African Ethics

First published Thu Sep 9, 2010

The ethics of a society is embedded in the ideas and beliefs about what is right or wrong, what is a good or bad character; it is also embedded in the conceptions of satisfactory social relations and attitudes held by the members of the society; it is embedded, furthermore, in the forms or patterns of behavior that are considered by the members of the society to bring about social harmony and cooperative living, justice, and fairness. The ideas and beliefs about moral conduct are articulated, analyzed, and interpreted by the moral thinkers of the society.

African societies, as organized and functioning human communities, have undoubtedly evolved ethical systems—ethical values, principles, rules—intended to guide social and moral behavior. But, like African philosophy itself, the ideas and beliefs of the African society that bear on ethical conduct have not been given elaborate investigation and clarification and, thus, stand in real need of profound and extensive analysis and interpretation. In the last three decades or so, attempts have been made by contemporary African philosophers to give sustained reflective attention to African moral ideas. This entry is intended to make some contribution to the understanding of African ethical thinking.

The entry makes the African moral language its point of departure, for the language of morality gives insight into the moral thinking or ideas of the society. The centrality of the notions of character and moral personhood, which are inspired by the African moral language, is given a prominent place. The entry points up the social character of African ethics and highlights its affiliated notions of the ethics of duty (not of rights) and of the common good. The humanistic foundations and features of African ethics are extensively discussed.

1. On the terms ‘Ethics’ and ‘Morality’

The term ‘ethics’ is technically used by philosophers to mean a philosophical study of morality—morality understood as a set of social rules, principles, norms that guide or are intended to guide the conduct of people in a society, and as beliefs about right and wrong conduct as well as good or bad character. Even though morality is the subject matter of ethics, it is most often used interchangeably with ‘ethics’. In spite of the philosophical inquiries or analyses undertaken by individual moral philosophers regarding morality (i.e., the morality of a society or people)—analyses which often result in diverse positions or conclusions—nevertheless, the basic features, the core elements of the morality of a society, those moral principles and values that actually guide and influence the lives of a people, remain pretty much what they are or have been. What individual moral philosophers, through their critical analyses and arguments, try to do is to explain, clarify, refine, sharpen, or enlarge the understanding of the concepts and issues of morality. Even though the moral beliefs and circumstances of their own societies constitute the immediate focus of their philosophical activities—for human experience is most directly felt within some specific social or cultural context—nevertheless, moral philosophers do not think or imply at all that the results of their reflective activities are to be tethered to their own societies as such. They believe, to the contrary, that, in the light of our common humanity, which speaks to the common sentiments, purposes, responses, hopes, and aspirations of all human beings in respect of certain situations, the conclusions of their reflections would, surely, have implications for the capacious community of humankind, for the universal human family.

Thus, moral principles and rules may emerge from or evolved by a particular human society; even so, they are principles that can—and do—apply to all human societies inasmuch as they respond to basic human needs, interests, and purposes. When the Akan moralist maintains, for instance, that ‘To possess virtue is better than gold’, or ‘When virtue founds a town, the town thrives and abides’, he strongly believes that he is making a moral statement—he is enunciating a moral principle—that transcends his own community and applies not only to other towns in his nation but, indeed, to all human societies, just as Socrates surely intended his celebrated moral statement ‘Virtue is knowledge’ (whether true or not) to apply to peoples and cultures beyond Athens and Greece, even beyond fifth century Greece. Thus, the moral intent of the morally-freighted proverbs (or maxims) discussed in this entry is considered relevant to the moral life of the human being and, as such, is purported to have universal application or reference.

After the reflective activities of the individual moral thinkers, the beliefs and presuppositions of a people about right and wrong conduct, good and bad character—all of which featured in the moral life of the people prior to the activities of moral thinkers—remain substantially or generally unscathed; they continue to constitute the moral framework within which the members of the society function. Thus, even though a theoretical (or, academic) distinction can be made between morality as constituted by the moral beliefs and principles that a group of people abides by in their daily lives (let us refer to this kind of morality as morality1) and morality or ethics as comprising the reflections of moral thinkers on human conduct, on morality1 (let us refer to the reflective enterprise regarding morality as morality2), nevertheless, to the extent that morality2 provides a clarification and better explanation and understanding of morality1, it can be said that the two terms, morality and ethics, refer essentially to the same moral phenomenon—human conduct—and, thus, can be used interchangeably. Thus, in this entry, the term ‘African ethics’ is used to refer both to the moral beliefs and presuppositions of the sub-Saharan African people and the philosophical clarification and interpretation of those beliefs and presuppositions.

I take note of a view expressed by some philosophers on Aristotle's ethics: Bertrand Russell observed that “Aristotle's opinions on moral questions are always such as were conventional in his day” (1945: 174). This view is re-echoed by Hardie: “[Aristotle's] moral ideas and moral ideals are, in some degree, the product of his time” (1968: 120); he also asserts that “Aristotle in the Nicomachean Ethics is at least in part an interpreter of Greek experience” (W. F. R Hardie, 1968: 123). In the same way, this entry present an interpretretation of the moral ideas and values as found in the African moral language, conceptions of society, conceptions of a person, and so on.

Also, in this entry, ‘African’ refers to the salient features or ideas of the African moral life and thought generally as reflected in, or generated by, African moral language and social structure and life. Many writers have made the observation that despite the indisputable cultural diversity that arises from Africa's ethnic pluralism, there are underlying affinities in many areas of the African life; this is surely true in the African religious and moral outlook. There are some features of the moral life and thought of various African societies that, according to the cited sources, are common or shared features. There are other features that can be seen as common on conceptual or logical grounds. For instance, the claim that the values and principles of African morality are not founded on religion simply derives from the characterization of traditional African religion as a non-revealed religion. (In the history of the indigenous religion in African, it does not seem that anyone in any African community, has ever claimed to have received a revelation from the Supreme Being intended either for the people of the community or for all humanity). This characterization makes African ethics independent of religion and, thus, underlines the notion of the autonomy of ethics in regard to African ethics. If a religion is a non-revealed religion, then it is independent of religious prescriptions and commands. The characterization of traditional African religion would, thus, lead me to assert—to generalize on logical grounds—that the moral system of each African society—in the traditional setting—does not derive from religion: thus, it is an autonomous moral system. Similarly, the claim about the social (non-individualistic) morality of the African society is closely related to the community and shared life of the African people. And so on.

Thus, while Akan ethics is not a microcosm of African ethics, there is nevertheless evidence, both empirical and conceptual, that indicates that the values, beliefs, and principles of Akan ethics reverberate mutatis mutandis on the moral terrains of other African societies. Based on the qualifying expression mutatis mutandis (‘allowing for necessary variations and adjustments’), it would be correct to say that the term ‘African ethics’ is appropriate. With all this said, however, neither Akan nor African ethics would be unique among the ethical systems evolved by the various non-African cultures of the world.

