Heinrich Cornelius Agrippa von Nettesheim

First published Wed Feb 15, 2017

[Editor's Note: The following new entry by Vittoria Perrone Compagni replaces the former entry on this topic by the previous author.]

The intellectual biography of Heinrich Cornelius Agrippa von Nettesheim (1486–1535) provides us with significant proof of a cultural crisis in the Renaissance. The most striking aspect of his heritage is the seemingly paradoxical coexistence of a comprehensive treatise on magic and occult arts, De occulta philosophia libri tres (Three Books on Occult Philosophy), written in 1510, but then reworked, substantially enlarged, and finally published in 1533, and a rigorous refutation of all products of human reason, De incertitudine et vanitate scientiarum et artium atque excellentia verbi Dei declamatio invectiva (On the Uncertainty and Vanity of the Arts and Sciences: An Invective Declamation), printed in 1530. Esoteric literature and inquisitorial handbooks invariably quoted Agrippa, the celebrated (or execrated) Archimagus; bibliographies on skepticism granted him a long lasting, but not entirely deserved, reputation as one “who professed to overturn all the science” (Naudé 1644: 44–45). Actually, both works, as well as all of Agrippa’s other writings, are clearly defined moments in a broader philosophical, religious, and moral meditation on the social significance of learning in his own time. The “paradox” with which Agrippa challenges his readers lies precisely in the simultaneous presence of two speculative concerns, which are scattered in different texts, but which express, in spite of their apparent inconsistency, a complex cultural and religious project. De vanitate performs the epistemological function of the pars destruens, identifying the causes and the historical responsibilities for the general spiritual wreckage of Christian society, and introducing the proposal contained in the pars construens. De occulta philosophia, recovering “true magic” in the framework of Neoplatonic metaphysics and Hermetic theology, offers humankind a wonder-working knowledge, one which is able to restore human cognitive and practical capacities.

In order to understand the internal coherence of Agrippa’s intellectual journey, his entire oeuvre has to be taken into account. The task is made more difficult because of his specific writing strategy, which entailed hiding his true purposes beneath a mound of borrowed material and erratic juxtapositions. This style of thought and exposition requires Agrippa’s readers to piece together his “scattered meaning” (dispersa intentio) and to search for the theoretical message which is knowingly concealed within an unsystematic exposition. The literary technique of spreading knowledge in disguise, typical of the sapiential tradition, turned out to be increasingly important for most Renaissance intellectuals, who were “forced to create spaces for themselves by merging learning with prophecy” (Celenza 2001: 128). In addition, Agrippa composed his texts by gathering a wide range of concepts and quotations from ancient and contemporary sources, which were removed from their original context and re-composed in a new explanatory structure. Such a way of de-constructing and re-constructing his cultural models should be considered in the light of Agrippa’s ideological program. By “re-writing” his sources, he uncovered presuppositions and implications, which the sources themselves often left unsaid, and he connected together, in a single coherent design, arguments and points of view which remained separate in contemporary discussions. In this way, he added a “political” meaning to the new text which was not present in the purely cultural or religious critique put forward by his sources. This emphasis on the civic function of philosophy can be regarded as the most characteristic and “original” element in Agrippa’s works.

1. Biography

Heinrich Cornelius Agrippa was born on 14 September 1486 in Cologne. He matriculated at the University of Cologne in 1499 and graduated in 1502. The degree in medicine which he claimed to have earned was ruled out by Prost (1882: 67–74), who also raised serious doubts about his doctorates in Canon and Civil Law (in utroque iure). Nauert (1965: 10–11), however, suggested that they might have been obtained during the two periods of his life about which we have very little information: 1502–1507 and 1511–1518. Agrippa came into contact with the school of Albertus Magnus at Cologne, where it was still a living tradition and where he pursed his interest in natural philosophy, encountering the Historia naturalis (Natural History) of Pliny the Elder for the first time. Andreas Canter, the city poet of Cologne, probably introduced him to Lullism—later, Agrippa wrote a long commentary, printed at Cologne in 1531, on Lull’s Ars magna (Great Art). During his youthful studies, Agrippa also established personal relationships with those German humanists who shared his interest in ancient wisdom. He spent a short period in Paris, where he might have been a student. With some French friends, he formed a sodalitium, a sort of secret circle or initiatory brotherhood, which, according the collection of letters from and to Agrippa, included Charles de Bovelles (c. 1479–1533), Symphorien Champier (c. 1471–1539), Germain de Brie (c. 1489–1538), Germain de Ganay (d. 1520), the portraitist at the French court Jean Perréal (c. 1455–1530), and an unknown Italian friend, Landulfus. Between 1508 and 1509, Agrippa undertook a mysterious journey to Spain, seemingly engaged in a military mission. In 1509 he was charged with a course of lectures on Johannes Reuchlin’s De verbo mirifico (On the Wonder-Working Word) at the University of Dôle in Burgundy. This academic appointment had been supported by the chancellor of the university, Archbishop Antoine de Vergy. In the inaugural lecture, Agrippa pronounced a prolusion in honor of the daughter of Emperor Maximilian, Margaret of Austria, Princess of Austria and Burgundy. He planned to develop the speech into a more comprehensive treatise in praise of womankind, dedicating it to Margaret. Therefore, he began to draft, but perhaps did not finish, his celebrated De nobilitate et praecellentia foeminei sexus declamatio (Declamation on the Nobility and Pre-Eminence of the Female Sex), which was published only in 1529. Agrippa’s teaching on Christian kabbalah attracted considerable interest among the members of the university and of the local Parlement, and he joined the collegium of theologians. Unfortunately, not everyone had a benevolent attitude to what sounded like an attempt to spread the “most criminal, condemned and prohibited art of kabbalah” (Expostulatio, p. 494) in Christian schools. The Franciscan Jean Catilinet, the provincial superior for Burgundy, preaching in the presence of Margaret at the court of Low Countries in Ghent, denounced Agrippa as a “judaizing heretic” (ibidem). This charge put an end to Agrippa’s teaching career in Dôle and dashed his hopes of obtaining Margaret’s favor. Returning to Germany, in the winter of 1509–1510 Agrippa went to the monastery of St. Jacob at Würzburg to meet Johannes Trithemius, Abbot of Sponheim. Over the course of a few intense days, the famous abbot and his young visitor discussed a topic of mutual interest: natural magic and its role in contemporary culture. The meeting had a crucial impact on Agrippa. He quickly finished a compendium on magic, which he had been working on for some time. The first draft of De occulta philosophia was dedicated to Trithemius, who received the manuscript shortly before 8 April 1510 and generously praised Agrippa’s commitment. The book circulated in manuscript, as evidence from Agrippa’s correspondence shows; but he continued to assemble materials in order to revise this first draft. This aim was achieved only twenty years later.

In London, where he had gone in 1510 to carry out a political and “very secret assignment” (occultissimum negotium, Defensio, F. B6), probably on the orders of Emperor Maximilian, he became familiar with John Colet, who introduced him to the study of St. Paul’s epistles. Agrippa wrote Commentariola (Little Commentaries) on the Epistle to the Romans, which he then lost in Italy and recovered only in 1523, but which remain totally unknown to us. During his stay in London, Agrippa replied to Catilinet’s accusations with a polemical Expostulatio super Expositione sua in librum De verbo mirifico cum Joanne Catilineti (Expostulation with Jean Catilinet over His Exposition of the Book On the Wonder-Working Word)—just the first in a series of countless epic battles between him and contemporary scholastic theologians. From 1511 to 1518, Agrippa was in Italy, serving Maximilian, but his military duties did not prevent him from pursuing his philosophical interests. He lectured on Plato’s Symposium (Convivium) and on the Hermetic Pimander (that is, the Corpus Hermeticum) at the University of Pavia, in 1512 and 1515 respectively. He probably believed that he might be able to achieve his academic ambitions there, but his fervent expectations were soon disappointed. After the defeat of the Swiss and Imperial troops at Marignano (13–14 September 1515), he was forced to quit teaching and to abandon Pavia. He then sought patronage at the court of William IX Paleologus, Marquis of Monferrato, to whom he promptly dedicated two little works, De homine (On Humankind) and De triplici ratione cognoscendi Deum (On the Threefold Way of Knowing God), gathering together some notes and materials he had already organized or perhaps even prepared for press, in Pavia. Both works attest to the importance of Agrippa’s contact with early sixteenth-century Italian culture. During his stay in Italy, he joined a network of friends and correspondents, who allowed him to deepen his knowledge of Neoplatonic and Hermetic literature, to sharpen his acquaintance with kabbalistic texts, and to broaden and update his bibliographical information. For a time he was in Turin, where he lectured on theological topics.

