Notes to Al-Farabi's Philosophy of Society and Religion

1. The adjective madaniyya (fem. of madani) derives from the noun madina (literally city). As such, madina is the Arabic term for Greek polis; the adjective madani renders politikē. For a discussion of the implications of these terms, see Rudolph 2012a: 444–447; Gutas 2004.

2. In this connection, the distinction between “perfect” (kamil) and “excellent” (fadil) should be noted: while ‘perfect’ in the quoted passages refers to the completeness of the starting conditions, ‘excellent’ indicates the soundness of the pursued goal, corresponding to the natural telos.

3. The distinction in the Attainment is more precisely between “earthly happiness in this life and supreme happiness in the life beyond” (Attainment i, 1: 13). From the overall conception, to be fleshed out in section 3.1, it would appear that “earthly happiness” corresponds to the well-being of the madina and all its parts, whereas “supreme” or “ultimate happiness” designates individual felicity of the hereafter. Al-Farabi moreover distinguishes between presumed and true happiness, particularly to discriminate excellent from deficient societies; for this see the indications in section 4.2; cf. Enumeration 3: 78.

4. In his extant writings, al-Farabi regularly refers to the afterlife. It should, however, be noted that there is some dispute in the scholarship as to whether al-Farabi himself, actually, subscribes to the idea of an afterlife or rather rejects it; cf. Rudolph 2012a: 440–442, for an overview and reference to core positions. As the present entry is based on al-Farabi’s extant writings and since these explicitly mention the hereafter and connect true, individual happiness with this state, his theory will be presented accordingly. This is not to deny the possibility that in other writings, which nowadays are lost (such as his commentary on the Nicomachean Ethics, which is at the basis of this dispute), al-Farabi defended a different view.

5. In general, al-Farabi accepts Greek ancient cosmology, according to which the cosmos can be divided into a sublunary and a supralunary sphere. While the sublunary sphere is constituted by the four elements (earth, water, air, fire) and determined by the natural laws, the supralunary sphere is—with the exception of the ether (a quasi-matter of which, for instance, the bodies of the stars and planets consist)—immaterial and inhabited by the so-called ‘separate intelligences or intellects’, such as the ‘active intellect’ (on which more below). With their circular movements, the celestial bodies (chiefly, the planets, the sun, and the moon) causally determine matter and, thus, the natural laws of the sublunary sphere. A classic example of this is the tides which are brought about by the lunar cycle.

6. The active intellect, on this theory, is the last (in order of emanation) of the separate intelligences or intellects. In contrast to the celestial bodies (planets, sun, moon), it does not directly influence corporeal entities of the sublunary sphere, but instead the human soul endowed with intellect and imagination. The active intellect is simultaneously the cause of existence of the individuals inhabiting the sublunary sphere (in Avicenna’s words, it is the “giver of the forms”) and the active principle, introduced into psychology by Aristotle’s De anima, which actualizes the human intellect. For al-Farabi’s particular views on these two topics, see the entries on his metaphysics and psychology.

7. There is a question about whether “the faculty” (i.e., the intellect’s basic capacity to receive the intelligibles in intellectual abstraction and, thus, to think in actuality) and “the principle” (i.e., “the primary sciences and the primary intelligibles”) by means of which human beings can think in a deductive fashion are one and the same or rather two distinct things. See, for instance, Taylor 2006.

8. As adumbrated in note 6, the source of inspiration as well as theoretical background of al-Farabi’s psychology is Aristotle’s De anima. Accordingly, in Aristotle’s vein, al-Farabi believes that the human intellect, in order to actually think and understand, needs to be actualized (and, thus, becomes an “intellect in actuality”). If someone, say, an aspiring philosopher, consistently applies her intellect and apprehends an increasingly greater number of intelligibles (objects of knowledge), her intellect attains to a certain level, which al-Farabi dubs the “acquired intellect” (‘aql mustafad). At this level, the human intellect most nearly resembles in its essence the separate, cosmic intelligences and, particularly, the active intellect. For further details see the entry on al-Farabi’s psychology.

9. According to the Selected Aphorisms 81: 52–3, this state—which essentially corresponds to the level of the acquired intellect, see previous note—can already be attained in this life:

[Separation of the soul from the body] pertains only to the soul particularly characteristic of the human being (which is to say, not to the soul of non-human animals, NG), namely, the theoretical intellect. For when it comes to this state, it becomes separated from the body regardless of whether that body is living in that it is nourished and is sense perceptive, or whether the faculty by which it is nourished and is sense perceptive has already been abolished. For if with respect to anything pertaining to its actions it comes not to need sense perception or imagination (i.e., if it has reached the level of the acquired intellect, NG), it will already have come to the afterlife.