2. African Words for Ethics (or Morality)

We would begin with an inquiry into African moral language, in search specifically of the word for ‘ethics’ in a few African languages. Such an inquiry will give some insight into the basic conception and understanding of ethics or morality. It must be noted right from the outset that a substantial number of Sub-Saharan African languages do not have words that can be said to be direct equivalents of the word ‘ethics’ or ‘morality’. Here are some interesting results of inquiries made from native speakers of a few African languages and how statements about a person's ethical or moral conduct are expressed in those languages, including two of the prominent languages in Ghana, Akan (the author's native language) and Ewe.

  1. When a speaker of the Akan language wants to say, “He has no morals”, or, “He is immoral”, or “He is unethical”, “His conduct is unethical”, he would almost invariably say, “He has no character” (Onni suban).
  2. The statement, “He has no morals”, or “He is unethical”, is expressed by a speaker of the Ewe language as, nonomo mele si o (which means “He has no character”).
  3. In Yoruba language and thought the word iwa means both character and morality (it also means ‘being’ or ‘nature’).
  4. In Igbo language of Eastern Nigeria, the word agwa, meaning character, is used in such a statement as “he has no morals” (onwe ghi ezi agwa).
  5. In Shona, the language spoken by a substantial majority of the people of Zimbabwe, the word tsika means ‘ethics’ or ‘morality’. But when they want to say of a person that “He has no morals”, or “He is unethical”, they would often use the word hunhu which directly means ‘character’. Thus, Haana hunhu means “He has no character”, “He is not moral”, “He is unethical”.
  6. In South Sotho, a language spoken widely in Lesotho and southern Zimbabwe (Matebeleland), there are no words that are the direct equivalents of ‘ethics’ or ‘morality’. References to the moral or ethical life or behavior are made using words that mean behavior or character. Thus, moral statements such as “he has no morals” or “his action is unethical” will be expressed by words such as maemo—which means character or behavior: thus, maemo a mabe means “he has a bad character”, “his behavior (action) is unethical.” When a person behaves (or acts) in ways that are morally right, they would say “he has a good character”, using the words lokileng or boitswaro, both of which mean good character or good behavior.

Thus, the inquiries into the moral language of several African peoples or cultures indicate that in these languages the word or expression that means ‘character’ is used to refer to what others call ‘ethics’ or ‘morality’. Discourses or statements about morality turn to be discourses or statements essentially about character. In Islamic moral philosophy the word used for ‘ethics’, namely, akhlaq, means character. The implication here is that ethics or morality is conceived in terms essentially of character. It is noteworthy that the Greek word ethike, from which the English word ‘ethics’ derives means ‘character.’ (ethos) What we call ‘ethics’ Aristotle calls ‘the study (or, science) of character’, he ethike. For the Greek, as for the African and the Arab, the character of the individual matters most in our moral life and thought.

3. The Notion of Character as Central to African Ethics

There are of course other moral concepts in the African moral language and thought. The concepts of good, bad (or, evil), right and wrong feature prominently in African moral thought, as they do in the moral systems of other peoples and cultures. In Akan, for instance, pa or papa means good and bone means bad or evil (see below). Thus, the expression onipa bone means a bad person. A bad person is said to be a person with a bad character, suban bone. When a person is known to be honest or generous or compassionate, he would be judged by the Akan as a good person, by which they mean that he has a good character (suban). A person would be judged as having a bad character if he is considered dishonest, wicked, or cruel. In most moral evaluations reference is made to the character of a person; thus, character is basic—the crucial element—in Akan, as it is in African, ethics generally. Iwa (character) is, for the Yoruba, “perhaps the most important moral concept. A person is morally evaluated according to his/her iwa—whether good or bad” (Gbadegesin, 1991: 79). African ethics is, thus, a character-based ethics that maintains that the quality of the individual's character is most fundamental in our moral life.

Good character is the essence of the African moral system, the linchpin of the moral wheel. The justification for a character-based ethics is not far to seek. For, all that a society can do, regarding moral conduct, is to impart moral knowledge to its members, making them aware of the moral values and principles of that society. In general, society satisfactorily fulfills this duty of imparting moral knowledge to its members through moral education of various forms, including, as in African societies, telling morally-freighted proverbs and folktales to its younger members. But, having moral knowledge—being made aware of the moral principles and rules of the society—is one thing; being able to lead a life consonant with the moral principles is quite another. An individual may know and may even accept a moral rule, such as, say, it is wrong to cheat the customs. But he may fail to apply this rule to a particular situation; he is, thus, not able to effect the transition from knowledge to action, to carry out the implications of his moral belief.

In the Akan and other African moral systems such a moral failure would be put down to the lack of a good character (suban pa). In other words, the ability to act in accord with the moral principles and rules of the society requires the possession of a good character. Thus, in the context of the activities of the moral life—in our decisions to obey moral rules, in the struggle to do the right thing and to avoid the wrong conduct, in one's intention to carry out a moral duty, the quality of a person's character is of ultimate consequence. It is from a person's character that all his or her actions—good or bad—radiate: the performance of good or bad acts depends on the state of one's character. Wrong-doing is put down to a person's bad character. Thus, the Yoruba maxim (proverb): ‘Good character is a person's guard.’

African maxims are explicit about the formation of character: character is acquired. A person is therefore responsible for the state of his or her character, for character results from the habitual actions of a person. An Akan maxim has it that “one is not born with a bad ‘head’, but one takes it on from the earth.” The maxim means, among other things, that a bad habit is not an inborn characteristic; it is one that is acquired. It would be worthless to embark on moral instruction through moral proverbs and folktales, as it is done in African societies, if our character or habits were inborn. But the belief is that the moral narratives would help the young people to acquire and internalize the moral values of the society, including specific moral virtues, embedded in those ethical narratives. The appropriate responses to moral instruction are expected to lead to the acquisition of appropriate habits and their corresponding characters. And, because character is acquired through our actions, habits, and expected responses to moral instructions, it can, according to African moral systems, be changed or reformed.

Character is defined by the Akan thinkers in terms of habits, which result from a person's deeds or actions: ‘character comes from your actions’ (or deeds: nneyee), says an Akan traditional thinker. Persistent performance of a particular action will produce a certain habit and, thus, a corresponding character. To acquire virtue, a person must perform good actions, that is, morally acceptable actions so that they become habitual. The action or deed that led to the acquisition of a newly good habit must be persistently performed in order to strengthen that habit; in this way,virtue (or, good character) is acquired. Over time such an acquired virtue becomes a habit. This is the position of Akan ethics on the development and acquisition of a good (or, bad) character, for this is what the Akan people mean when they say aka ne ho, “it has remained with him,” “it has become part of him,” “it has become his habit.” Character is, thus, a behavior pattern formed as a result of past persistent actions. Thus, moral virtues (excellences of character) or vices arise through habituation.

