportedly promoted by the autonomous control of our attention, whilst deference is seen to undermine it serving as an endpoint for our appreciative aesthetic activities. Nguyen describes deference in this context as comparable to a marathon runner taking a taxi to the finish line. (Nguyen 2020a: 1147; see Friend 2023 for a critical yet sympathetic discussion).

3.2.3 Authenticity and Aesthetic Personality

Another approach focuses on issues relating to authenticity and the preservation of one’s aesthetic personality. This kind of position can be seen in Levinson (2002; 2010), Riggle (2015) and Bräuer (2023). Both Levinson (2002) and Riggle (2015) hold that deferring to aesthetic testimony thwarts the preservation of one’s aesthetic personality. The worry is that whilst we might be tempted to accept certain kinds of testimony—particularly from someone like a critic—if we were to do so we risk undermining our own aesthetic sensibilities—and discarding aesthetic judgements which we hold most dear. And they fear that discarding such dearly held aesthetic judgements is tantamount to discarding aspects of one’s personality. The thought is that our aesthetic choices and preferences help define us and enable us to orient our place in the world. To simply defer thwarts our opportunities to have the kinds of meaningful attachments to artworks which reflect our aesthetic personalities. Similarly, Bräuer (2023) argues that we experience deference to aesthetic testimony as problematic because (for better or for worse) we are attached to an ideal of aesthetic authenticity. He argues that this ideal reflects the sense in which we are called upon to live our lives in a manner that is true to ourselves, and not an imitation of anyone else.

3.2.4 Aesthetic Development: A Moderate Approach

Some theorists have argued that deference undermines one’s opportunities for aesthetic development; this is broadly reflected in the work of Ransom (2019) and Lord (2018). This is roughly the concern that deference to aesthetic testimony undermines the development of our aesthetic faculties, sensibilities and skilful aesthetic engagement since it takes away a prime opportunity for us to truly understand and appreciate the aesthetic qualities in question. Insofar as our opportunities to develop our aesthetic taste have been undermined, aesthetic testimony can be seen to thwart our potential to access further aesthetic truths. Deference is portrayed here as comparable to offering a calculator to a child to help solve their maths equation rather than letting them figure it out for themselves. Something which would hinder them from developing the skill set required for solving mathematical puzzles and prevent them from attaining the requisite understanding to reliably apply what they know. Interestingly both Lord and Ransom acknowledge that deference to aesthetic testimony can be valuable at times and, in particular, that it can be valuable for total novices in the field who might need some help getting started. Indeed, given this acknowledgement Lord (2018) even takes his account to be fairly optimistic in nature whilst insisting that there is something non-ideal about deference to aesthetic testimony nevertheless.

4. Optimistic Responses

Having introduced pessimistic concerns in the previous section, this section will provide an optimistic response to each.

4.1 Optimistic Responses to Unavailability Pessimism

4.1.1 Anti-Realist Approaches: An Optimistic Response

Whilst aesthetic error theory and aesthetic relativism can accommodate the pessimistic intuition that aesthetic testimony fails to serve as a means of forming legitimate aesthetic judgement, aesthetic error theory and relativism (or at least relativism of the crude kind which would straightforwardly rule out appeals to aesthetic testimony)—are commonly rejected by those within the aesthetic testimony debate. It is typically accepted that there are aesthetic truths and that these (or at least some significant subset of them) don’t vary in their truth value between speakers. Indeed, it is given these basic assumptions, that theorists typically set for themselves the challenge of accounting for how aesthetic testimony nevertheless seems to have (i) an asymmetrical epistemic status to the testimony of mundane domains and (ii) an asymmetrical epistemic status to first-hand acquaintance with the object (Meskin 2006: 112–113; Hopkins 2011: 141). Meskin (2006: 113) has also highlighted that the relativist’s approach faces additional difficulties in accounting for why aesthetic testimony may well have an asymmetrical status—in both of the senses mentioned above—in the context of like-minded valuers.

Interestingly the basic expressivist approach also appears to fall upon similar hurdles to that facing error theory and relativism (see Meskin 2006). The pessimist is (see the nuance of §3.1.3) often keen to observe an asymmetry between the epistemic status of someone who has developed an aesthetic judgement on the basis of aesthetic testimony and the status of someone who has first-hand acquaintance with the object (Hopkins 2011). Nevertheless, if this crude expressivist is right, there is no asymmetry here, neither testimony nor acquaintance can be used as a source of knowledge (Meskin 2007: 115). When it comes to more sophisticated forms of relativism and expressivism, there have certainly been attempts to link both of these to pessimism (see McGonigal 2006 and Andow 2015 for the former and Scruton 1974; Todd 2004; Franzén 2018; and, arguably, Gorodeisky & Marcus 2018 for the latter).