The connection of this state of separation with ultimate felicity will become clear in the following two paragraphs. In his Book of Religion 11: 101, by contrast, al-Farabi insists that true happiness does only come about in the afterlife (note that there he does not refer to his intellect theory):

The latter (namely, happiness, NG) is the one sought for its own sake; at no time is it sought in order to obtain something else by it; indeed, all other things are sought in order to obtain this one, and when it is obtained, the search is given up; it does not come about in this life, but rather in the next life which is after this one; and it is called ultimate happiness.

10. Note that this is the level of the aforementioned acquired intellect; see the previous note with the quotation from the Selected Aphorisms.

11. Cf. similarly Political Regime B, 2, 78: 67, summarizing the natural obligations of every human being under the following three headings:

… [every human being] needs to know happiness and to set it before his eyes as his end. Then, after that, he needs to know the things that ought to be done so as to gain happiness by means of them, then to perform those deeds.

12. Regarding his epistemology and theory of cognition, al-Farabi closely follows Aristotle. As a consequence, knowledge in the strict sense of the term requires understanding of the reason why S is the case (with S being a given state of affairs). It is, thus, an epistemic state which presupposes mastery of the respective science (epistēmē).

13. On these issues still see with benefit Adams 1844–1847.

14. Al-Farabi himself makes the link to trades and professions (or, in his terminology: the arts, corresponding to the Greek technē) in connection with the above quote (Perfect State V, 16, 5: 267), where he points out that happiness can differ in excellence. The last sentence of the above quote and its immediate sequel reads (ibid. 267–8):

The kinds of felicity are unequal …; this is similar to the difference of the arts in this world of ours. The arts differ in excellence according to their species …: as, for example, weaving and the art of drapery, the art of making perfumes and drugs and the art of sweeping; …. Moreover the people who practice the arts which belong to the same species are unequal in excellence with regard to the quantity of their knowledge. …. Difference in quality means that two have knowledge of the parts of the secretarial art, but one of them is more proficient and better trained than the other. This then is meant by difference in quality. The kinds of felicity are also unequal in excellence in these respects.

15. I.e., “excellent” (fadil) and not only “perfect” (kamil), see note 2 above.

16. In contrast to his model Aristotle, al-Farabi is convinced that every human being can, in a way (see below, section 3.2), fulfill her natural duties, including the knowledge requirement. He follows Aristotle neither in distinguishing between masters and slaves, nor between men and women. To the contrary, he even explicitly underscores that, as to the human rational faculty, men and women are equally gifted (while he nowhere explicitly mentions slaves), see Perfect State IV, 12, 8: 197: “But in the case of the faculty of sense, the faculty of representation and the faculty of reason male and female do not differ”.

17. It may be worth noting that the problem of free will (and act) was a point that was avidly debated in early Islamic theology. Al-Farabi basically sides with the Mu‘tazilites, a group which in his age became gradually marginalized, and rejects those positions which would increasingly dominate mainstream Sunni thought (Ash‘arism). For further reference, see s.v. in Encyclopaedia of Islam (online resource). For al-Farabi’s position on free will, see Griffel 2009, particularly 139–141. Al-Farabi addresses this issue in his Commentary on Aristotle’s On Interpretation, particularly 76–78 and 91–96.

18. The term ‘over-perfect’ is my own, applied in order to underscore the unique position ascribed to the first cause by al-Farabi; see, particularly, his Perfect State I, 1: 57–89, here, for instance, p. 59: “The First Existent is different in its substance from everything else, and it is impossible for anything else to have the existence it has”. For an analysis of al-Farabi’s conflicting accounts on the first cause, see Janos 2012: 180–189.

19. In the background of this notion is the ancient theory of climes (cf. Aristotle, Meteorology II, 5, 362a32-b9); for a general introduction see, for instance, Neugebauer 1975.

20. This is to say, that they are ‘informed’ by the active intellect as described above, section 2.1, i.e., that their minds have successfully received the basic ‘formatting’ (the primary sciences and primary intelligibles) by virtue of which only the process of reasoning can be carried out.

21. Cf. above, section 2.1, with the reference to the different degrees of happiness, corresponding to the degree of excellence achieved during one’s lifetime. Accordingly, the accomplished philosophers, with their true and scientific understanding of what there is, will experience greater intellectual pleasures than less gifted people (e.g., weavers or sweepers); nonetheless, these latter are also sufficiently equipped to attain felicity in the afterlife.