The logic of the acquisition of our character or habits is that the original nature of the human being was morally neutral, neither good nor bad. A person's original moral neutrality will in the course of his life come to be affected, in one direction (the good) or the other direction (the bad) by his actions and responses to moral instruction, advice and persuasion. The original moral neutrality of a human being constitutes the foundation of our conception of the moral person, for it makes for—allows room for—choice, that is, moral choice. Consequently, what a person does or does not do is most crucial to the formation and development of his or her character, and, thus, to becoming moral or immoral.

4. Moral Personhood

Let me start the analysis of moral personhood in African moral philosophy with a statement made by Ifeanyi Menkiti, an African philosopher from Nigeria:

The various societies found in traditional Africa routinely accept this fact that personhood is the sort of thing which has to be attained, and is attained in direct proportion as one participates in communal life through the discharge of the various obligations defined by one's stations. It is the carrying out of these obligations that transforms one from the it-status of early child-hood, marked by an absence of moral function, into the person-status of later years, marked by a widened maturity of ethical sense—an ethical maturity without which personhood is conceived as eluding one. (Ifeanyi Menkiti, 1984: 176)

Menkiti's statement adumbrates a conception of moral personhood, which will now be discussed in some detail. The concept of a person in African thought embodies ethical presuppositions. The word used for “person” in the Akan language (undoubtedly the most widely spoken language in Ghana) is onipa. But the word onipa also means “human being” and the plural form of it means “people”. Thus, the word onipa is an ambiguous word. In the Akan society, when an individual's conduct very often appears cruel, wicked, selfish, ungenerous or unsympathetic, it would be said of that individual that “he is not a person” (onnye onipa).

In Yoruba language the word eniyan means a person. Even though the word is used in a normative as well as non-normative (or, ordinary) sense, “greater emphasis is placed on the normative dimension of eniyan” (Gbadagesin, 1991: 27). It can be said of some human individual that ‘he or she is not a person’ (Ki i se eniyan). Such a comment is a “judgment of the moral standing of the human being who is thus determined to fall short of what it takes to be recognized as such” (Gbadagesin, 1991: 27).

The Akan statement onnye onipa and the Yoruba statement Ki i se eniyan both underline a conception of moral personhood. The two statements are significant in two ways. The first is that, even though that individual is said not to be a person, he is nonetheless acknowledged as a human being, not a beast or fish. It is pretty clear that the statement implies a distinction between the concept of a human being and the concept of a person: an individual can be a human being without being a person.

The second significant thing the statements imply is the assumption that there are certain fundamental norms and ideals to which the conduct of a human being, if he is a person, ought to conform, that there are moral virtues that an individual has the capacity to display in his conduct and ought to display them, if he is a person. The reason for the judgment that an individual is not a person if he behaves or does not behave in a certain way is that that individual's actions and behavior are considered as falling short of the ideals and standards of personhood. But it does not imply at all that an individual considered “not a person” loses his rights as a human being or as a citizen or that people in the community should cease to demonstrate a moral concern for him or display the appropriate moral virtues in their treatment of him; only that he is not considered a morally worthy individual.

Now, the judgment that a human being is “not a person”, made in the wake of that individual's persistent unethical behavior, implies that the practice of moral virtue is considered intrinsic to the conception of a person held in Akan or Yoruba moral thought. The position here is this: for any p, if p is person, then p ought to display in his behavior the moral norms and ideals of personhood. When the behavior of a human being fails to conform to the acceptable moral principles or standards, or when a human being fails to display the expected moral virtues in his conduct, he is considered to be “not a person.”

The evaluative judgment opposite to the one we have been considering is “he is a person” (oye onipa). This judgment is not a descriptive judgment at all, even though it can be used descriptively, as when in a forest one hunter made that judgment to his colleague hunter who thought he saw a beast and was about to shoot it: the judgment “he is a person” (oye onipa) would in that context be used descriptively by the other hunter to distinguish a human being from a beast. Thus, a descriptive use of that judgment would be obvious and easily understood.

What I am concerned to point up in the present circumstance is the normative form of the judgment. Used normatively, the judgment, “he is a person,” means ‘he has a good character’, ‘he is generous’, ‘he is peaceful’, ‘he is humble,’ ‘he has respect for others.’ A profound appreciation of the high standards of the morality of an individual's behavior would elicit the judgment, “he is truly a person,” (oye onipa paa!). A rider would be in place here: while children are actual human beings and are members of the human community, they are not actual persons yet; they are persons only potentially and will attain the status of personhood in the fullness of time when they are able to exercise their moral capacity and make moral judgments.

Now, the denial of personhood to a human being on the grounds that his actions are not in accord with certain fundamental norms and ideals of personhood or that that individual fails to display certain virtues in his behavior is morally significant and worth noting. It means that human nature is considered in Akan metaphysical and moral thought to be essentially good, not depraved or warped by some original sin; that the human being is capable of doing good. It does not mean, however, that personhood, in this model of humanity, is innate but is earned in the ethical arena: it is the individual's moral achievement that earns him the status of a person. Every individual is capable of becoming a person inasmuch as he has capacity for virtue—for performing morally right actions—and should be treated (at least potentially) as a morally responsible agent.

In this connection, let us pay some attention to the Akan belief embedded in a maxim that says, “God created every human being (to be) good” (Onyame boo obiara yie). The view expressed in this proverb seems to be at variance with the notion of the moral-neutrality of the human being discussed earlier in connection with character (section 3). The meaning of the maxim “God created every human (to be) good” is not too clear; it may be interpreted in two ways. First, it may be taken as implying that God created the human being actually to do good, that is, to actually behave virtuously and to always make the appropriate moral choices. Second, it may be interpreted as meaning that God made the human being capable of moral choice, that is, that the human being was merely endowed by his creator with the moral sense to distinguish between good and evil, right and wrong. The first interpretation implies that the human being has been determined to be good—to actually pursue virtue: thus, the human being's moral status is a settled matter. If the human being were created or determined actually and always to do good, there would never have been a concept of evil or vice (bone) in Akan moral language, since no human being would, in that kind of moral context, commit a vicious or evil act. In light of the evil and unethical actions of individual human beings, the first interpretation which implies that the human being is resiliently good cannot be accepted as the correct meaning of the maxim, for it is plainly contradicted by our putative moral experience. The first interpretation also subverts moral-neutrality, a consequence that eliminates moral choice—basic to the notion of a moral person.

The second interpretation of the view that the human being was created good (or, to be good), implies that the human being merely has the capacity for virtue: that is, could pursue good, but could also pursue evil. This means that the human being is endowed with moral sense and, so, has the capacity for both virtue and vice; his judgment on some moral issue could go either direction: direction of the good or direction of the evil. Thus, the notion of moral neutrality is preserved. The human being can then be held as a moral agent: not that his virtuous character is a settled matter, but that he is capable of virtue, and hence, of moral achievement, and can, thus, achieve personhood.