In the following years, Agrippa was in Metz (1518–1520), as the city orator and advocate (advocatus), in Geneva (1521–1523), where he practiced medicine, and, finally in Freiburg (until 1524), as the city physician. Throughout this period, he came into contact with a number of humanists who were engaging with the new religious ideas circulating at the time. Therefore, his reputation as an “occult philosopher” assumed more complex aspects. His De originali peccato declamatio (Declamation on Original Sin), written in 1518 but not printed until 1529, puzzled the dedicatee, Dietrich Wichwael, Bishop of Cyrene, and Agrippa’s friend Claude Dieudonné with regard to his interpretation of Adam’s sin as consisting in the sexual act. In Metz, he was involved in the debate on St. Anne’s triple marriage, expressing his passionate support for Jacques Lefèvre d’Étaples’ criticism of the popular legend that attributed three husbands and three daughters to her. In De Beatissimae Annae monogamia ac unico puerperio (On St. Anne’s Monogamy and Sole Childbirth, printed in Cologne, 1534), he gave a fierce reply to the accusations of heresy leveled at Lefèvre (and at himself) by three conservative monks. The defense was vehement and strongly sarcastic: no wonder Lefèvre d’Étaples reacted anxiously to Agrippa’s promise to become his ally. Meanwhile, Agrippa had successfully defended a woman of Woippy who was accused of being a witch, saving her from the stake. Thanks to these courageous positions and his intense relationships with pre-Reform circles, Agrippa was gradually assuming a by no means secondary role in the general movement against the scholastic tradition. He won the esteem of many scholars (some of them would later on join the Reformation), but, at the same time, attracted the particular attention of the religious authorities.

In spring of 1524 Agrippa moved to Lyon to take up the office of physician to the French king’s mother, Louise of Savoy. He tried to win the favor of the king’s sister, Marguerite d’Alençon, by dedicating to her his declamation De sacramento matrimonii (On the Sacrament of Marriage, 1526) in parallel Latin and French versions. Unfortunately, it was a blunder and a terrible failure. The princess (who had recently been widowed) was already hostile to the Erasmian ‘spirit’, which Agrippa referred to in order to claim the lawfulness and benefit of second marriages. Furthermore, ecclesiastical authorities were able to recognize the influence of some Erasmus’ condemned works on Agrippa’s positive attitude towards marriage, as well as the link which connected it to the treatise De sacro coniugio (On Holy Wedlock) of the Franciscan François Lambert, who had fled to Strasbourg after joining the Reformation. Agrippa’s position at court was becoming worse. His friendships, his sympathies for the work of humanist Reformers, his more and more aggressive theses—in 1526 he reworked an earlier oration or letter, Dehortatio gentilis theologiae (Dissuasion from Pagan Theology), in which he criticized contemporaries for their excessive curiosity about Hermetic theology and their disregard for Christian education—were raising doubts his religious orthodoxy. His correspondence with the Duke of Bourbon, who had betrayed the French Crown in order to side with the Emperor, called into question his political loyalties, and he was suspected of involvement in a plot. His refusal to furnish an astrological prognostication for François I and his incautious remarks about Louise’s superstition, which a friend passed on to her, sparked off her open hostility. Agrippa was stripped of his pension and forbidden to leave France. In the midst of such dramatic misadventures, he wrote his De incertitudine et vanitate scientiarum. It was a biting commentary on all human sciences and arts and a fierce attack on the moral and social assumptions of his day. Agrippa subjected the work to later revisions and enlargements, right up to the moment of publication, in 1530.

When, at last, he was allowed to leave France, Agrippa accepted the office of archivist and imperial historiographer at the court of Margaret of Austria, governor of the Low Countries, in Antwerp. He finally dedicated himself to publishing his writings. In 1529 a collection of his short treatises was printed in Antwerp by Michael Hillenius, and in 1530 another Antwerp printer, Johannes Graphaeus, brought out De vanitate. In 1531, Graphaeus also printed the enlarged version of Book I of De occulta philosophia, dedicated to Hermann von Wied, Archbishop Elector of Cologne (1477–1552), and the table of contents for Book II and III. Both De vanitate and De occulta philosophia circulated widely, thanks to further editions (in Antwerp, Cologne, and Paris), and once more Agrippa found himself in trouble with the religious authorities. The Louvain theologians, questioned by Margaret of Austria herself, condemned De vanitate as scandalous, impious and heretical, and so did the Sorbonne with respect to the Paris edition. The Parlement at Mechelin was informed of the Louvain professors’ judgment, and required Agrippa to answer their accusations. He replied with two fearless writings, refuting, point by point, the criticisms in his Apologia (Defense) and accusing, in turn, his opponents of ignorance and bad faith in his Querela (Complaint). These events obviously put an end to Agrippa’s career at Margaret’s court, and he was once again seeking a new protector. Hermann von Wied, who was both interested in occult sciences and sympathized with moderate religious reform, offered him protection and, in June 1532, brought him into his own household. Eventually, Agrippa was able to deliver the complete, final version of De occulta philosophia to the Cologne printer Johannes Soter, who in November was already typesetting it. Shortly before Christmas, however, the Dominican inquisitor Conrad Köllin denounced the book as heretical and blasphemous, getting the city’s Senate to suspend the printing. Agrippa’s impassioned and controversial appeal to the Cologne Senate (Zika 2003: 99–124) did not succeed in resolving the impasse. It was, instead, the forceful intervention of Hermann which enabled De occulta philosophia to appear, even though accompanied by an appendix including the chapters of De vanitate which criticized magic.

We are not informed about the last years of Agrippa’s life, because his correspondence stops in July 1533. He was perhaps the author of a self-defense, Dialogus de vanitate scientiarum et ruina Christianae religionis (Dialogue on the Vanity of the Sciences and the Ruin of Christian Religion), fictitiously attributed to Godoschalcus Moncordius, an otherwise unknown Cistercian monk, and printed, in all probability, by Johannes Soter in 1534 (Zambelli 1965: 220–23). On 22 February 1534, from Bonn, Agrippa addressed a legal memorandum to the Parliament of the Low Countries (Zambelli 1965: 305–12). According to his pupil Johannes Wier (1515–1565), Agrippa was in Bonn until 1535. He then returned to France, where he was arrested on the order of François I. Shortly after his release, he died in Grenoble in 1535 or, at the latest, in 1536.

2. De occulta philosophia (early draft)

Dedicating to Trithemius his first attempt as a reformer of magic, Agrippa claimed to share the common desire for the renewal of a “sublime and sacred science”, perverted by having been detached from its theoretical context and by being practiced with anti-natural means and intentions. Corrupted texts and inadequate critical and philosophical awareness had made magic a convoluted jumble of errors and obscurities, despised by the learned, mistrusted by the Church, and used with feckless irresponsibility by superstitious old witches. Instead, in its original and pure form, magic was a sacred body of knowledge, providing the possibility of human dominion over all of created nature (elemental, celestial, and intellectual).