Starting with expressivism, the expressivist can often (using the machinery developed by, e.g., Blackburn 1993) happily appeal to the key notions of truth, knowledge etc. that their realist counterparts can use. As such, there’s no concern that the pessimist would have to reject aesthetic knowledge in general alongside aesthetic knowledge from testimony. However, the concern for such views (discussed in, e.g., Meskin 2004: 71 and Robson & Sinclair 2023) is that, once such realist notions are in place, it’s no longer clear that expressivism entails pessimism. We aren’t aware of any optimistic versions of expressivism in the aesthetic case but it’s worth noting that one of the most prominent versions of expressivism in ethics (Gibbard 1992: 174–88) allows that:

When conditions are right and someone else finds a norm independently credible, I must take that as favoring my own accepting the norm, (Gibbard 1992: 180)

which (given Gibbard’s view of moral judgements as favouring a norm) commits him to an at least somewhat optimistic view. Further Gibbard (1992: 52) seems inclined to paint a similar picture in the aesthetic case. The challenge for the pessimist, then, is to formulate a version of expressivism which follows the realist far enough to give a plausible account of aesthetic truth, argumentation etc. but doesn’t go so far as to also rule in appeals to aesthetic testimony. Of course, even if their favoured version of expressivism doesn’t entail pessimism, then the expressivist might still wish to be a pessimist but they would need some independent reason (of the kind we discuss in §5) for doing so.

What about relativism? A very similar challenge awaits here. The kind of crude relativism which easily leads to pessimism is, understandably, unpopular with aestheticians. Rather, any plausible form of relativism will have to account for (amongst much else) the widespread level of aesthetic agreement, the importance of aesthetic expertise and our practice of offering reasons for and against aesthetic judgements (for discussion of some contemporary forms of relativism see, e.g., Young 2009 and Goldman 1995; for some historical context see Korsmeyer 1975). Once we have developed relativism this far, though, it isn’t always an easy matter to see why the relativist should be a pessimist. For example, as Meskin (2006: 113) highlights, the sophisticated relativist faces the difficulty of accounting for why aesthetic testimony may well have an asymmetrical status—in both of the senses mentioned above—in the context of like-minded valuers. And even more pessimistic relativists do tend to be rather attenuated in their pessimism; for example, Andow (2015: 217) seems happy to allow that the relativist views he discuss can sometimes enable us to legitimately arrive at aesthetic knowledge via testimony.

4.1.2 Realist Approaches: An Optimistic Response

Let’s begin by considering the idea that aesthetic judgement is governed by a distinctive kind of epistemic norm which requires a certain kind of comprehension of the judgement in question—a kind which can only be attained through acquaintance. Budd (2003: 378–8) takes Tanner (2003: 33) to be suggesting a pessimistic argument of this kind but, as Budd (2003: 387–8) points out, it isn’t clear why understanding the claim that “x is beautiful” would require the experience of the determinate beauty which x possesses rather than just having a reasonable general grasp of the determinable property of beauty (just as understanding “x is green” might require our having some experience of greenness but doesn’t require our having experienced x’s particular determinate share of greenness). In order to ascribe a quality to something, we typically need basic familiarity with the concept being ascribed to the object of appreciation. We do not need familiarity or an understanding about how the specific quality is realised in the object of appreciation in order to form the belief that the quality is present (Budd 2003: 388). Lord (2018) argues for the importance of being acquainted with a particular determinate aesthetic property but he doesn’t take this to place any limit (let alone an epistemic limit) on the permissibility of our aesthetic judgements. The burden of proof remains on the pessimist to explain why we would need a distinctive kind of comprehension for aesthetic belief formation, and to explain why the standards for knowledge in the aesthetic case are different from those in mundane cases.