The correctness of the second interpretation of the view that the human being was created good, as argued in the foregoing paragraphs, can have an anchor also in the Akan notion of tiboa: conscience, moral sense—a sense of right or wrong. This is a conception of an inner urge relevant to moral practice. Tiboa is held, among other things, as creating a sense of guilt in the individual, convicting him or her of wrong deeds. Since response to a moral rule is ultimately an individual or private affair, the notion of tiboa (conscience) is of great importance to our moral life. It is by virtue of tiboa that the notion of self-sanctioning in moral conduct becomes intelligible. Because of its power to induce a sense of guilt, tiboa is held to influence the individual's moral choice, decision, response, and attitude. The reality or phenomenon of moral choice is a rejection of the notion of a fixed or settled moral character of an individual that derives from the presupposition—albeit false—that the human being is born virtuous. The activity of tiboa is in line with the moral neutrality of the human being at birth. The activity of tiboa assists moral achievement and, thus, moral personhood.

Like the Akan people and others, the Rwanda (or, Ruanda) people also have the concept of conscience. “The Rwanda word for conscience, kamera, means something that is internally felt. It is situated in the heart” (J. J. Maquet in Forde, 1954: 183). There indeed are external social sanctions which are useful as deterrents from prohibited behavior; but in moral motivation feelings of moral guilt and shame are traceable also to kamera or tiboa.

5. The Humanistic Foundations of African Morality

Observations have been made by a number of scholars that Africans are a very—even a notoriously—religious people, that religion so deeply permeates all spheres of their lives that it cannot be distinguished from nonreligious aspects of life, that in the African traditional life there are no atheists, and that the African cultural heritage is intensely and pervasively religious. Historical evidence indicates that many colonial administrators in their dispatches to their colonial metropolis used to refer to Africans as ‘this incurably religious people.’ Assertions about the religiosity of the African people have led some scholars to maintain that there is a connection between religion and morality in African ethics. That some connection may exist between religion and morality is conceivable in an environment that is widely alleged to be pervasively religious. But the nature of the connection needs to be fully clarified.

The connection has been taken by most scholars to mean that African moral values and principles derive from religion, implying that African morality is, thus, a religious morality (Opoku, 1978: 152), Danquah (1944: 3), Sarpong (1972: 41), Busia (1967: 16), Parrinder (1969: 28–9), Idowu (1962: 146). The claim implies in turn that the moral beliefs and principles of the African people derive from those of religion, that religion provides the necessary justification for moral values and beliefs, and that moral concepts, such as good, bad, right and wrong, are defined (or, must be defined) in terms of religious prescriptions or commands. However, there are other scholars, such as Godfrey Wilson, Monica Wilson, Maquet, Wiredu, who deny the religious basis of the moral systems of the societies they studied. Kwasi Wiredu observed that “the Akan moral outlook is thus logically independent of religion” (Kwasi Wiredu in H. Odera Oruka and D. A. Masolo, 1983: 13). Godfrey Wilson wrote that “Among the Nyakyusa the ideas of social behaviour are not connected with religion, nonetheless they exist” and, after mentioning the moral virtues of the Nyakyusa, he added that “But the positive, ideal statement of these virtues is not made in religious terms” (Godfrey Wilson in Ottenberg and Ottenberg eds., 1960: 348). On the morality of the Rwanda, Maquet wrote that ‘Thus the ethics of the Banyarwanda are not integrated on a religious basis such as the will of God' (J. J. Maquet in Forde, 1954:184). In Mende ethics, “Wrongbehavior is regarded as a breaking of some specific rule of conduct, not as the flouting of some divine or absolute law of the universe” (Kenneth Little, in Forde, 1954:134). These are unambiguous statements of the nonreligious foundation of the morality of at least some African societies.

The claim, made by many scholars, that African morality is founded on, or derives from, religion cannot, in my opinion, be upheld, if by morality we are referring to social principles and norms that guide the conduct of people in a society. One reason is that, unlike Islam or Christianity, the traditional, that is, indigenous, African religion is not a revealed religion whereby divine truth is revealed to a single individual who becomes the founder. It is true that African religious experience certainly features mystical or highly spiritual encounters between human beings (that is, priests, priestesses, diviners, etc.) and spiritual beings. Such encounters occur in divinations, spirit mediums, communication with the dead, and other forms of the mystical experience. But, it may be noted, such mystical or spiritual encounters or contacts take place in an atmosphere that was already religious; they are some of the manifestations of African religion, of African spirituality.

I define spirituality as a heightened form of religiosity reached by certain individuals in the community who have, or claim to have, mystical contacts with the supernatural, the divine. It would be correct to assert, however, that the encounters are the results, rather than the sources, of religion in Africa in the traditional setting. And, even though ‘spiritual messages’ may be received by the practitioners of traditional African religion through those mystical encounters part of which (‘messages’) may relate to moral conduct, nevertheless such messages appear to be too few and far between to constitute an adequate basis for a coherent ethical system. Moreover, the .moral character of such ‘messages’ would, in a non-revealed religious context, have to be judged by the people themselves on the basis of their own moral insights. This is a telling point that implies the independence (autonomy) of the moral attitudes of the people with regard to the conduct of the spiritual beings. This is the reason why an eminent Ghanaian sociologist observed that “The gods are treated with respect if they deliver the goods, and with contempt if they fail….Attitudes to [the gods] depend on their success [i.e., the success of the gods], and vary from healthy respect to sneering contempt” (K. A. Busia in Forde, 1954: 205). The moral disapprobation of the people with regard to the actions—particularly the unsuccessful actions—of the deities constitutes the ground for the extinction of some of the deities from the Akan, possibly the African, pantheon. The fact that the behavior of a supernatural being is thus subject to human censure implies that it is possible for a deity to issue commands that can be considered unethical by the practitioners of traditional religion. All this implies, surely, that it would be correct to assert that, rather than regarding African ethics as religious (or, religious-based), it would be more correct to regard African religion as ethical.

In a revealed religion, what is revealed is generally elaborate and can be conceived to include moral principles and ideals as part of the will of God thus revealed. A morality that is founded on religion is thus a necessary concomitant of a revealed religion. Since the indigenous African religion is not a revealed religion, there is no way by which the people would have access to the will of God that contains elaborate moral principles upon which a coherent moral system can be erected. In the context of a non-revealed religion, then, to make divine or supernatural commands the source of moral values and principles would be conceptually impossible.