Basically, the first draft of De occulta philosophia was structured as a survey, which owed much to Marsilio Ficino’s De vita (On Life), Giovanni Pico della Mirandola’s Oratio (de dignitate hominis, Oration [on the Dignity of Humankind]), and Johannes Reuchlin’s De verbo mirifico. These authors had already endeavored to restore magic, distinguishing (from different perspectives and with different aims) between true and false magic, between philosophy and pseudo-philosophy, between the sacred and the sacrilegious. Agrippa’s program followed a slightly different path. For Giovanni Pico, magic was “the most perfect accomplishment of natural philosophy” (Oration, p. 226). Instead, for Agrippa, it was “the most perfect accomplishment of the noblest philosophy” (totius nobilissimae philosophiae absoluta consummatio, I, 2, p. 86). This definition had significant implications. Unlike his predecessors, Agrippa conceived of magic as a comprehensive knowledge, gathering together all the cognitive data collected in the various fields of human learning, and making explicit their potentials for acting on reality. Therefore, according to the three different levels of being, there were three different operative areas to which magic applied, making it possible to distinguish three ‘forms’ of magic: natural magic, astrological (and numerological) magic, and ‘religious’ or ‘ceremonial’ magic, that is, the kabbalistic and theurgic magic. All three forms are true and good, if properly practiced in the context of the reformed magic. This assessment highlighted that Agrippa had moved away from another of his sources. In De verbo mirifico, Johannes Reuchlin had proposed a similar tripartite division in the “wonder-working art” (ars miraculorum), but he had also recognized the intrinsic risks of each “form”. Magic based on physics (natural magic) cannot be checked and is therefore limited in its powers. Magic based on astrology is often false and confused. As far as ceremonial magic is concerned, goetia, which relies on malign demons, is clearly superstitious; theurgy, which attempts to establish contact with benign demons, is practicable in theory, but complicated and dangerous in practice. Therefore, Reuchlin favored a more reliable and efficacious alternative, a fourth way, called the “art of soliloquy” (ars soliloquia), based on the use of the holy name of Christ. While sharing Reuchlin’s enthusiasm for this thaumaturgic philosophy, Agrippa’s view was broader, also embracing Ficino’s astrological magic, Pico’s natural magic, and Neoplatonic and Hermetic theurgic magic. The all-inclusiveness of his “restored” magic also allowed him to recover the legacy of the medieval tradition (of Albertus Magnus, above all) and even to pay some attention to popular beliefs—justifying them within a Neoplatonic conceptual framework.

In Book I Agrippa explores the elemental world, reviewing the manifest and occult virtues of stones, plants, animals, and human individuals. Occult virtues, on which natural magic mainly focuses, are explained by the relationship of causal correspondence, connecting the eternal exemplars, the ideas, to the sublunary forms through the stars. In his Neoplatonic animated cosmos, all things are harmoniously related to each other. Magical activity consists chiefly in attracting the “spirit of the world” (spiritus mundi). It is diffused everywhere and distributes life to everything, acting as the mediator between heavenly souls and earthly bodies, and allowing a sympathetic exchange between the different levels of the ontological hierarchy.

Book II, dedicated to astrology, opens with the celebrated image of the magus as the go-between who subjects sublunary world to the stars. The knowledge of the laws, governing how the celestial influences flow down to the earth, enables the magus to collaborate actively with nature, modifying the phenomenal processes. To describe astrological images, attracting astral virtues, Agrippa pillaged the technical details described by Ficino in De vita coelitus comparanda (On Obtaining Life from the Heavens), but he also went back to the medieval tradition.

In Book III, Agrippa commits the physical and celestial worlds to the protection of religion, which has the task of guaranteeing a rigorously non-superstitious magic, immune to demonic deceptions. Religion provides the magus with a model of moral improvement, allowing him to realize the Hermetic ideal of the perfect philosopher, perfect magus, and perfect “priest” (sacerdos). In describing the human path to Hermetic deification, the first draft of Book III makes a clear distinction between faith and science. Agrippa draws on Reuchlin to define the link between illumination, offered by God to the human mind through faith, and reason, which can gain true knowledge only by receiving it from the mind. Reason, after attaining the innate contents of the mind, produces a science which is legitimized by its divine origins and is therefore not susceptible to the assault of doubts and errors. This was only an initial (and somewhat vague) approach to a topic which would play an increasingly crucial role in Agrippa’s thought. At this time, the primacy of faith, as expressed by Reuchlin, functioned chiefly as the basis for a powerful and reliable operative practice. As far as kabbalistic magic was concerned, Agrippa seemingly played down Reuchlin’s raptures about the Hebrew language, assimilating the sacred Hebrew names, instituted by God as the vehicles of his power, to the so-called “strange” or “foreign words” (barbara verba) of ancient theology and Neoplatonic theurgy.

The early version of De occulta philosophia was, in many respects, an original attempt. Nevertheless, it did not perfectly succeed in organizing Agrippa’s different and varying sources into a coherent structure—especially as regards Book III, which played a pivotal role in connecting magic to the religious foundation of learning. Not without reason, the dedicatee Trithemius noticed these limitations, urging his pupil “not to imitate bullocks, but to emulate birds” (Epistolae, pp. 503-04)—that is, to turn his mind to the metaphysical Unity as a prior requirement for all magic activity.

3. De triplici ratione cognoscendi Deum

The key to understanding the internal coherence of Agrippa’s thought is to be found in his deepening interest in Neoplatonic and Hermetic writings, which allowed him to define the relationship between faith and reason in a more comprehensive perspective. In the Plotinian (and Ficinian) theory of the tripartite division of psychological faculties (mens, ratio, idolum), mind (mens) represents the highest function, the head (caput) of the soul, the divine spark present in every human being; when God creates each soul, it is into this supreme portion that he infuses the innate ideas, which mind directly intuits in God. Reason (ratio) is an intermediate function between the mind, which continually communicates with God, and the lower powers (idolum, that is, the sensory faculties), which are connected to the material world. Reason, the seat of the will, is free to conform to either of the contrasting directions indicated to it by the other parts of the soul.

This more structured view was already capitalized in the short treatise De triplici ratione cognoscendi Deum (On the Threefold Way of Knowing God), dedicated to William Paleologus in 1516, but published only in 1529, in a version somewhat expanded by Agrippa before printing. The term ratio had many meanings for Agrippa. Firstly, it recounted the ‘way’ of divine revelation. To manifest himself to mankind, God wrote three books, by which the three different religious cultures were able to know him. Ancient philosophers, reading the book of nature, knew God through the created world; Hebrew theologians, reading the book of the law, knew God through the angels and the prophets; Christians, reading the book of the Gospel, gained perfect knowledge of God through his son, made man. Secondly, ratio referred to the three “steps” (gradus) in the spiritual ascent of every human soul to God: sense perception, rational knowledge, and spiritual knowledge. Finally, like the scholastics, Agrippa intended ratio as the epistemological criterion by which philosophical schools performed their theological investigations and reached their understanding of God’s essence.

Agrippa projected the history of the individual soul and of philosophy back into the time preceding human history: Adam’s sin is the archetypal figure of the moral choices and intellectual options of his descendants. Adam willingly renounced true knowledge when he, trusting more in Eve than in God, presumed that he could achieve a knowledge capable of making him equal to God. Similarly, each of us renews the original sin committed by Adam when our reason denies that it is created and proudly proclaims an autonomy of its own, shattering its harmonious relationship with God. Once the hierarchy of cognition has been destabilized, reason strives to find its contents in the senses, which are fallacious and deceptive, and builds up a science which is both dubious and vain: devoid of foundation, inert, and morally pernicious. Original sin is also repeated in the schools of contemporary theologians, who try to know God by the wretched means of their rebellious reason. This is the science of those, who live “in the realm of the flesh” (Romans 8:9)—the science of the “sophists of God” (theosophistae): fatuous, arrogant, quarrelsome and immoral, unable of transforming their notions into actions, that is, of solving the crisis of which they are both authors and victims. Contemporary culture, as the fruit of this rebellious reason (which is, after all, Aristotelian and scholastic reason), is fated only to describe, to lightly touch on the structure of reality, without being able to penetrate it.