4.1.3 “Moderately Optimistic Approaches”: A (More) Optimistic Response

The primary difficulty facing accounts which insist on (i)—the unreliability of aesthetic testifiers—is the difficulty we face in verifying this claim (see §3.1.3). The primary difficulty facing accounts which insist on (ii)—the absence of viable information to identify the reliability of aesthetic testifiers—is the difficulty we face in maintaining the possibility of aesthetic knowledge through other means. As noted by Hopkins (2011: 141) it is difficult for the latter kind of accounts to proceed without mandating agnosticism. Upon this account there seems to be no real epistemic asymmetry between aesthetic testimony and one’s first-hand perception (particularly since recent discussion (see, e.g., Irvin 2014 and Lopes 2014) has provided a number of challenges to our reliability at judging our own aesthetic competence).

4.2 Optimistic Responses to Unusability Pessimism

4.2.1 Norms of Use: An Optimistic Response

The most common optimistic responses to norms of use are based around the objection which Hopkins himself considers near the start of this discussion (2011: 145). That is, the challenge of defending the view according to which there can be beliefs governed by non-epistemic norms. It is quite common (Simion et al. 2016) for epistemic norms (or aims or functions but these, otherwise significant, differences are of little import here) to be taken to constitutively govern beliefs, such that something even partially governed by non-epistemic norms just couldn’t be a belief. Indeed, it is parallel considerations which lead Hills (2015) to consider positing a new kind of mental state (uliefs) when it comes to moral judgements, which she takes to be constitutively governed by understanding (rather than knowledge). Hopkins’ own defence here focuses (2011: 146–8) on arguing that there are familiar examples where we are used to employing non-epistemic norms of belief formation. However, there have been a number of challenges (McKinnon 2017) to the claim that these examples really involve any non-epistemic norms.

Of course, the view that aesthetic judgements are beliefs doesn’t seem as core to the unusability position as their insistence on non-epistemic norms. Given this, it is open to them to defend their position by identifying aesthetic judgements with some novel cognitive state (such as Hills’ uliefs) or to embrace some kind of sophisticated non-cognitivism about aesthetic judgements. Finally, even if we did accept that there could be such non-epistemic norms (whether of belief or otherwise), there still remains the further challenge of explaining which norms are active and why. Much recent work in the aesthetic testimony debate could be seen as an attempt to answer these challenges.

4.2.2 Autonomy: An Optimistic Response

One difficulty with the concern from autonomy is that the argument is more complex than it might first seem. It might, at first seem that autonomy is of primary value for our aesthetic engagements and deference undermines this. Nevertheless, at various points in Nguyen’s (2020a) argument it appears that prolonged aesthetic engagement (appreciative activity) is of primary value in our aesthetic lives, autonomy is regarded the best way in which we can achieve it (and deference is seen to undermine it). In which case it seems that autonomy emerges as only instrumentally valuable, a means towards attaining prolonged aesthetic activity. When engaging with this argument we need to clarify precisely how valuable autonomous activity is, how valuable prolonged aesthetic activity is; we also need to clarify what kind of value are talking about. Moreover, if prolongation of aesthetic activity is of primary importance, it is also worth highlighting that deferential engagements do not necessarily undermine prolonged activity (see §4.2.4). Deference permits us the same opportunities for aesthetic engagement as non-deference, the only difference is that we haven’t suspended judgement on the matter first.

4.2.3 Authenticity and Aesthetic Personality: An Optimistic Response

When facing the pessimistic concern that deference to aesthetic testimony damages the meaningful aesthetic attachments that one forms to objects in a manner which undermines our aesthetic personalities, one thing we naturally need clarification on is the nature of an aesthetic personality. Aesthetic personality roughly seems to reflect one’s aesthetic tastes, sensibilities, and more broadly one’s disposition to form certain kinds of aesthetic judgements. But in that case, note that one’s aesthetic personalities change, mature and develop all the time. It would be odd to insist that we ought to resist any aesthetic transformation or development, we certainly would not want to retain the same aesthetic attachments that we have had since childhood. Defenders of this kind of account need to clarify why discarding aesthetic judgements on the basis of aesthetic testimony is problematic—as we seem to discard judgements that we once held dear all the time.

Bräuer’s (2023) approach is a little different. Bräuer argues that aesthetic testimony possesses its asymmetrical epistemic status not because it forces us to abandon certain aesthetic attachments, but because it forces us to make aesthetic judgements which fail to reflect who we are—and for better or for worse—we are attached to an ideal of authenticity. However, clarification as to how exactly our authenticity is undermined here would be helpful.