Now, how are the moral concepts of good, evil, right and wrong understood or defined in African ethics? When put to traditional sages (thinkers) of some Akan communities in Ghana the question, how do we come to know that ‘this action’ is good and ‘that action’ is evil? no one responded that an action is good or evil because God (Onyame) had said so or that Onyame had told us so. Thus, what is morally good or right is not that which is commanded by God or pleasing to God or any spiritual being, or that which is in accordance with the will of a spiritual being. The responses revealed, on the contrary, an undoubted conviction of a humanistic—a non-supernatural—origin of moral values and principles, a conviction that provided insight into the Akan conception of the criterion of moral value. According to the ethics of the Banyarwanda, “That is good (or evil) which tradition has defined as good (or evil)” (J. J. Maquet, loc. cit). In light of the non-revealed nature of traditional African religion, it can be said that the view regarding the non-religious (non-supernatural) origin of moral principles and values would resonate on the moral terrains of most other African communities. The sources of African morality in the traditional setting, then, must be held as independent of religious prescriptions or supernatural powers.

The views of the traditional thinkers indicate that what is good is constituted by the deeds, habits, and behavior patterns considered by the society as worthwhile because of their consequences for human welfare. The goods would include such things as generosity, honesty, faithfulness, truthfulness, compassion, hospitality, happiness, that which brings peace, justice, respect, and so on. Each of these actions or patterns of behavior is supposed or known to bring about social well-being. In Akan moral system (or African moral system generally), good or moral value is determined in terms of its consequences for humankind and human society. All this can be interpreted to mean that African morality originates from considerations of human welfare and interests, not from divine pronouncements. Actions that promote human welfare or interest are good, while those that detract from human welfare are bad. It is, thus, pretty clear that African ethics is a humanistic ethics, a moral system that is preoccupied with human welfare. Referring to African morality generally, Monica Wilson observed that “The basis of morality was fulfillment of obligation to kinsmen and neighbors, and living in amity with them” (1971: 98). In African conceptions moral values originate from the basic existential conditions in which human beings organize and conduct their lives. McVeigh made the following observation:

Therefore, it is important to inquire concerning the African standard of judgment, what makes some things good and others bad. [Edwin] Smith replies that the norm of right and wrong is custom; that is, the good is that which receives the community's approval; the bad is that which is disapproved. The right builds up society; the wrong tears it down. One is social; the other anti-social (Malcolm J. McVeigh, 1974: 84).

In the ethics of the Lovedu, a South Bantu ethnic group of the Transvaal:

Right conduct is relative always to the human situation and morality is oriented not from any absolute standards of honesty or truth but from the social good in each situation. Conduct that promotes smooth relationships, that upholds the social structure, is good; conduct that runs counter to smooth social relationships is bad (J. D. and E. J. Krige in Forde, 1954: 78).

And, regarding the basis of Bantu morality, Molema remarked:

The greatest happiness and good of the tribe was the end and aim of each member of the tribe. Now, utility forms part of the basis of perhaps all moral codes. With the Bantu, it formed the basis of morality…it was utilitarian. This was the standard of goodness, and in harmony with, and conformity to, this end must the moral conduct be moulded. The effect of this, of course, was altruism (S. M. Molema, 1920: 116).

Statements and references made in the immediately foregoing paragraphs indicate the nonreligious foundation of African ethics. Now, having removed African ethics from its alleged religious moorings, where do we moor it? The answer, based on the foregoing references, is that we moor it to the preoccupations of the African society with human welfare and social harmony, to reflections on the existential conditions in which human beings function.

Not being a revealed religion, traditional African religion can be characterized as a natural religion, a religion that derives from the peoples' own reflections on this complex world and their experiences in it. The African metaphysic, to be sure, is a theistic metaphysic; yet it does not nurture a theistic or supernatural ethic. Just as it was their own reflections that led to the creation of a natural religion, so it was their own reflections on living a harmonious and cooperative life in a human society that led to the creation of a ‘natural’ (a humanistic) ethic. Thus, side by side with Africa's natural religion (or, theology) is a ‘natural’ ethic grounded in human experiences in living together, a society-oriented morality that, thus, arises from the existential conditions in which people conduct their lives. And so it is, that the moral values of the African people have a social and humanistic, rather than a religious, basis and are fashioned according to the people's own understanding of the nature of human society, human relations, human goals, and the meaning of human life with its emotional features.

With all this said, however, it cannot be denied that religion plays some role in the moral lives of people, such as African people, who are said to be “incurably religious”. Because God is held by the African people not only to be the overlord of the human society but also to have a superbly moral character, and because the ancestors (ancestral spirits) are also supposed to be interested in the welfare of the society (they left behind), including the moral life of the individual, religion constitutes part of the sanctions that are in play in matters of moral practice. Thus, religion cannot be totally banished from the domain of moral practice, notwithstanding the fact that the moral values and principles of the African society do not derive from religion.

Humanism—the doctrine that takes human welfare, interests, and needs as fundamental—constitutes the foundation of African ethics. It is the warp and woof the African moral life and thought. Indeed, African prayers and other acts of worship are brimful of, or characterized by, requests to the supernatural beings for material comforts, such as prosperity, health, and riches. And, even though the African people do not consider God and other supernatural beings as the sources of their moral values and principles, nevertheless, they are ever aware of the powers of the supernatural beings and are ever ready to exploit their munificence for the promotion of human welfare, prosperity, and happiness.

6. Humanity and Brotherhood

These two concepts, humanity and brotherhood, feature prominently in African social and moral thought and practice. They are among the moral or human values that constitute the basic—perhaps the ultimate—criteria that not only motivate but also justify human actions that affect other human beings. In African terms, humanity is not just an anthropological term; it is also a moral term when it comes to considering the relations between members of the human species. The term ‘brotherhood’ has come to refer to an association of men and/or women with common aims and interests. But the notion of brotherhood is essentially a moral notion, for it is about the relations between individual human beings that make for their own interest and well-being. There is some affiliation between humanity and brotherhood in African ethical conceptions: if we are human, we are (must be) brothers, in a capacious, comprehensive sense of the word ‘brother’ (to be discussed shortly).

We start our discussion with the Akan maxim:

Humanity has no boundary.
(Honam mu nni nhanoa)

The Akan maxim literally means: ‘In human flesh there is no edge of cultivation—no boundary’ (nhanoa). The maxim can be interpreted as meaning that ‘all humankind is one species’, thus, that ‘Humanity has no boundary.’ When the farmer cultivates his land, he does it up to a limit, an edge (in Akan: nhanoa, edge, boundary) where he has to stop, otherwise he would trespass on another farmer's land. There is, thus, a limit to the area of cultivation of land. But this, the maxim invites us to realize, is not so in the cultivation of the friendship and fellowship of human beings; the boundaries of that form of cultivation are limitless. For, humanity is of one kind; all humankind is one species, with shared basic values, feelings, hopes, and desires.