Agrippa was not professing any form of anti-intellectualism, but he was applying the Platonic (broadly speaking) model of the tripartite soul to the Christian way of knowledge. In accordance with this pattern, if reason respects its subordination to the mind, that is, to the message, which God has implanted directly in the soul, it fulfils the role which has been assigned to it in the project of creation, which is to know God by means of the book of nature. On the other hand, since the book of nature is written by the hand of God, the fundamental goodness of the world is implied; and it is also implied that human beings have the ability to read these pages and are, indeed, obliged to do so. Reason is therefore perfectly literate and legitimate when it comes to deciphering this bundle of communicative signs. Nonetheless, the book of nature is a means through which God helps us to return to our origin. Therefore, the reading should be done with our eyes fixed more on the author of the book than on its contents: the knowledge of physical reality is merely a way of retracing through sensible objects the cosmic process of love, which is centered on the eternal Good, “beginning, middle and end” of everything which exists. Humanity’s greatness resides purely and simply in its capacity to grasp God by contemplating his works, the created symbols which bear witness to their creator. Moreover, when reason “silences” the sensory part of the soul and turns itself inwards to its highest function, it becomes conscious of the constant illumination of the mind by God. At that moment, reason grasps essences by an intuitive act which is superior to the purely rational one, insofar as it is a “contact of the essence with God”. This is not a mystical experience. It is an intellectual experience, founded on some intuitive philosophical certainties, which revelation proves true. Faith (fides) does not provide new contents, but unveils the deep sense of the existing contents of the reason, which is operating in harmony with the mind. A truly Christian philosopher, however, cannot be satisfied with having achieved individual knowledge. The commandment to love our neighbor requires us to become “leaders of the blind” (Matthew 15:14), “a corrector of the foolish” and “a teacher of the immature” (Romans 2:20). Contemporary “bad shepherds” (pupils of “the school of Satan”, as the only preserved manuscript of De triplici ratione called them) neglect their spiritual responsibilities. Therefore, the “new” Christian philosopher has to turn into theologian, teaching the path to general redemption to his brothers in Christ. In addition, he has to take care of the social benefits deriving from his knowledge. Agrippa slightly, but significantly, modified the most celebrated sentence of the Hermetic Asclepius: “A human, Asclepius, is a great miracle!”) by stating: “A Christian human is a great miracle!” (Magnum miraculum est homo Christianus!, p. 146).

The allegorical interpretation of the original sin which Agrippa borrowed from Paulus Ricius’ Isagoge (Introduction) was repeated two years later in his De originali peccato (On Original Sin), written in 1518, but published in 1529. Adam is faith, the foundation of reason. The Tree of Life, that is, the privilege of knowing and contemplating God, was reserved to him. Eve is reason, which was allowed to have a relationship with the snake, that is, with material things and the senses. Unlike Adam, she was not forbidden to eat from the Tree of Knowledge, that is, to know the physical world. Our ancestors were equally responsible for original sin, but in different ways: Eve/reason, because she placed trust and hope in the senses and weakened faith’s firmness with her arguments; Adam/faith, because he, wishing to indulge his woman, turned away from God to the sensory world, relying entirely on the conclusions which reason drew from senses. Agrippa did not generally censure the potential of reason, but emphasized the hierarchical link between faith and reason. We are not allowed to debate de divinis (“about divine matters”), in which we must only have faith and hope. Instead, we can speculate about created beings, but not have faith and hope in them.

The allegory was also invoked in his famous eulogy of women, De nobilitate et praecellentia foeminei sexus (On the Nobility and Superiority of the Feminine Sex), by which Agrippa hoped to ingratiate himself with Margaret of Austria. Among all the topics which he meticulously collected from the rich repository of this literary genre, he also proposed a more philosophical argument in favor of women, analyzing Eve’s role in original sin. It was Adam, who introduced spiritual death into the world, since Eve was not prohibited from eating the fruit of the Tree of Knowledge: thus, she was not guilty of disobeying God. Agrippa did not claim that Eve was completely without sin. More modestly, he maintained that her sin did not entail transgressing God’s commandment; she sinned nevertheless because she allowed the snake to tempt her and became the occasion of Adam’s sin. She was deceived and went astray—not “involuntarily” (Van der Poel 1997: 210), but “ignorantly”. What should we understand by “ignorantly”? Agrippa could not seriously regard Eve’s ignorance as a defect in her spiritual progress (as Augustine did in his The Literal Meaning of Genesis) or as a weakness of her spiritual faculties (as Isotta Nogarola did in her Dialogue on Adam and Eve). In the opening of the treatise, Agrippa, recalling humankind’s creation (Genesis 1:26–7), underlined that both Adam and Eve had been created in God’s image and likeness: as rational souls, both shared the same psychological faculties, the same teleology, and the same moral freedom. The seeming inconsistency can be resolved by interpreting the biblical progenitors as “figures” of Neoplatonic psychology. Reason’s ignorantia Dei (“ignorance of God”) is not a passive “not-knowing” (which is, in any case, unthinkable, because God is not concealed in unfathomable transcendence, but “shines everywhere” in nature, and, above all, inside humans). On the contrary, reason’s ignorantia Dei is an active “neglecting”, a will to turn away from God and a pride in being an end in itself.

4. De incertitudine et vanitate scientiarum

It is not possible to establish the extent to which the declamatio invectiva which Agrippa announced to his friend Jean Chapelain in September 1526 was really finished at that time. We do know, however, that when Johannes Grapheus published it in 1530, some parts at least had been expanded and reworked, according to Agrippa’s custom (Nauert 1965: 108, n. 11; Zambelli 1992: 81, n. 40). The work was reprinted many times and was also translated into German (1534), Italian (1543), English (1569), French (1582), and Dutch (1651).

Richard Popkin underlined that Agrippa’s declamation does not contain the “serious epistemological analysis” one would expect from a skeptical debate and suggested that it should be considered as an expression of anti-intellectualism and biblical fundamentalism (Popkin 2003: 29). This reading, however, leaves the key question unresolved: such an anti-intellectualism or biblical fundamentalism is difficult to reconcile with Agrippa’s long-standing interest in precisely those sciences which by then should have been swept away by the appeal to verbum Dei (“word of God”). It is undeniably true that in De vanitate the moral angle prevails over the epistemological critique. This is because Agrippa also looked at trades, professions, pastimes, and social types, none of which were susceptible to epistemological analysis. Moreover, when discussing a science, he was primarily interested in focusing on how it was used and on its concrete effects on society, rather than in investigating its methods and subjects. Some scholars have identified De vanitate as the result of a profound personal crisis (psychological, religious, or cultural), which led Agrippa to a radical criticism of the system of occult doctrines and of his own intellectual choices. No doubt, the circumstances of his life between 1526 and 1530 influenced the tone of the work which he was preparing, accentuating its harshness and inspiring some of its more polemical and audacious pages. Nonetheless, it is unlikely that, all of the sudden, Agrippa abandoned his philosophical convictions, solely because of indignation at the treatment he suffered at the court of Louise of Savoy (Weeks 1993: 120–24). Likewise, the hypothesis of an intellectual upheaval (Keefer 1988: 614–53; Zambelli 2000: 41) remains merely conjectural. Agrippa’s supposed disbelief in science (and, above all, in astrology and magic) contrasts with his continuing work on De occulta philosophia and with his project for a reform of the magical tradition, based on a new vision of science. It is important to recognize that there were serious motivations behind his fierce attack on the foundations of knowledge. Bowen (1972: 249–56) and Korkowski (1976: 594–607), reducing De vanitate to a simple exercise of rhetoric in the fashionable literary genre of the paradox, correctly outlined the work’s formal characteristics; however, they did not sufficiently take into account its philosophical intentions and turned its subversive implications into something quite inoffensive. De vanitate proposed a reform project, one which was broader, more complex, and more radical than that of its model, Erasmus’ Praise of Folly (Laus stultitiae).

Agrippa’s aim was to pass judgment on the condition, methods, and practitioners of the philosophical and theological schools which dominated his time. His verdict is undoubtedly very severe. He believed that contemporary culture, lost in useless sophisms, was no longer able to fulfill its task of educating Christian people and promoting their spiritual well-being. The social fabric had become torn by corruption, by political and religious struggles, and by heresies and superstitions. He did not, however, intend De vanitate to be merely destructive. His aim was also to propose a cultural alternative, delineating a different philosophical approach, capable of forming a new intellectual élite, who would be seriously interested in the moral and religious progress of human community.