4.2.4 Aesthetic Development: A (More) Optimistic Response

Turning to the concern that deference to aesthetic testimony thwarts our aesthetic development. It is important to once again observe (following §4.2.2) that attaining some information won’t necessarily deter one from pursuing the matter, for oneself at a later date. In fact, within the aesthetic domain, hearing testimony on a certain matter might be just the thing to motivate someone lacking all confidence in their own aesthetic judgement to engage with the matter for themselves. Wallbank and Reisner (2020) bring this out in a paper which argues that deference can be an epistemic facilitator, accepting the belief in question can be a launchpad for further investigation and engagement. Even if deference to testimony entails accepting falsehoods, it might—in the long-run—prove to be epistemically beneficial in virtue of serving as a launchpad for further engagement hereby giving us the potential to access to further truths. As Ransom (2019) and Lord (2018) themselves acknowledge, deference to aesthetic testimony emerges here as particularly beneficial for individuals who are particularly aesthetically naive and in need of encouragement.

5. Arguments for Pessimism

In the earliest writing on aesthetic testimony, there was a notable paucity of arguments for pessimism. Kant’s mention of testimony quickly moves on to discussion of the illegitimacy of inferring aesthetic judgements from general principles, and he seems to focus the positive arguments he offers entirely on the latter. Similarly, Wollheim (1980: 233) seems to take AP, and by extension pessimism, to be (something close to) a truism which needs to be accommodated by any view of the aesthetic, rather than a controversial thesis in need of defence (similar things occur in, e.g., Tormey 1973: 39 and Pettit 1983: 25). Given the range of recent defences of optimism, though, the need for pessimists to argue for their view has become rather more salient of late.

5.1 Reluctance to form aesthetic judgements

One (often tacit) argument in support of pessimism is our tendency to avoid forming—or at least being reluctant to form—aesthetic judgements on the basis of testimony. If, as Kant (1790: Part I, Div. 1, §33 [1914: 157]), and Nguyen (2020a: 1128) suggest, we are less willing to form aesthetic judgements on the basis of testimony (when compared to forming mundane judgements on that basis or aesthetic judgements on the basis of first-hand experience), then this stands in need of explanation. And, we might suggest, a tacit folk acceptance of pessimism is the best explanation (for discussion of empirical work on “folk” views of aesthetic testimony see, e.g., Andow 2019 and Cova, Garcia, & Liao 2015: 931–2). There are a number of possible responses here. First, Meskin (2004: 81) suggests that we might equally well explain these facts not by appeal to pessimism but to a mistaken folk belief which is taken to entail pessimism. There are certain apparent folk beliefs—such as Meskin’s example of the endorsement of certain crude forms of aesthetic relativism—which would seem to legitimise pessimism but which are almost universally rejected by philosophically minded aestheticians. A different approach is suggested by Robson (2014: 2517–24) who questions whether the required explanandum is even genuine, suggesting that we are typically poor judges of the sources of our own (aesthetic) judgements and that there is empirical evidence to suggest that we form aesthetic beliefs on the basis of testimony rather more than we’re inclined to think.

5.2 Appeals to Cases

Probably the most common kind of argument for pessimism involves the appeal to our intuitions concerning cases. For example, Hills (2022: 22) ask us to

Suppose the editor of Sight and Sound gives Evelyn a piece of “pure” aesthetic testimony, e.g., that Citizen Kane is a great film—one of the greatest films of all time. It would be odd for her simply to take his word, to form a confident opinion that it is excellent.

(for similar cases see, e.g., Whiting 2015: 91; Hopkins 2011: 138; and Hazlett 2017: 49). The general idea here being that our intuition that someone does, or would do, something wrong by forming an aesthetic judgement in these cases is best explained by the truth of pessimism. Three kinds of response to such cases are worth considering.

First, there is the hardnosed approach of simply denying that there is anything problematic about the judgements in question. However, it is rare to see a view of this kind actually defended. This is, perhaps, surprising given that there has recently been considerable scepticism expressed elsewhere about the general practice of philosophers appealing to intuitions concerning particular cases (Weinberg 2007). Further, there is empirical evidence (Andow 2019) to suggest that the folk are rather more sceptical about both testimony in general, and aesthetic judgement in general, than most philosophers are inclined to think appropriate.