This is most probably the reason why in almost all the autochthonous African languages (here I exclude African languages, like Hausa and Swahili, that have borrowed a substantial number of Arabic words) there is really no word for ‘race.’ There are, instead, the words ‘person’, ‘human being’, and ‘people.’ So that, where others would speak in terms of ‘the black race’ or ‘the white race’, Africans would say, ‘black people’, ‘white people’, and so on. And, instead of ‘people of mixed race’, they would say, ‘people of mixed blood.’ The latter expression, however, is somewhat vague, since it also describes people of dual ethnic parentage in African societies. But, in terms of the African perception of humanity, the important point is that the offspring of any ‘blood mixing’ is a human being and therefore belongs to the one human ‘race’ of which we are all a part. Thus, even though the African people traditionally live in small communities and are divided into different ethnic or cultural groups and into clans and lineages with complex networks of relationships, nevertheless, they perceive humanity to embrace all other peoples beyond their narrow geographic or spatial confines, to constitute all human beings into one universal family of humankind. Even though this family is fragmented into a multiplicity of peoples and cultures, nevertheless, it is a shared family—a shared humanity—the relationships among whose members ought to feature a certain kind of morality: the morality of a shared humanity

The common membership of one universal human family constitutes (should constitute) a legitimate basis for the idea of universal human brotherhood (or unity). This idea is depicted in, for instance, the Akan maxim:

A human being's brother is a (or another) human being.
(Or, ‘Man's brother is man.’)
(Onipa nua ne onipa)

The maxim asserts unmistakably that a human being can be related only to another human being, not to a beast. Implicit in the African perception of humanity is the recognition of all persons, irrespective of their racial or ethnic backgrounds, as brothers. This is the reason why in African cultures the word ‘brother’ is used to cover various and complex family relationships linked by blood ties. But the word is also used, significantly, by persons between whom there are no blood ties; thus, the word is used comprehensively. The comprehensive meaning given to the word ‘brother’ in African cultures is intended, indeed, to lift people up from the purely biologically determined blood relation level onto the human level, the level where the essence of humanity is held as transcending the contingencies of human biology, race, ethnicity, or culture.

A practical translation of the idea of brotherhood leads to such social and moral virtues as hospitality, generosity, concern for others, and communal feeling. Several writers, including European travelers to Africa in the nineteenth and early twentieth centuries, have remarked upon these virtues as practiced in African social and moral life. A Briton who spent about three decades in Central Africa from the latter part of the nineteenth century to the early part of the twentieth century made the following observation:

Hospitality is one of the most sacred and ancient customs of Bantuland, and is found everywhere. A native will give his best house and his evening meal to a guest, without the slightest thought that he is doing anything extraordinary (Dugald Campbell, 1922: 45, emphasis added).

And a contemporary African writer also notes:

One of the achievements of our [African] society was the universal hospitality on which they [i.e., members of the community and others] could rely (Julius Nyerere, 1968: 5).

Most people, including foreign visitors to Africa, often testify, in amazement, to the ethic of hospitality and generosity of the African people. That ethic is an expression of the perception of our common humanity and universal human brotherhood.

As regards the African conception of the worth and dignity of the human being, there is time to refer only to a couple of Akan maxims. One such maxim is:

The human being is more beautiful than gold.
(onipa ye fe sen sika)

In this maxim a human being is depicted as beautiful. That which is beautiful is enjoyed for its own sake, not for the sake of anything else. What the maxim is saying, therefore, is that a human being is to be enjoyed for his or her own sake. To enjoy a human being for his/her own sake means you should appreciate his value as a human being and demonstrate that appreciation by showing compassion, generosity, and hospitality. It means you should be open to the interests and welfare of others and feel it a moral duty to offer help where it is needed. To enjoy a human being also means you should recognize the other person as a fellow individual whose worth as a human being is equal to yours and with whom you undoubtedly share basic values, ideals, and sentiments. Thus, the main intent of the maxim is to point out the worth of a human being and the respect that ought to be given to her by virtue of her humanity. Recognition of the worth of a human being is, according to the maxim, more important than caring for wealth.

Kenneth Kaunda describes in some detail how the enjoyment of people is expressed in practical terms:

Our conversation is a good example of this [enjoyment of people]. We will talk for hours with any stranger who crosses our path and by the time we part there will be little we do not know about each other. We do not regard it as impertinence or an invasion of our privacy for someone to ask ‘personal’ questions, nor have we compunction about questioning others in like manner. We are open to the interests of other people. Our curiosity does not stem from a desire to interfere in someone else's business but is an expression of our belief that we are wrapped up together in this bundle of life and therefore a bond already exists between myself and a stranger before we open our mouths to talk (Kaunda, 1966: 32).

The value of the human being is expressed also in the following maxim:

It is the human being that counts: I call upon gold, it answers not; I call upon cloth, it answers not; it is the human being that counts.

(Onipa ne asem: mefre sika a, sika nnye so, mefre ntama a, ntama nnye so; onipa ne asem.)

The maxim says that it is only the human being that is of real value, for in times of need or distress, if you appeal to gold and other material possessions they will not respond; only a human being will. For these reasons, the worth of the human being is of the ultimate consequence and ought therefore to be given the ultimate consideration. From such maxims one can appreciate why human welfare and concern constitute the preoccupation of African ethics.

7. The Notion of the Common Good

The notion of the common good features manifestly in African ethics. In Akan moral thought, the notion is expressed most vividly in an art motif that shows a ‘siamese’ crocodile with two heads but a single (i.e., common) stomach. The part of the motif relevant to moral thought is the single stomach, and it is to the significance of this that I wish to pay some attention. The common stomach of the two crocodiles indicates that at least the basic interests of all the members of the community are identical. It can therefore be interpreted as symbolizing the common good, the good of all the individuals within a society.

The common good is not a surrogate for the sum of the various individual goods. It does not consist of, or derive from, the goods and preferences of particular individuals. It is that which is essentially good for human beings as such, embracing the needs that are basic to the enjoyment and fulfillment of the life of each individual. If the common good were the aggregate of individual goods, it would only be contingently, not essentially, common and, on that score, it would not be achieved in a way that will benefit all the individuals in a society. If the common good is achieved, then the individual good is also achieved. Thus, there should be no conceptual tension or opposition between the common good and the good of the individual member of the community, for the common good embraces the goods—the basic goods—of all the members of the community. If the common good were understood as the basic good—as human good—as such, there would be no need to think of it as a threat to individual liberty as touted by Western liberal (individualist) thinkers, for, after all, individual liberty is held as one of the basic goods of the members of the society. The contents of the common stomach, in the symbolic art of the ‘siamese crocodile’, would not conflict with the interests and needs of either of the crocodiles.

The good, as discussed in an earlier section, is defined by the traditional thinkers of the Akan society in terms of peace, happiness or satisfaction (human flourishing), justice, dignity, respect, and so on. The common good embraces these goods and more.

There is no human being who does not desire peace, security, freedom, dignity, respect, justice, equality, and satisfaction. It is such a moral, not a weird, notion embracive of fundamental goods—goods that are intrinsic to human fulfillment and to which all individuals desire to have access—that is referred to as the common good. The unrelenting support by people in a community for such moral values as social justice and equality on the one hand, and the spontaneous, universal denunciation of acts such as murder and cruelty on the other hand, are certainly inspired by beliefs in the common good.