22. Cf., for instance, Attainment iii, 39: 35: “There are two primary methods of realizing them (i.e., the “particular instances” of the theoretical and practical virtues and arts, NG): instruction and the formation of character. To instruct is to introduce the theoretical virtues in nations and cities. The formation of character is the method of introducing the moral virtues and practical arts in nations”.

23. Cf. above with note 3, the notion of earthly happiness (Attainment i, 1: 13).

24. Cf. also, in this connection, al-Farabi’s comparison of the excellent ruler and her task vis-à-vis society with the first cause and its cosmic function, e.g., Political Regime B, 3, 88: 73:

It (i.e., the city, ordered by the excellent ruler, NG) comes to resemble the natural existents, and its rankings also resemble the rankings of the existents that begin at the first [cause] and terminate at primary material and the elements. The way it is tied together and its consonance are similar to the way the different existents are tied to one another and to their consonance. And the governor of that city is similar to the first cause through which the rest of the existents exist. (square brackets thus in the translation)

25. If ultimate felicity can be attained already before death (cf. note 4 above), the excellent ruler is among those who are in this state.

26. Cf. also above, section 2.2, first quote: the “First Cause” along with the “immaterial existents” (i.e., the separate intellects) are among the things everyone must know in order to attain felicity.

27. Note that subjectively speaking, someone adhering to a specific religion will feel as certain about her religion’s tenets as a philosopher defending a specific position by virtue of demonstrative syllogisms. What is at stake here, however, is (ultimately deriving from Aristotle’s Posterior Analytics) the objective epistemic status of judgments, which corresponds to opinion and conviction in the first case, in contrast to science and certitude in the second.

28. Cf. Book of Religion 4: 97 (slightly modified): “Thus the determined opinions in the excellent religion are either the truth or a likeness of the truth”. For instance, even though, on this account, the Qur’an speaks about God chiefly in a metaphorical fashion (e.g., referring to His throne, His hand, etc.), occasionally, it addresses the truth directly, for example, when it insists on God’s absolute oneness and categorically rejects any form of polytheism.

29. At the basis of this idea is al-Farabi’s theory of language and logic. Accordingly, there are different levels on which argumentation can be located: scientific argumentation must be rooted in demonstration (sullogismos in the sense of Aristotle’s Posterior Analytics). It excels by (a) being deduced from absolutely certain, self-evident, first principles, and (b) carried through by virtue of those logical figures which allow for necessary conclusions. As a consequence, these conclusions cannot be otherwise and, hence, are likewise absolutely certain. In contrast to demonstration, the remaining types of argumentation, namely, dialectics, rhetoric, and poetics, operate by means of weaker premises (e.g., probable, generally accepted) and less cogent figures, since they primarily aim at conviction, only secondarily at truth absolutely. Poetics is the weakest of these kinds, as it simply appeals to imagination and thus seeks to arouse the listener’s consent; cf. Black 1990.

30. For al-Farabi’s theory of prophecy, see the entry on psychology.

31. Cf. Book of Religion 7: 98–9: “It may happen accidentally that the first ruler does not determine all of the actions and give an exhaustive account of them, but determines most of them; …. Since not everything that can occur does occur in his time or in his country, many things remain that could occur in another time or in another country, each needing a specifically determined action, and he will have legislated nothing about them. Or else he devotes himself to those actions he presumes or knows to be fundamental, from which someone else can extrapolate the remaining ones: he legislates about the manner and amount of what ought to be done with these and leaves the rest, knowing that it will be possible for someone else to extrapolate them by adopting his intention and following in his footsteps”.

32. On al-Farabi’s account, philosophy was completed by Plato and, particularly, by Aristotle both in terms of content and method. It is for this reason that he maintains in his Book of Letters (so far there is no English translation of this work; C.E. Butterworth currently prepares a revised second edition with facing English translation) that there is no longer any need for philosophy to inquire into things unknown (for there are none left). Instead, philosophy is an art to be taught and studied. In his Philosophy of Aristotle (in Alfarabi 1962: 71–130), he differentiates more thoroughly: as a matter of fact, even Aristotle left some fields of knowledge unexplored. Therefore, beyond teaching and studying, the philosopher in al-Farabi’s age is additionally called to fill in these gaps.

Copyright © 2016 by
Nadja Germann <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free