A second, and far more common, kind of response is to argue that these intuitions can be accommodated within an optimistic framework. Remember that the optimist is not, qua optimist, committed to taking every case of reliance on aesthetic testimony as legitimate. We might, for example, wonder whether, in the case mentioned above, we have quite mundane grounds for thinking that the editor of Sight and Sound is unreliable (or unreliable on topics of this kind or…). More general responses have also been proposed. For example, Robson (2015a) argues that our intuitions about these cases can be accommodated by an optimist who is willing to endorse a certain form of epistemic contextualism. An optimist of this ilk can maintain, roughly, that we don’t count as knowing in these cases but only because of the very same contextual factors which would also produce this result in non-aesthetic cases. Of course, the challenge then becomes explaining why these factors seem to be operative more often in the aesthetic case than elsewhere. A different response of this kind allows that there our intuition in these cases do show some genuine weakness of aesthetic testimony but that this isn’t enough to lead to a full-on endorsement of pessimism. As we saw in §4.2.4, there are a variety of positions (such as Meskin’s 2004 & 2006 unreliability view) which admit that significant challenges arise for forming judgements based on aesthetic testimony but which are still routinely classified as optimistic. Classification aside, one concern here is that intuitions about such cases tend to stay fairly stable even when we are explicitly assured about the testifier’s bona fides (as we are in the cases presented by, e.g., Hazlett 2017: 49).

Finally, it has been argued, as we will see in the next section, that these arguments have tended to rely on a very narrow range of cases (Nguyen 2017) and that a full assessment of the evidence will require widening our diet of cases considerably. And, as we will see, some have argued that such an approach undermines the pessimist’s arguments or even provides a positive reason for endorsing optimism.

5.3 Arguments from Assertion

Another prominent argument for pessimism concerns the (apparent) impermissibility of certain assertions. It seems unremarkable to claim that, e.g., “Lisbon is the capital of Portugal”, “the Korean war started in 1950” or “the bus stop is on Main Street” entirely on the basis of testimony. By contrast, if someone where to assert “Guernica is harrowing” without having experienced the object for themselves, something would seem amiss. As with the kinds of cases discussed above, the thought is typically that these intuitions are best accounted for by appeal to some form of pessimism (Andow 2015: 211–2; Mothersill 1994: 160; and Gorodeisky 2010: 53). Indeed, a link to AP seems an obvious move here, suggesting that such assertions are problematic in the absence of experience for the simple reason that the beliefs in question would also be problematic.

As with the cases above, it is open to the optimist to maintain that the assertions in question are unproblematic and that intuitions to the contrary are simply based on misleading folk theories or similar. However, optimists typically concede that aesthetic assertions—or at least aesthetic assertions of a particular kind—are illegitimate on the basis of testimony but try to offer some explanation of this which doesn’t impugn the corresponding judgements. And a number of optimist-friendly explanations have been suggested. Lackey (2011) takes this to be the result of a more general phenomenon which prevents our making “isolated second-hand assertions” in certain cases even though there is no concern with the status of the corresponding belief, Franzén (2018: 681) suggests that aesthetic assertions are “expressive affective states of mind” and Robson (2015b) that assertions of the relevant kind carry a misleading implicature regarding the source of the speaker’s judgements.

Each kind or proposal raises its own concerns though. Lackey proposes a norm of assertion which requires significant revisions of some prominent theories and the non-aesthetic examples she uses to motivate it are far from uncontroversial (see McKinnon 2017). Franzén suggests a semantics which looks to closely match some contemporary expressivist claims but which, as he himself (2018: 680) points out, it is one which doesn’t sit well with other aspects of contemporary expressivist views. Robson proposes that the infelicity results from some kind of implicature but (as discussed in Franzén 2018: 670–1 and Ninan 2014: 297) these cases don’t appear to reflect any standard model of implicature or similar phenomena. For example, “it is a characteristic—some would say defining—feature of conversational implicatures that they are cancelable” (2014: 297) but this doesn’t seem to apply here. If I say “Jill has four cars (but I don”t mean to suggest that she has only four)’ I cancel the standard conversational implicature that Jill has exactly four cars. However, explicitly adding “but I haven”t seen it’ to a claim about the beauty of a painting seems to merely highlight, rather than remove, the infelicity.