Similarly, the institutions of various kinds—legal, political, economic, moral and others—are set up in pursuit of certain commonly shared values and goals, that is, a common good which a human society desires to achieve for all of its members. The institution of government or legal system is surely based on a common understanding of the need for societal values of social order and social peace. It is, thus, pretty clear that the common good is that which inspires the creation of a moral, social, political, or legal system for enhancing the well-being of people in a community.

The common good is a notion that is conceptually affiliated to the notion of community and, thus, to the notion of human society as such. The common good is an essential feature of the ethics espoused by the communitarian African society. The pursuit of the good of all is the goal of the communitarian society, which the African society is. A sense of the common good—which is a core of shared values—is the underlying presupposition of African social morality.

8. Social, Not Individualistic, Ethics

A humanistic morality, whose central focus is the concern for the welfare and interest of each member of community, would expectably be a social morality which is enjoined by social life itself. Such is the nature of African morality. Social life or sociality is natural to the human being because every human being is born into an existing human society. A traditional Akan thinker asserted in a previously quoted proverb that says that ‘When a human being descends from the heavens, he [or she] descends into a human town [or, a human society].’ The point of the maxim is that the human being is social by nature. This view finds a variant in Aristotle's celebrated dictum that ‘The human being is by nature a social animal’, that is, that a human being is by nature a member of a polis, a human community. [The word politikon used in Aristotle's dictum means ‘social’ rather than ‘political’.] Being a member of the human community by nature, the individual is naturally related or oriented toward other persons and must have relationships with them. The natural sociality or relationality of human beings would—and should—prescribe a social ethic, rather than the ethic of individualism. Individualistic ethics that focuses on the welfare and interests of the individual is hardly regarded in African moral thought.

African social ethic is expressed in many maxims (or, proverbs) that emphasize the importance of the values of mutual helpfulness, collective responsibility, cooperation, interdependence, and reciprocal obligations. Let me refer to a few of these, from the Akan repertoire:

The well-being of man depends on his fellow man.
(onipa yieye firi onipa)

The point of this proverb is, not that a person should always look to another (or others) for his well-being and the attainment of his goals, but that there are occasions when the demonstration by another person (or other persons) of goodwill, sympathy, compassion, and the willingness to help can be a great boost to a person's attempts to achieve his goals, to fulfill his life. The dependency noted in the foregoing proverb is to be put down to the limited nature of the possibilities of the human individual. Human limitations are in fact expressed in the following Akan proverb:

Man is not a palm-tree that he should be complete (or, self sufficient).
(onipa nye abe na ne ho ahyia ne ho)

The proverb points up the inadequacies of the human being that make it impossible for him to fulfill his life, socially, economically, emotionally, psychologically, and so on. It is evidently true that in the context of the society, in terms of functioning or flourishing in a human society, the human individual is not sufficient, for her capacities, talents, and dispositions are not adequate for the realization of her potential and basic needs. It is only through cooperation with other human beings that the needs and goals of the individual can be fulfilled. With his self-sufficiency whittled away by man's natural condition, the individual requires the succor and relationships of others in order to satisfy his basic needs. A social ethic that recognizes the importance of the values of mutual help, goodwill, and reciprocity is the kind of ethic that will counter the lack of human self-sufficiency in respect of talents and capacities and in many ways help realize his basic needs.

Reciprocity and interdependence are forthrightly expressed in the following Akan maxims:

The right arm washes the left arm and the left arm washes the right arm.
(wo nsa nifa hohorow benkum, na benkum nso hohorow nifa)

That the left arm cannot wash itself is of course a matter of everyday experience. It is when the two arms wash each other that both become clean: thus, the need for interdependence.

Life is mutual aid.
(Obra ye nnoboa)

The Akan word nnoboa means ‘helping each other to work on the farm’. In the farming communities of rural Ghana, when a farmer realizes that work on the farm cannot be completed within a certain time if he did it single-handedly, he would request the assistance and support of other farmers in the community. The other farmers would readily lend a helping hand to that farmer, who would, in this way, achieve his productivity goals and do so on time. The same request would, when necessary, be made by the other farmers on different occasions. It is this kind of experience that led an Akan traditional thinker to create this proverb which, because of the word ‘life’ (obra), has been made to cover other spheres of the human life than the purely economic (or agricultural). Refusing to offer help to others and consistently seeking one's own good and disregarding the good of others will result in one's being denied the help and goodwill that may be necessary to achieve certain ends. Since you refused to help someone who needed your help or someone who was in distress, you are likely to meet the same refusal or denial when you need some help—perhaps more help at that. The morality of a shared life, as in any community, thus demands mutuality or reciprocity as a moral mandate in a world in which human beings, weak and limited in many ways, are subject to vulnerable situations. Mutual aid, then, becomes a moral obligation.

That a human being, due to her limitations, deserved to be helped is expressed in the following maxim:

A human being needs help.
(onipa hia moa)

The Akan word translated ‘needs’ is hia, which, as used in this maxim, has a normative connotation; thus, it does more than simply expressing a fact about human life or the human condition. The real meaning of the maxim, then, is that a human being deserves, and therefore ought, to be helped. It also means that a human being must be regarded as an object of moral concern and should therefore be entitled to help by others in the appropriate circumstances. The reason why you should help someone in need is also given in the following maxim, among others:

Your neighbor's situation is [potentially] your situation.
(Wo yonko da ne wo da)

Two important things about this maxim need to be pointed out. One is that the maxim is uttered in references only to the pitiable, miserable or unfortunate situation of another person (referred to in the maxim as “your neighbor”—wo yonko) or other people (your “neighbors”). These unfortunate situations or circumstances insistently call for the demonstration of sympathy, compassion, and willingness to offer some help. The other important thing about this maxim is that the word ‘neighbor’ in the maxim does not necessarily refer to the person next door or in one's community but to any other person in your community and beyond: even in far-off places.

The basic or ultimate thrust of the maxim is that you should not show insensitivity to people who are in pitiable situations, for one day you might be in that situation too and would need the help of others: thus, your neighbor's situation is potentially your situation; every other person is basically you. Social morality thus demands mutual reciprocity as a moral mandate in a world in which human beings can easily be overcome—even overwhelmed—by the contingencies of the human condition and existence. Altruism is, thus, a fundamental moral value.

Insensitivity to the needs and hardships or suffering situations of others is repudiated in Akan morality, as it is, indeed, repudiated in the moralities of all human cultures. In Akan moral thought and practice, a maxim that rebukes the lack of feeling for others is put thus:

When it sticks into your neighbor's flesh, it is as if it stuck into a piece of wood.
(etua wo yonko ho a, etua dua mu)

“Sticking into your neighbor's flesh (or, body)” is another way of referring to the suffering, misfortune, hardship, or pain of another person. When something, such as a needle, sticks into your own flesh or body, you feel the pain. If it stuck into another person's—your neighbor's—flesh, you would not directly feel the pain. Even so, you should not feel insensitive to the pain or suffering of that person and shrug off your moral shoulders, for the other person's body is certainly not a piece of wood that cannot feel pain.

