Notes to Agency

1. According to the Oxford English Dictionary, the earliest use of ‘agent’ in English can be found in a treatise on alchemy, written in 1471, where it was used to denote “a force capable of acting on matter”. It is noted that the semantic development of ‘agency’ has been considerably shaped by association with ‘agent’, which is defined, most generally, as a “person who or thing which acts upon someone or something; one who or that which exerts power; the doer of an action”.

2. In her main contribution to the philosophy of action, Anscombe (1957) did not use the term ‘agency’ at all. Davidson used it on occasion, but always under the assumption that agency is, essentially, intentional action (see, especially, Davidson 1971). Sometimes, the term ‘agency theory’ was used to denote the view that the relation between agents and their actions is primitive and irreducible. This usage is now outdated, as it has become common to refer to this position as the theory of agent-causation or the agent-causal account of agency (see section 3.1).

3. A search in the Philosopher’s Index over publication titles in peer reviewed and scholarly journals reveals the following. In the period from 1960–1989, there are 678 entries for ‘action’ and 75 for ‘agency’. In the period from 1990–present, there are 1230 entries for ‘action’ and 597 for ‘agency’ (retrieved on 03/12/2014). For theories and discussions of agency in psychology, social science, and anthropology see Bandura 2006, Emirbayer and Mische 1998, and Ahearn 2001, for instance.

4. The generation of one action by another often consists in causation, but it need not. Goldman (1970: Ch. 2) distinguishes between four types of act-generation: causal generation, conventional generation, simple generation, and augmentation generation.

5. Arguably, there are actions that are neither intentional nor unintentional. Examples include foreseen but unintended side-effects and cases in which the achievement of a goal involves more luck than skill. The claim that there are such middle-ground actions is compatible with the claim that action depends on intentional action, because in all such middle-ground cases, the action in question is either identical with or generated by something that the agent does intentionally. For more on this see Mele and Moser 1994; Mele 2012.

6. In later work, Davidson changed his view on this. See Davidson 1978.

7. It is unclear, though, whether all instances of agency involve initiation. Setiya (2007: 57–58) argues that guidance without initiation can be sufficient for intentional agency. No one denies, however, that agency can and frequently does involve initiation by the agent. This notion can be traced back to Aristotle’s characterization of behavior in terms of self-movement: movement that has its source or origin in the agent.

8. Later on, Frankfurt argued that the standard theory is inadequate because it fails to account for the agent’s guidance during the execution of an action (Frankfurt 1978; see also note 19). But this objection to the standard theory played no role in his argument for the hierarchical account of human agency. Since then, several proponents of the standard theory have argued that the view does have the resource to explain guidance. See Brand 1984; Audi 1986; Bishop 1989; Mele 1992 and 2003; Pacherie 2008; Clarke 2010b, for instance.

9. Sims (2019) argues that our mature concept of ‘agent’ inherits its referent from a “minimal mindreading mechanism” which produces an “agential proto-concept”: a disposition to treat agents as a distinct kind of entity. Sims concludes that the concept ‘agent’ should not be analyzed a priori, and that the standard causal theory is false insofar as it is a theory about the meaning of ‘agency’. As suggested in this entry, it is not mandatory to construe the standard theory in this way. All things considered, it is more plausible to hold that the standard theory provides a reductive account of one central kind of agency: intentional agency. Moreover, the standard theory need not be taken as reductive in the sense that it is based solely on a priori analysis. It is reductive in the metaphysical sense that it reduces the agent’s role to the role of mental states and events (see section 3.1), and it is open to be developed and refined in the light of empirical evidence.

10. Mele (2003: Ch. 9) shows that this account does not generate a regress of intention formation, provided that intentions to resolve the particular practical question can be acquired passively (at the beginning or during the process of deliberation).

11. There are several ways to explain the role of states in an event-causal framework. First, one may acknowledge that it is, strictly speaking, not states themselves that are causally efficacious, but events that are closely associated with them, such as the manifestation of a belief, the formation of an intention, or the “onslaught” of a desire (Davidson 1963). Second, it has been suggested that states can play the same causal role as events, because states belong to the same metaphysical category. According to Kim (1976), for instance, both events and states are instantiations of properties (by substances at certain times). Third, it has been suggested that states can play a role in event-causation as “structuring causes” (Dretske 1988).

12. According to some versions of the event-causal approach, the action is the relevant causal process, rather than the causal effect or outcome of that process. See section 3.4.