6. Arguments for Optimism

We have seen above that pessimism has sometimes been assumed, rather than argued for, in the literature on aesthetic testimony but it has also been suggested that the reverse should be the case. That is, that we should assume optimism (of quite an extreme flavour) unless we have good arguments to the contrary. After all, both the optimist and the pessimist tend to accept that most kinds of judgement we make are governed by norms which permit our forming judgements via testimony. It has been suggested that the requirements for the legitimacy of testimony in a particular domain are rather limited. Indeed, Fricker (2006: 225) goes so far as to suggest that we

are essentially social creatures, and it is not clear that we do or could possess any knowledge at all which is not in some way, perhaps obliquely, dependent on testimony.

Robson’s (2017) case for favouring optimism goes even further, arguing that, at least if we take aesthetic judgements to be anything like beliefs as traditionally understood, then optimism is pretty much entailed by the nature of aesthetic judgement (Todd 2004 seems to share this view but takes it as a reason to reject the claim that aesthetic judgements are belief-like). Beyond such concerns about “default status”, though, there are also some positive arguments which have been offered in favour of optimism.

6.1 The Range of Aesthetic Judgements

One common line of argument concerns certain kinds of aesthetic judgement where pessimist intuitions seem (at the very least) to be significantly less common. These include judgements of natural beauty (Meskin 2004: 88–9), of the aesthetic status of lost works and performances (Laetz 2008: 355), of mathematical proofs (Meskin 2004: 89–90), and judgements of aesthetic matters which seem to be common knowledge (Levinson 2005: 213). In all of these cases, it has been suggested that our intuitions favour optimism or, at the very least, favour pessimism considerably less than the standard kind of case (often featuring extant but non-canonical works of art).

A first kind of pessimist response denies that (some of) these cases are genuine exceptions. That is because the judgement in question either fail to be legitimate or fail to be aesthetic (or both). The claim that these aren’t genuinely aesthetic judgements seems rather more plausible in some cases than others. There is, for example, already independent debate about whether apparent ascriptions of beauty to mathematical proofs are genuinely aesthetic or, for example, merely metaphorical ways of expressing certain non-aesthetic claims concerning simplicity and the like (for a sceptical discussion of this possibility see Inglis & Aberdein 2015). Even with cases such as lost works, though (which might seem paradigmatically aesthetic), there are still things which could be said. First, it is open to pessimists to maintain that these claims, while aesthetic, aren’t genuinely aesthetic judgements. For example, as we saw in §2 the kind of hybrid view which (Gorodeisky & Marcus 2018) propose, aesthetic judgements are appreciation-like states, rather than belief-like states but our aesthetic assertions still sometimes express beliefs (which they allow can be legitimately formed on the basis of testimony). The challenge for such an approach would be to give a non-ad hoc explanation of why the assertions in these particular domains are exceptional in this way. A second approach is to maintain that the claims involved here are actually elliptical for some non-aesthetic claim. As Blackburn (1998: 60) points out, there are contexts in which it seems that someone’s apparent report of their aesthetic judgement will really be a self-effacing report of what they take, e.g., the general consensus on this matter to be. If this was what was happening in these cases, then this would be no problem for the pessimist as they are not committed to denying that we can legitimately learn that others hold certain aesthetic views on the basis of testimony. Further, in some cases at least, it might seem desirable to adopt paraphrases of these kinds. If someone were to maintain that “Cleopatra was the most beautiful woman in the ancient world”, then it would be very natural, and certainly more charitable, to interpret this as something like a report of her reputation, rather than as a serious attempt to make a comparative aesthetic judgement in relation to millions of other, largely entirely unknown, individuals (other cases, such as those involving natural beauty, are harder to motivate though).

A second general kind of response stresses that our intuitions about such cases are, of course, compatible with an attenuated version of pessimism. Hopkins (2011: 153–4), for example, mentions that the pessimistic norms he proposes don’t hold come what may but, rather, “lapse” under certain circumstances. And other pessimists might, to similar effect, say that the norms they propose are operative, but not violated in these cases, since they merely make it harder, rather than impossible, to form legitimate aesthetic judgements on the basis of testimony. Still, the optimist might reasonably ask for an explanation as to why the pessimist’s norms lapse with respect to, or otherwise fail to capture, these particular cases.