Certainly, the most striking aspect of the declamatio is its critical stance. The all-encompassing polemical parade emphasizes that human “inventions” (inventiones)—grammar as well as dance, theology as well as hunting, ethics as well as dice games—are nothing more than opinions, devoid of coherence and stability, and irreparably harmful to support the spiritual health of believers. The discord which divides practitioners of each branch of science attests to the intrinsic weakness of the findings of natural reason, which proceeds by conjectures, subject to refutation. Everything reason devises and carries out, relying on its own strength alone, is fallacious, useless, and damaging: “the structure of the sciences is so risky and unstable that it is much safer not to know anything than to have knowledge” (1, p. 5). The happiest life is the life of the ignorant.

The usual compilation of discordant opinions of philosophers was partly shaped by texts of the ancient skeptics; but for the most part Agrippa made use of more recent sources: Ficino, Reuchlin, and Francesco Giorgio Veneto. There are no quotations from Gianfrancesco Pico’s Examen vanitatis doctrinae gentium, the first detailed reading of the work of Sextus Empiricus (Schmitt 1967: 237–42). This significant omission suggests that Agrippa did not agree with the skeptical fideism expressed by Gianfrancesco. De vanitate did not, in fact, question the human ability to know causes. Rather, it questioned the capacity of Aristotelian epistemology to account for the nature of things. In chapter 7, Agrippa states that knowledge based on sense perception is not able to guarantee a sure and truthful experience, since the senses are fallible; nor does it succeed in revealing the causes and properties of phenomena or in knowing what is only intelligible, since this escapes the grasp of the senses. Not all human knowledge was open to question, however. Instead, Agrippa, by proving that a sense-based theory of knowledge cannot produce science, intended to introduce another epistemology, one which he regarded as the foundation for true knowledge. So, in chapter 52, “On the Soul”, he did not uphold even the façade of skepticism. “Demonic Aristotle” (daemoniacus Aristoteles) made the soul dependent on the nature of the body, defining it as “the first perfection of a natural body possessing organs, which potentially has life” (Aristotle, De anima II.1). “Divine Plato” (divinus ille Plato) aligned himself with those philosophers (Zoroaster, Hermes, and Orpheus) who had defined the soul as a divine substance: the “product of an incorporeal maker” and dependent “solely on the power of its efficient cause, not on the bowels of matter” (52, pp. 109-10). Agrippa noted the disagreement between Aristotle and Plato on this subject, not in order to lead his readers to a skeptical “suspension of judgment” (epoché). Rather, he intentionally contrasted two different models of rationality, explicitly weighing up their value. At least on this matter, the “ancient theology” (prisca theologia) and the Platonic school were found to be consistent with the criterion of truth, the Holy Scriptures.

The real intentions of De vanitate have to be extracted from deep inside the text, hidden beneath more polemical and provocative statements. The sciences of their own accord “do not procure for us any divine felicity which transcends the capacity of man, except perhaps that felicity which the serpent promised to our ancestors”; but in itself “every science is both bad and good” and deserves whatever praise “it can derive from the probity of its possessor” (1, p. 21). Agrippa appropriated here the Aristotelian principle of the ethical neutrality of science: it is the spiritual attitude of the knower, his “integrity” (probitas), which constitutes the moral criterion of the discipline and ensures good or bad usage. From the cultural point of view, the destructive action of skepticism puts an end to the discussion between the schools by eliminating one of the two contenders, that is, all philosophers whose doctrines are built on the foundation of sensory experience. From the pedagogical point of view, however, skepticism is no more than a preliminary training. Systematic debate about sensory representations and the suspension of judgment concerning the appearances of the material world free the soul from false opinions, demonstrating the inadequacy of empiricism and directing the search for truth towards the intelligible.

Purification leads to a new spiritual attitude, which makes the philosopher capable of undertaking the route to true knowledge. Truth, in fact, is grasped only by turning inwards, to the mind, where God implanted the innate ideas when he created the soul. Agrippa’s acceptance of the Neoplatonic theory of knowledge is positively expressed in the final peroration of De vanitate, when he invites his readers to abandon the schools of the sophists in order to regain awareness of the cognitive inheritance to which every soul has an original entitlement. Agrippa refers to the Academics alongside Holy Scripture to support the idea that human beings have an innate realm of knowledge, which needs to be recovered by means of a suitable paideia, or program of education. The return to original perfection is an ‘illumination’—not a mystical illumination, but an intellectual one: the reminiscence and re-appropriation of self-knowledge. Ultimately, illumination is the knowledge of the self as “mind” (mens) or “intellect” (intellectus).

In this sense, Agrippa defines faith as the “foundation of reason” (fundamentum rationis), that is, the criterion, guarantee, and firm basis of human knowledge. Revelation is without doubt the absolute and complete expression of truth; but it originates from the same source as the contents of the mind, on which the activity of reason is dependent. Since God is the sole source of truth, the tradition of faith is homogeneous with philosophical contemplation, which finds its justification in revelation. Through divine will, rationality and its higher level of “spiritual intelligence” are able to establish a relationship of continuity. For this reason, rational science and all its practical applications gain authenticity and legitimacy if they develop within a theological framework. This does not mean that reason has to draw its contents directly from Scripture. Rather, it means that the contents of science, procured by the exercise of reason, are “true” when they do not contradict divine design, do not hinder the spiritual progress of the Christian, and contribute to the good of humanity and the world. Certainly, the architect will not seek technical instructions for how to put up his building in the Bible. Instead, he and those who commission him need to seek in it an indication of the “manner” (modus) and “end” (finis) of this discipline. Architecture would be an art and science “extraordinarily necessary and beautiful” in itself and capable of making a large contribution to the well-being of the civil community, if humankind had not rendered it vain and noxious by their excessive use of it “for the simple exhibition of the riches” and by heedlessly destroying the natural surroundings.

In De vanitate, Agrippa does not put faith in opposition to science or the Holy Scriptures in opposition to human books. He instead puts Aristotelian philosophy, worldly science and the source of unbelief in opposition to “Platonic” philosophy, the model of a Christian “science in the word of God” (scientia in verbo Dei). With this expression, Agrippa refers to a religiously orientated science: a science which can move freely in the sphere of the “visible manifestations of God” (visibilia Dei) in order to know his “invisible essentials” (invisibilia) and to trace the beginning and origin of everything. He does this in the awareness of the harmony between faith and reason, which scholastic Aristotelian philosophy had disowned, infecting the world with a plague of “petty syllogisms” (ratiunculae), sophisms, and impertinent questions about God. There is, in sum, a ‘divine’ path to knowledge, which Plato and the ancient theologians founded on God and which deals with God. And there is a “demonic” path, which Aristotle constituted merely on human abilities and which deals with lower things: it is demonic, because it renews and perpetuates the sin of Adam, inspired by Satan and his proud ambition to make himself equal to the creator in the knowledge of good and evil.

Agrippa’s distinction between different forms of rationality—valued differently according to their basis and their final point of view—allows us to regard his declamatio invectiva as not belonging to a true and proper profession of skepticism, of general anti-intellectualism, or of rigorous fideism. Instead, it can be realigned with the anti-Aristotelian and anti-scholastic critiques of Ficino, Reuchlin, and Giorgio. Agrippa did not propose abandonment in God in the undifferentiated indifference of “neither this one nor that one” advocated by Sextus Empiricus. In his view, skepticism constituted an exercise in education, necessary for pointing the way towards the apprehension of truth. In the final digression, “In Praise of the Ass”, Agrippa seemingly invites his readers to put down the baggage of the human sciences and return to being “naked and simple asses”, and thus newly capable of carrying on their own backs the mysteries of divine wisdom, like the ass which carried Jesus into Jerusalem. This ironic exhortation is polemical: those who must be subjected to metamorphosis into an ass are the “noble doctors in sciences”, professing a purely human (or rather, demonic) science. For scholastic theologians, the motto “To know nothing is the happiest life” (nihil scire foelicissima vita) is valid, since “there is nothing more fatal than a science stuffed with impiety” (1, p. 4). Philosophy should be a religious progress—or, rather, a regressus, a return to the source of being.