13. One may hold that people believe, desire, and intend, but deny that there are mental states, such as beliefs, desires, and intentions. Arguably, one can accommodate this view and preserve the core of the standard theory by appeal to fact-causation. If there is fact-causation, then actions can be caused by such things as the facts that the agent believes, desires, and intends. For more on this see Mele 2013.

14. As with event-causal views, there are versions of the agent-causal view according to which the action is the relevant causal process, rather than the causal effect or outcome of that process. See section 3.4.

15. Volitionists also reject the claim that agency can be reduced to processes with a certain causal structure. See notes 12, 14, and section 3.4.

16. A common strategy is to give counterexamples to the claim that a logical connection excludes a causal connection. For instance, the connection between sunburn and overexposure to sunlight is not merely contingent: an irritation of the skin is sunburn only if it is brought about by overexposure to sunlight. The connection is both logical and causal. Further, it seems that the logical connection argument conflates types and tokens. The logical connections hold between types of mental attitudes and types of actions, whereas the purported causal connections hold between particular tokens of those types.

17. There is no general agreement on how this distinction is to be fleshed out in detail. But it is widely agreed that there are basic actions, which we have to perform in order to perform non-basic actions. See Danto 1965; Goldman 1970; Ginet 1990; Enç 2003. For a dissenting view see Lavin 2013.

18. The problem of consequential deviance is usually solved by appeal to the agent’s act-plan (which is assumed to be part of the content of the relevant mental attitude). In such cases, the agent brings about the intended end, but not in the way planned. This explains why the chain is deviant (Bishop 1989, for instance). The problem of basic deviance is more difficult, and there is no standard solution. But there are several proposals on offer. According to Peacocke (1979) and Bishop (1989), the problem is, in essence, a lack of sensitivity, which can be spelt out in terms of counterfactual conditionals. In deviant causal chains, it is not the case that different mental antecedents would have resulted in corresponding differences in the action. Brand (1984) and Mele (2003) proposed solutions in terms of “proximal causation”: the relevant mental antecedents must be the proximal causes of the relevant events. Schlosser (2007) proposed a solution that appeals to causation in virtue of content: in deviant cases, the effect is not caused and explained in virtue of the antecedent’s content. This solution follows from the more general proposal that non-deviant causation consists in the manifestation of the right kinds of dispositions (see Schlosser 2011). According to Wu (2016), “intention-mediated attention” is an essential component of agency, and in deviant causal chains the “intention-attention nexus” is disrupted.

19. Such outcome views are not committed to the claim that the occurrence of the mental antecedent must precede the action. An action may be the outcome of a causal process that first initiates and then guides the execution of the action. (See also notes 8 and 20.)

20. According to Steward (2013), the question of whether actions are events or processes does have a bearing on fundamental issues in the metaphysics of agency. She argues that processes cannot be reduced to chains of events due to their imperfective nature, and she suggests that this poses a serious problem for event-causal theories of agency, mainly because the execution of a process requires guidance by the agent (see also note 8). Steward fails to mention, however, that there are several event-causal accounts of guidance on offer (Brand 1984; Audi 1986; Bishop 1989; Mele 1992 and 2003; Pacherie 2008; Clarke 2010b, for instance). Wu (2011) proposes a “structural theory of action” according to which an agent’s exercise of control is constituted by the process of an intention’s causing an action, guided by perceptual attention (see also section 4.6). Wu presents this view in opposition to the standard event-causal theory. But the main proponents of the standard theory never claimed or implied that the agent’s exercise of control resides in the causal antecedents, rather than in the causal process. In fact, most formulations of the standard theory make no mention of the notion of control and are fully compatible with the suggestion that control is constituted by the causal process. So it seems that this disagreement concerning the locus of control is largely verbal.

21. Related questions concerning the role of consciousness in morally responsible agency are addressed in Schlosser 2013 and Levy 2014.

22. The research on automaticity includes the work on the automatic activation of stereotypes. Many of the seminal experiments in this area have been called into question. Several attempts at replication have either failed or produced only significantly smaller effects (see Harris et al. 2013, Shanks et al. 2013, and the January 2014 issue of Perspectives on Psychological Science). There is, however, also a very large body of research that corroborates the findings. Even if the effects are small and difficult to reproduce, it seems rather unlikely that there are no real effects that underlie the results in this area of research.

23. Levy 2011 discusses the related question of whether there is room for the notion of weak-willed action within a dual-process framework.

Copyright © 2019 by
Markus Schlosser

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