6.2 Aesthetic Practice

There also seem to be cases where what we might term our aesthetic practice speaks in favour of optimism. The most common examples here involve our tendency to defer—when it comes to which artworks we engage with—to the recommendations of friends and critics (see Gorodeisky 2010: 60 and Hopkins 2011: 153). Most of us would, for example, be more likely to watch a particular film if it was praised by a friend or lauded by a trusted critic. The benefit of such cases for the optimist shouldn’t be overstated though. One reason for caution is that these recommendations often involve more than pure aesthetic testimony. Professional critics are typically employed not merely to give an overall verdict on a work but to give reasons in support of this and, more generally, to present descriptive information about the work (though the importance of overall “Rotten Tomatoes” scores and similar is also worth considering here). Similarly, friends who provide recommendations will often give reasons for doing so and even comparisons to other works they know you’re already familiar with. Further, we might think that such recommendations can legitimise our behaviour without providing us with a particularly high degree of warrant. If we are deciding which of two unfamiliar novels to read, then it seems reasonable—in the absence of any other “tie breakers”—to act on the basis of a friend’s testimony, even if we think that this testimony provides very little in the way of warrant. However, as Gorodeisky (2010: 60) points out, we can sometimes undergo significant outlays—in terms of time, money and so forth—to engage with art works which have been praised by friends or critics. Behaviour of this kind seems hard to account for unless we are at least close to knowing that the work in question has aesthetic merit (Gorodeisky uses this as part of an argument for unusability pessimism but it could easily be adapted into the service of optimism).

While deferral to such recommendations is the most commonly cited practice, it isn’t the only one which has been discussed in the literature. For example, Nguyen (2017: 22–5) highlights the various roles which testimony plays within aesthetic education and Laetz (2008: 361–2) points to our tendency to enlist the testimony of others in reaching a judgement concerning a piece about which our own initial feelings are ambivalent. What should the pessimist say about such practices? It is open to the pessimist to deny that these practices really are legitimate but—so far as we are aware—this approach hasn’t been explored. The typical response is, rather, to aim to accommodate these practices within a pessimistic framework. One way of doing so—paralleling the approach commonly taken with apparently legitimate aesthetic judgements formed on the basis of testimony—is to simply allow that these cases highlight exceptions to the relevant pessimistic norms or cases where such norms lapse (Hopkins 2011: 153–4). Another approach would involve arguing that some aspect(s) of our aesthetic practice which seems best explained by pessimism (see Whiting 2015; Nguyen 2017: 25). If this were the case, then it would, again, become a question of balancing these competing considerations and determining which account (whether optimistic or pessimistic) is best able to accommodate them.

7. The Value of Testimony

One final point of consideration worth acknowledging is the possibility that deference to aesthetic testimony could in fact be aesthetically (or otherwise) valuable. Much previous discussion of aesthetic testimony (Meskin 2004: 76; Ransom 2019: 426)—from both optimists and pessimists—has highlighted that there is much of value which is lost when we defer to testimony rather than engaging with works themselves (most obviously, aesthetic appreciation). However, there might also be under-recognised sources of value here (Wallbank & Robson 2022). The literature on trust in testimony has frequently noted that deference to testimony plays a valuable social role. It can serve as a socially bonding experience (Faulkner 2007; Jones 1996), and it is often understood as a means of fostering interpersonal relationships and ensuring social cooperation. (Relatedly distrust and non-trust in someone’s testimony can often be seen to serve a socially negative role [Hazlett 2017]). The idea here is that if A were to testify to B that p, A would be inviting B to trust that she has done the relevant epistemic work and is sufficiently competent and sincere, such that B may simply take A’s word for it that p. If B were to reject this invitation, A would arguably have some reason to feel insulted by the implicit discredit to her sincerity or competence. Note also that whilst the literature typically focuses on the fostering of inter-personal relationships, some accounts of trust accommodate the possibility that this socially-bonding experience can occur between an individual and a collective (Wallbank 2021). Accordingly, an individual’s trust in a culturally accepted aesthetic judgement—say, that the works of Mozart are magnificent—might then reflect a community-forming experience, group cohesion, and may strengthen a collective sense of identity. Considering this in light of recent work in aesthetics concerning the possibility of an intimate relationship between aesthetic value and social value (Riggle 2022; Cross forthcoming), it is interesting to observe that there is opportunity for researchers to pave the way towards advocating for the idea that deference to aesthetic testimony is not merely aesthetically permissible, and not merely useful as a temporary tool for aesthetic development, but it is in itself aesthetically valuable. (See King 2021 for discussion of nuances concerning the grounding of aesthetic judgement and McShane 2018 for arguments that deference to testimony in ethics can be positively valuable.)


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