5. De occulta philosophia (final draft)

In De vanitate, Agrippa did not make any explicit recantation of his passion for occult sciences (Keefer 1988: 618); he simply admitted that there might have been something wrong in his juvenile work on magic, because of his adolescent curiosity. In fact, the renewal of magic continued to be a central feature of his intellectual journey. Between 1530 and 1533, right in the middle of his violent battle against theologians and conservatives, he was preparing De occulta philosophia for publication, entrusting his last hope of a secure financial support to the same work to which he had committed his desire for fame and fortune twenty years earlier. Although in the meantime his religious concerns had deepened, he did not perceive any conflict between his involvement in theological debates and his persistent interest in the task of rebuilding magic. In his mind, they were two coherent aspects of a single project, as he had already pointed out in De triplici ratione cognoscendi Deum. There Agrippa had made clear that reforming culture on the basis of the solid certainty of God’s illumination also implied regaining humankind’s original perfection and thaumaturgic ability, which Adam owned by right before he sinned.

Comparison of the 1510 dedication copy, sent by Agrippa to Trithemius (MS Würzburg, M.ch.q.50), with the printed final edition (Cologne 1533), reveals the careful and thorough revision and enlargement to which the first draft was subjected. The book doubled in length, and fresh ideas and references were included. In updating the text, Agrippa mostly drew on works consistent with the sources he had already used in drafting the initial version. Between 1510 and 1533, he had studied a number of texts which he had previously been unaware of or neglected (Ficino’s commentaries on Plato and on Plotinus; Giovanni Pico’s Conclusiones, Heptaplus, and Disputationes adversus astrologiam divinatricem; Lodovico Lazzarelli’s Crater Hermetis; and Gianfrancesco Pico’s De rerum praenotione) or which had been published in the meantime (some of Erasmus’ writings; Paulus Ricius’ commentaries on Hebrew writings; Reuchlin’s De arte cabalistica; and Francesco Giorgio’s De harmonia mundi). Agrippa’s vast exploration of books allowed him to re-orient his youthful project, providing a definitive justification of his aim to restore in full the religious, cognitive, and practical scope of ancient magic. This “reformed magic” (magia reformata) would not only guarantee to the magus mastery over nature and the ability to attract astral and angelic virtues, but would also assure his ascent to the First Principle.

The revised version of De occulta philosophia offers extensive proof of this significant qualitative shift. The original tripartite structure was given a new metaphysical structure, which powerfully underlined the idea of the cosmos as an epiphany of the divine. Thanks to the influence of Giorgio’s De harmonia mundi, Agrippa was able to adopt a radically new approach to natural magic. Now, Book I explicitly contemplates the material world as the receptacle of divine and presents the occult virtues as an example of the living links connecting the terrestrial forms to the First Cause through the chain of the higher intermediaries (stars and spiritual essences). The “perfection of both science and practice” is guaranteed by the ability to change the impure back to the pure, and plurality back to simplicity. In significant additions “on the properties of elements” (chapters 3–6), William Newman (1982) recognized the description of the alchemical reduction of elemental earth to the purity of first matter. There are three orders of elements, corresponding to the three levels of being: pure elements, unmixed and incorruptible; compound elements, multiplex, varied and impure, but which can be reduced to “pure simplicity” (pura simplicitas); lastly, decomposed elements, convertible into one another. Earth, which confers solidity on other elements, mixing with them but without changing into them, is the receptacle of every celestial influence, because it is continuously animated by the virtues conveyed by the spiritus: so, earth is “the foundation and mother of everything”, because it encloses the seminal virtues of all creation. Therefore, having undergone the process of purification and simplification, it becomes “the purest remedy for restoring and preserving us”. The process of universal simplification of the elements can be carried out by reducing earth to the original purity of the first matter. Newman explained the nature of this process, referring to chapter 4 of Book II, on the power of the number one. Here, Agrippa traces the presence of unity in all levels of existence: God in the archetypal world, the anima mundi in the intellectual one, the Sun in the heavenly world, the heart in man, and Lucifer in hell. In the elemental world, the one is the philosopher’s stone, “embodying all wonders”, without which “neither alchemy, nor natural magic may attain their perfect end”. Agrippa’s source, as Newman has pointed out, was a letter in which Trithemius gave a cosmological interpretation of the Hermetic text “Emerald Tablet” (Tabula Smaragdina), identifying the alchemical opus as the universal “path to the highest unity” (Epistolae, pp. 471-73).

Book II introduces a massive quantity of “technical” references, in some part influenced by the corpus of magical manuscripts which had belonged to Trithemius and which came into Agrippa’s possession in 1520. This updating, however, depended for the most part on epistolary exchanges of texts and ideas with his correspondents. Despite his violent attack on the divinatory arts in De vanitate, he presented here a more comprehensive treatment of astrology. After all, magic (although “reformed”) could not dispense with astrology. Occult virtues can be explained only in terms of the heavenly qualities conveyed by the rays which emanate from stars. It is each individual’s horoscope which determines his or her specific powers. Even the relationships of “attraction or repulsion” (amicitia vel lis) between sublunary bodies correspond to the relationships between celestial bodies. Agrippa insistently emphasizes the link connecting magic to astrology, defining the latter as “the much-needed key for all secrets”. In recognizing the pivotal role played by astrology, Agrippa seems to contradict his harsh judgment of this science in De vanitate: fallacious conjecture, practiced by superstitious, ignorant, and mendacious followers. The contradiction is only apparent, however. Like any other human science, astrology is both bad and good. It is bad in the hands of those who pass off a conjecture as an infallible fact, thus denying man’s freedom and the divine providential design. It is good in the hands of the Christian magus, who uses it to reveal that God shines everywhere and to benefit his own kind. In the context of Agrippa’s purpose in De occulta philosophia, good (that is, non-deterministic) astrology remains the key to rebuilding true Christian magic.

Book III was most affected by Agrippa’s meticulous recasting of the treatise. Through his contact with Latin kabbalistic texts (both, translations from Hebrew literature as well as works by Christian followers), Agrippa was able to insert many new chapters: on the Sephiroth, that is, the ten attributes or emanations surrounding the infinite; on the ten names of God; and on angels and demons. His (second-hand) openness to the Hebrew tradition inspired a more mature approach to a number of essential issues. In particular, the topic that humanity is created “in the image of God” became a more developed account of the human being as a “small world” (microcosmus). Juxtaposing the original nucleus, drawn from his own unfinished Dialogus de homine (Dialogue on Humankind), with selected passages from the doctrine of the Zohar, the most important kabbalistic work (via Giorgio’s De harmonia mundi), Agrippa was able to elaborate further his cherished doctrine of three parts of human soul. Since soul’s three parts (neshama, ruah, and nephesch in Hebrew) have different origins and natures, they also have different destinies. After the body’s death, the sensitive soul (nephesch, idolum) immediately dissolves. Mind (neshama), as the breath of God, is immune from sin and returns immediately to its abode, reuniting with its origin. Reason (ruah), by contrast, must undergo judgment with regard to the choices it has made in life: it will participate in the beatific vision if it has followed the way of the mind; it will be damned and reduced to the status of an evil demon if it has made itself a slave of the sensitive soul. In this way, the topic of humankind as created in the image of God assumed a more defined eschatological meaning. In Agrippa’s view, the Pauline “You are the temple of God” (I Corinthians 3:16) meant recognizing the presence of God in each human being—the mind, which characterizes the peculiar dignity of the microcosmus in conformity with humankind’s privilege of being made in the image of God. Interiority became the foundation of the intellectual and religious life. The cultural background of the magus must be wide-ranging, but his claim to perfection is to be founded on his self-consciousness.