The foregoing maxims and many others similar to them in content and purpose all underline a social morality. There are many African folktales whose conclusions are intended to affirm the values of social morality—the kind of morality that is centered on human relations. The social character of morality requires that the individual member of the society, ever mindful of his interests, adjust those interests to the interests and needs of others. This requires him to give due consideration to the interests and welfare of others. Necessarily embedded in a human community, the individual person has a dual moral responsibility: for him or herself as an individual and for others as co-members of the community with whom she shares certain basic needs and interests.

9. The Ethics of Duty, Not of Rights

African ethics, is a humanitarian ethics, the kind of ethics that places a great deal of emphasis on human welfare. The concern for human welfare may be said to constitute the hub of the African axiological wheel. This orientation of African ethics takes its impulse, undoubtedly, from the humanistic outlook that characterizes traditional African life and thought. Humanism—the doctrine that sees human needs and interests as fundamental—thus constitutes the foundation of African ethics (see section 5 above).

Now, the natural sociality or relationality of the human being that would prescribe social ethic (see preceding section) would also prescribe the ethic of duty (or, responsibility). The natural relationality of the individual immediately involves one in some social and moral roles in the form of obligations, commitments, and duties (or, responsibilities) to other members of his or her community which the individual must fulfill. Social or community life itself, a robust feature of the African communitarian society, mandates a morality that clearly is weighted on duty to others and to the community; it constitutes the foundation for moral responsibilities and obligations.

There appears to be a conceptual tie—perhaps also a practical tie—between the social ethic prescribed by the communitarian ethos and the ethic of duty mandated by the same ethos.

A morality of duty is one that requires each individual to demonstrate concern for the interests of others. The ethical values of compassion, solidarity, reciprocity, cooperation, interdependence, and social well-being, which are counted among the principles of the communitarian morality, primarily impose duties on the individual with respect to the community and its members. All these considerations elevate the notion of duties to a status similar to that given to the notion of rights in Western ethics. African ethics does not give short-shrift to rights as such; nevertheless, it does not give obsessional or blinkered emphasis on rights. In this morality duties trump rights, not the other way around, as it is in the moral systems of Western societies. The attitude to, or performance of, duties is induced by a consciousness of needs rather than of rights. In other words, people fulfill—and ought to fulfill—duties to others not because of the rights of these others, but because of their needs and welfare

It would be clear from the foregoing discussion that African ethics takes a stand that would be against what are referred to as acts of supererogation. A supererogatory act is defined as an act that is said to be ‘beyond the call of duty’; it is an act that is said to be over and above what a person is required to do as a moral agent. In much of the literature on Western moral philosophy, an act of supererogation is held not as a strictly moral duty. Thus, it is neither morally obligatory nor forbidden; therefore, it is not wrong, so the argument concludes, to omit or neglect performing it, even though it is good and commendable by virtue of its value and consequences on others if it is performed. It is supposed to be a meritorious act and yet optional, one that may be performed if the spirit moves you, but need not be performed. Thus, a distinction is made in Western literature between moral duty and a supererogatory act, the former considered obligatory and moral duty ‘proper’ and the latter nonobligatory and optional, not being a ‘proper’ moral duty.

Supererogationism is clearly an oxymoron: for, why should an act that is good and morally commendable and will conduce to the well-being of another person (or, other persons) fail to exact obligation or compel performance? We would normally think that there is a moral connection between ‘good’ and ‘ought’, and that therefore a morally good act ought to be performed: if an act is morally good, then it ought to be performed.

African morality, which is humanitarian, social, and duty-oriented rather than rights-oriented morality, does not make a distinction between a moral duty and a supererogatory duty—one that is beyond the call of duty and so does not have to be performed. In the light of our common humanity, it would not be appropriate—in fact it would demean our humanity—to place limits to our moral duties or responsibilities. Even though it is true that, as human beings, we are limited in many ways and so are not capable of fulfilling our moral duties to all human beings at all times as such, nevertheless, the scope of our moral duties should not be circumscribed. African humanitarian ethics would seek to collapse moral duty and moral ideals—the latter being the basis of the so-called supererogatory duty—into one capacious moral universe inhabited both by the morality of duty ‘proper’, obligation, and justice and the morality of love, virtue, compassion, benevolence, and other “moral ideals”. Such a capacious morality would make no distinction between a morally obligatory act and a morally optional act. It would insist that no act that is morally good in itself or that will conduce to the well-being of some individual or group of individuals should be considered morally optional, to be morally shrugged off or unconscionably set aside, if we understand morality to be something that serves (or, should) serve human needs. Thus, as the second part of a previous quotation says,

A native will give his best house and his evening meal to a guest, without the slightest thought that he is doing anything extraordinary (Dugald Campbell, section 6 above).

Thus, African ethics—an ethics that is weighted on duty, not on rights—would, in principle, not consider moral duty of any kind as extraordinary, optional, or supererogatory. The African humanitarian ethic makes all people objects of moral concern, implying that our moral sensitivities should be extended to all people, irrespective of their cultures or societies.

10. Conclusion

African morality is founded on humanism, the doctrine that considers human interests and welfare as basic to the thought and action of the people. It is this doctrine as understood in African moral thought that has given rise to the communitarian ethos of the African society. For, ensuring the welfare and interests of each member of society can hardly be accomplished outside the communitarian society. The communitarian ethos is also borne of beliefs about the natural sociality of the human being, expressed, for instance, in the Akan maxim, previously referred to, that says that “when a human being descends from the heavens, he descends into a human town”(onipa firi soro besi a, obesi onipa kurom). Social or community life is, thus, not optional to the human being. Social life, which follows upon our natural sociality, implicates the individual in a web of moral obligations, commitments, and duties to be fulfilled in pursuit of the common good or the general welfare.

Thus, African humanitarian ethics spawns social morality, the morality of the common good, and the morality of duty that is so comprehensive as to bring within its compass what are referred to as moral ideals (such as love, virtue, compassion), which are considered supererogatory in Western ethics. But central or basic to the African morality is character, for the success of the moral life is held to be a function of the quality of an individual's personal life. A moral conception of personhood is held in African ethics, the conception that there are certain basic moral norms and ideals to which the conduct of the individual human being, if he is a person, ought to conform. The recognition in the African ethical traditions of all human beings as brothers by reason of our common humanity is indeed a lofty moral ideal that must be cherished and made a vital or robust feature of global ethics in our contemporary world. It is a bulwark against developing bigoted attitudes toward peoples of different cultures or skin colors who are, also, members of the universal human family called race.


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Copyright © 2010 by
Kwame Gyekye

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