The path to attaining wisdom requires moral and intellectual training (dignificatio). Firstly, “natural” perfection (dignitas) is needed, that is, the perfect physical and mental disposition granted by a favorable horoscope (the same which Jesus Christ had). Avicenna’s doctrine of the “perfect human being” (homo perfectus), the prophet, is recognizable here. According to Agrippa, however, those who were not born under this favorable constellation can replace the natural dignitas which they lack with an “artificial” one, using selected foodstuffs, natural remedies, and a proper lifestyle. The second requirement is the “merit” (dignitas meritoria), that is, the overcoming of corporeal passions and sensitive impressions, the recovery of knowledge, and the mastery of everything: when reason subjects itself to mind, man’s soul becomes a “soul standing and not falling” (anima stans et non cadens) and is able to perform miracles “by God’s virtue” (in virtute Dei). The third requirement is “godliness” (ars religiosa), that is, the constant and pious practicing of sacred ceremonies, which are metaphors and perceptible signs of the transformation worked by God in us. This does not mean the requirement to carry out initiatory rituals in order to gain access to esoteric and supra-rational mysteries. Agrippa’s appeal to spiritual purification was essential precisely because his book made known to everyone the ‘secrets’ of magic. Only a person who is “perfectly pious and truly religious”, however, can legitimately perform ‘true’ and ‘pure’ magic. This is why spiritual rebirth (and, hence, magic) is not available to everyone: the divine spark which is naturally present in each individual is completely inactive in the majority of humankind, whose reason is overwhelmed by the impulses of their senses.

Agrippa’s overall oeuvre may be regarded as an uninterrupted meditation on humanity: the meaning of its existence, its possibility of gaining not only eternal bliss, but also happiness on earth. From this point of view, Agrippa may be considered as a “humanist theologian” (Van der Poel 1997). Nonetheless, he proposed a radical revision of the very idea of theology. It should not be a “subalternating” or higher “science”, placed at the end of a long and complex training, as medieval scholastics had done. Instead, theology must be an isagogic, or introductory, knowledge, since its task was to guide Christian people in their moral improvement, as well as in their earthly well-being. Agrippa’s theology, more than a philosophical treatment of God, was, above all, a serious reflection on humankind, with the goal of leading it to self-consciousness and, then, making it fully aware of its origin and its final end. Ultimately, Agrippa may be better defined as a “civic theologian”. The specific intentions of his works, their literary genres, and the personal background to their composition are all very different, which to some extent may explain certain inconsistencies between them. Nevertheless, despite every apparent contradiction and ambiguity presented by an impetuous, polemical, and very often foolhardy personality such as Agrippa, he always assessed human knowledge (including magic) with respect to its awareness of the relationship which binds man to God. The way to truth lies not in the rifts between different schools of thought or in philosophical distinctions, but in self-knowledge and self-awareness.


Primary Sources

Works by Agrippa

  • Opera, 2 volumes, Lyon, per Beringos fratres, [n.d.]. [The imprint of this edition is false, since the Bering firm had ceased publishing several decades before. Zambelli (1972: 149–50) suggested attributing it to the publisher Tommaso Guarino of Basel in 1580]. Repr. Hildesheim-New York: Olms, 1970.
  • Apologia adversus calumnias propter declamationem De vanitate scientiarum et excellentia verbi Dei, sibi per aliquos Lovanienses theologos intentatas. Querela super calunnia ob eandem Declamationem per aliquos sceleratissimos sycophantas apud Caesaream maiestatem nefarie ac proditorie illata, [n.p.], 1533.
  • De arte chemica (On Alchemy), edited by Sylvain Matton, with an Seventeenth-Century English Translation, Paris and Milan: S.É.H.A and Arché, 2014.
  • De beatissimae Annae monogamia, ac unico puerperio propositiones abbreviatae et articulatae iuxta disceptationem Iacobi Fabri Stapulensis in libro De tribus et una … Defensio propositionum praenarratarum contra quendam Dominicastrum earundem impugnatorem … Quaedam epistolae super eadem materia atque super lite contra eiusdem ordinis haereticorum magistro habita, [n.p.], 1534.
  • De incertitudine et vanitate scientiarum et artium atque de excellentia verbi Dei declamatio invectiva, [Antwerp, 1530], in Opera, II, pp. 1–314.
  • De nobilitate et praecellentia foeminei sexus, edited by Roland Antonioli and Charles Béné, translated by Odette Sauvage, Geneva: Droz, 1990.
  • De occulta philosophia libri tres, [n.p. (Cologne)], 1533. Photomechanic reprint, edited by Karl Anton Nowotny, Graz: Akademish Druck- und Verlagsanstalt, 1967.
  • De occulta philosophia libri tres, edited by Vittoria Perrone Compagni, Leiden and Cologne: Brill, 1992.
  • De originali peccato declamatio, in Opera, II, pp. 550–65.
  • De sacramento matrimonii, in Opera, II, pp. 536–49.
  • De triplici ratione cognoscendi Deum, edited and translated by Vittoria Perrone Compagni, Ermetismo e cristianesimo in Agrippa. Il “De triplici ratione cognoscendi Deum”, Florence: Polistampa, 2005.
  • Dehortatio gentilis theologiae, in Opera, II, pp. 482–91.
  • Dialogus de homine, edited by Paola Zambelli, Rinascimento, II s., 5 (1965), App. I, pp. 295–304.
  • Dialogus de vanitate scientiarum et ruina christianae relligionis, edited by Paola Zambelli, Rinascimento, II s., 5 (1965), pp. 249–94.
  • Expostulatio super Expositione sua in librum De verbo mirifico cum Ioanne Catilineti, in Opera, II, pp. 492–98.
  • In artem brevem Raymundi Lullii commentaria, in Opera, II, pp. 315–451.

Other Primary Sources

  • Aristotle, De anima, in Barnes, Jonathan (ed.), The Complete Works of Aristotle, I, Princeton: Princenton University Press, 1984.
  • Augustine, Aurelius, The Literal Meaning of Genesis, translated by John H. Taylor, New York: Newman, 1982.
  • Erasmus, Praise of Folly, in Grant, John N (ed.), Collected Works, 27, Toronto: University of Toronto Press, 1986.
  • Tabula smaragdina, edited in Julius Ruska, Tabula smaragdina. Ein Beitrag zur Geschichte der Hermetischen Literatur, Heidelberg: Winter, 1926.
  • Ficino, Marsilio, Three Books of Life, edited and and translated by Carol V. Kaske and John R. Clark, Binghamton: Medieval and Renaissance Texts and Studies, 1989.
  • Hermes Trismegistus, Hermetica. The Greek Corpus Hermeticum and the Latin Asclepius, translated by Brian P. Copenhaver, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992.
  • Giorgio Veneto, Francesco, De harmonia mundi, Venice: Bernardinus de Vitalibus, 1525.
  • Lambert, François, De sacro coniugio commentarius, Nuremberg: Petrius, 1525.
  • Lazzarelli, Lodovico, Crater Hermetis, edited in Claudio Moreschini, Storia dell’ermetismo cristiano, Brescia: Morcelliana, 2000, pp. 303–39.
  • Nogarola, Isotta, Dialogue on Equal or Inequal Sin of Adam and Eve, in Complete Writings, edited and translated by Margaret L. King and Diana Robin, Chicago and London: Chicago University Press, 2003, pp. 145–58.
  • Pico della Mirandola, Gianfrancesco, De rerum praenotione, Strasbourg: Ioannes Knoblochus, 1506.
  • –––, Examen vanitatis doctrinae gentium ac veritatis christianae disciplinae, s.l.: Ioannes Maciochium, 1520.
  • Pico della Mirandola, Giovanni, Conclusiones, edited and translated by Stephen A. Farmer, Syncretism in the West: Pico’s 900 Theses (1486), Tempe: Medieval and Renaissance Texts and Studies, 1998.
  • –––, Disputationes adversus astrologiam divinatricem, edited and translated by Eugenio Garin, Torino: Aragno, 2004.
  • –––, Heptaplus, edited and translated by Eugenio Garin, Firenze: Vallecchi: 1942, pp. 167–383.
  • –––, Oration on the Dignity of Man, translated by Francesco Borghesi, Michael Papio and Massimo Riva, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge 2012.
  • Plato, Symposium, in John M. Cooper (ed.), Plato: Complete Works, Indianapolis: Hackett, 1997, pp. 457–505.
  • Pliny the Elder, Natural History, translated by Henry T. Riley and John Bostock, London and New York: Bell, 1893–1890.
  • Reuchlin, Johannes, De arte cabalistica, Hagenau: Thomas Anshelmus, 1517.
  • –––, De verbo mirifico, Basel: Johannes Amerbach, 1494.
  • Ricius, Paulus, In cabalam Isagoge, Pavia: Jacob Burgofrancho, 1510.
  • –––, Talmudica novissime in latinum versa periocunda commentariola, Augsburg: Grimm and Wirsung, 1519.
  • Trithemius, Johannes, Epistolarum familiarium libri duo, in Marquand Freher (ed.), Johannis Trithemii Opera historica, p. 2, Frankfurt: Wechel, 1601, pp. 438–504.

Selected Studies

  • Backus, Irena, 1983, “Agrippa on ‘Human Knowledge of God’ and ‘Human Knowledge of the External World”, Archiv für Geschichte der Philosophie, 65(2): 147–59. doi:10.1515/agph.1983.65.2.147
  • Blamires, Alcuin, 1997, The Case for Women in Medieval Culture, Oxford: Clarendon Press.
  • Bowen, Barbara C., 1972, “Cornelius Agrippa’s De Vanitate: Polemic or Paradox?” Bibliothèque d’Humanisme et Renaissance, 34(2): 249–56.
  • Celenza, Christopher S., 2001, “The Search for Ancient Wisdom in Early Modern Europe: Reuchlin and the Late Ancient Esoteric Paradigm”, The Journal of Religious History, 25(2): 115–33. doi:10.1111/1467-9809.00124
  • Copenhaver, Brian P., 1988, “Natural Philosophy/Astrology and Magic”, in The Cambridge History of Renaissance Philosophy, Charles B. Schmitt et al. (eds), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 264–300.
  • Dagron, Tristan, 2005, “Secrets de la nature et mystères divins: Corneille Agrippa lecteur de Pic”, in D’un principe philosophique à un genre littéraire: les “Secrets”, Dominique de Courcelles (ed.), Paris: Champion, 105–32.
  • Hieatt, A. Kent, 1980, “Eve as Reason in a Tradition of Allegorical Interpretation of the Fall”, Journal of the Warburg and Courtauld Institutes, 43: 21–26. doi:10.2307/751197
  • Hutton, Sarah, 2003, “Platonism, Stoicism, Scepticism and Classical Imitation”, A Companion to English Renaissance Literature and Culture, Michael Hattaway (ed.), Oxford: Blackwell, 44–57.
  • Jordan, Constance, 1990, Renaissance Feminism. Literary Text and Political Models, Ithaca and London: Cornell University Press.
  • Keefer, Michael H., 1988, “Agrippa’s Dilemma: Hermetic Rebirth and the Ambivalences of De Vanitate and De Occulta Philosophia”, Renaissance Quarterly, 41(4): 614–53. doi:10.2307/2861884
  • Korkowski, Eugene N., 1976, “Agrippa as Ironist”, Neophilologus, 60(4): 594–607. doi:10.1007/BF01512650
  • Lehrich, Christopher I., 2003, The Language of Demons and Angels. Cornelius Agrippa’s Occult Philosophy, Leiden and Boston: Brill.
  • Mantovani, Dario (ed.), 2013, Almum Studium Papiense, Storia dell’Università di Pavia, 2 vols, Milan: Cisalpino Monduzzo.
  • Müller-Jahncke, Wolf-Dieter, 1975, “The Attitude of Agrippe von Nettesheim (1486–1535) towards Alchemy”, Ambix, 22: 134–50. doi:10.1179/amb.1975.22.2.134
  • Naudé, Gabriel, 1644, Advis pour dresser une biliothèque, Paris: Rolet le duc.
  • Nauert, Charles G., Jr, 1965, Agrippa and the Crisis of Renaissance Thought, Urbana, Ill.: University of Illinois Press.
  • –––, 2006, Humanism and Culture of Renaissance Europe, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.
  • Newman, Barbara, 1993, “Renaissance Feminism and Esoteric Theology: The Case of Cornelius Agrippa”, Viator, 24: 337–56. doi:10.1484/J.VIATOR.2.301253
  • Newman, William, 1982, “Thomas Vaughan as an Interpreter of Agrippa von Nettesheim”, Ambix, 29(3): 125–40. doi:10.1179/amb.1982.29.3.125
  • Perrone Compagni, Vittoria, 1992, “Introduction”. (translated by Angus Clark), in Cornelius Agrippa ab Nettesheim, De occulta philosophia libri tres, 1–50. Leiden, New York and Cologne: Brill.
  • –––, 2000, “Dispersa intentio: Alchemy, Magic and Scepticism in Agrippa”, Early Science and Medicine, 5(2): 160–77. doi:10.1163/157338200X00164
  • –––, 2001, “Astrologia e filosofia occulta in Agrippa”, Rinascimento, II s., 41: 93–111.
  • –––, 2005, Ermetismo e Cristianesimo in Agrippa. Il “De triplici ratione cognoscendi Deum”, Florence: Polistampa.
  • –––, 2006, “L’innocenza di Eva. Retorica e teologia nel De nobilitate foeminei sexus di Agrippa”, Bruniana & Campanelliana, 12: 59–80.
  • –––, 2007, “Il De occulta philosophia di Cornelio Agrippa. Parole chiave: uomo-microcosmo, prisca theologia, cabala, magia”, Bruniana & Campanelliana, 13(2): 429–48.
  • –––, 2009, “Tutius ignorare quam scire: Agrippa and Scepticism”. (translated by Crofton Black), in Renaissance Scepticisms, Gianni Paganini and José R. Maia Neto (eds), Dordrecht: Springer, 91–110.
  • Popkin, Richard H., 2003, The History of Scepticism from Savonarola to Bayle, Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press.
  • Prost, August, 1882, Les sciences et les arts occultes au xvi e siècle: Corneille Agrippa. Sa vie et ses œuvres, 2 vols, Paris: Champion.
  • Secret, François, 1990, “L’originalité du De Occulta Philosophia”, Charis. Archives de l’Unicorne, 2: 57–87.
  • –––, 1992, Hermétisme et Kabbale, Naples: Bibliopolis.
  • Schmidt-Biggerman, Wilhelm, 2012, Geschchte der Kristlicher Kabbala: 15. und 16. Jahrhundert, Stuttgart-Bad Cannstatt: Fromman-Holzoobog.
  • Schmitt, Charles B., 1967, Gianfrancesco Pico della Mirandola (1469–1533) and His Critique of Aristotle, The Hague: Nijhoff.
  • Van der Poel, Marc, 1997, Cornelius Agrippa, the Humanist Theologian and His Declamations, Leiden, New York and Cologne: Brill.
  • Weeks, Andrew, 1993, German Mysticism from Hildegard of Bingen to Ludwig Wittgenstein: A Literary and Intellectual History, Albany, NY: SUNY Press.
  • Zambelli, Paola, 1965, “Cornelio Agrippa. Scritti inediti e dispersi”, Rinascimento, II s., 5: 195–323.
  • –––, 1972, “Cornelio Agrippa, Sisto da Siena e gli inquisitori”, Memorie Doemicane, n.s., 3: 147–64.
  • –––, 1976, “Magic and Radical Reformation in Agrippa of Nettesheim”, Journal of the Warburg and Courtauld Institutes, 39: 69–103. doi:10.2307/751133
  • –––, 1992, “Cornelius Agrippa, ein kritischer Magus”, in August Buck (ed.), Die Okkulten Wissenschaften in der Renaissance (Wolfenbütteler Abhandlungen zur Renaissanceforschung, Bd 12), Wiesbaden: Otto Harrassowitz, 65–89.
  • –––, 1997, “Mariage et lutheranisme d’après Henri Corneille Agrippa”, Nouvelles de la République des Lettres, 1: 79–102.
  • –––, 2000, “Continuità nella definizione della magia naturale da Ficino a Della Porta”, in La geografia dei saperi. Studi in memoria di Dino Pastine, Domenico Ferraro and Gianna Gigliotti (eds), Florence: Le Lettere, 23–41.
  • –––, 2007, White Magic, Black Magic, in the European Renaissance, Leiden and Boston: Brill.
  • Zika, Charles, 2003, Exorcising Our Demons: Magic, Witchcraft, and Visual Culture in Early Modern Europe, Leiden and Boston: Brill.

Other Internet Resources

Copyright © 2017 by
Vittoria Perrone Compagni <Vittoria.PerroneCompagni@unifi.it>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free