Supplement to Analysis

Definitions and Descriptions of Analysis

The older a word, the deeper it reaches. (Wittgenstein NB, 40) {§6.5}

This supplement collects together various definitions and descriptions of analysis that have been offered in the history of philosophy (including all the classic ones), to indicate the range of different conceptions and the issues that arise. (There are also some remarks on related topics such as analyticity, definition, and methodology more generally.) In most cases, abbreviated references are given; full details can be found in the Annotated Bibliography on Analysis, in the section mentioned in curly brackets after the relevant definition or description. Where there is more than one passage quoted from a particular author, passages are numbered in chronological order of composition (as far as that can be determined).

1. Definitions of Analysis

Cambridge Dictionary of Philosophy, 2nd ed., 1999, ed. Robert Audi

the process of breaking up a concept, proposition, linguistic complex, or fact into its simple or ultimate constituents. {§1.1}

Concise Oxford Dictionary, 1976, ed. J. B. Sykes

1. Resolution into simpler elements by analysing (opp. synthesis); statement of result of this; … 2. (Math.) Use of algebra and calculus in problem-solving. {§1.1}

Dictionary of Philosophy and Psychology, 1925, ed. James Mark Baldwin, Vol. I

The isolation of what is more elementary from what is more complex by whatever method. {§1.1}

A Kant Dictionary, 1995, by Howard Caygill

Kant combines two senses of analysis in his work, one derived from Greek geometry, the other from modern physics and chemistry. Both remain close to the original Greek sense of analysis as a ‘loosening up’ or ‘releasing’, but each proceed in different ways. The former proceeds ‘lemmatically’ by assuming a proposition to be true and searching for another known truth from which the proposition may be deduced. The latter proceeds by resolving complex wholes into their elements. {§4.5}

Oxford Dictionary of Philosophy, 1996, by Simon Blackburn

The process of breaking a concept down into more simple parts, so that its logical structure is displayed. {§1.1}

Philosophielexikon, 1997, ed. A. Hügli and P. Lübcke

Auflösung, Zerlegung in Bestandteile, im Gegensatz zu Synthese. {§1.1}

Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy, 1998, entry under ‘Analytical Philosophy’ by Thomas Baldwin

Philosophical analysis is a method of inquiry in which one seeks to assess complex systems of thought by ‘analysing’ them into simpler elements whose relationships are thereby brought into focus. {§1.1}

Routledge Encyclopedia of Philosophy, 1998, entry under ‘Conceptual Analysis’ by Robert Hanna

The theory of conceptual analysis holds that concepts – general meanings of linguistic predicates – are the fundamental objects of philosophical inquiry, and that insights into conceptual contents are expressed in necessary ‘conceptual truths’ (analytic propositions). {§1.1}

Annotated Bibliography, §1.1

2. Descriptions of Analysis

Alexander of Aphrodisias

  1. And he [Aristotle] called them Analytics because the resolution of every compound into those things out of which the synthesis [is made] is called analysis. For analysis is the converse of synthesis. Synthesis is the road from the principles to those things that derive from the principles, and analysis is the return from the end to the principles. For geometers are said to analyze when, beginning from the conclusion they go up to the principles and the problem, following the order of those things which were assumed for the demonstration of the conclusion {1}. But he also uses analysis who reduces composite bodies into simple bodies {2}, and he analyzes who divides the word into the parts of the word {3}; also he who divides the parts of the word into the syllables {4}; and he who divides these into their components {5}. And they are severally said to analyse who reduce compound syllogisms into simple ones {6}, and simple ones into the premisses out of which they get their being {7}. And further, resolving imperfect syllogisms into perfect ones is called analyzing {8}. And they call analysis the reducing of the given syllogism into the proper schemata {9}. And it is especially in this meaning of analysis that these are entitled Analytics, for he describes for us a method at the end of the first book with which we shall be able to do this. (Commentary on Aristotle’s Prior Analytics, §1.2.1 (7, lines 11-33); tr. in Gilbert 1960, 32; the square brackets are in the original translation, the curly brackets have been added here to highlight the nine senses that Alexander distinguishes) {§2.4, §3.2}


  1. it is not the same thing to take an argument in one’s hand and then to see and solve its faults, as it is to be able to meet it quickly while being subjected to questions; for what we know, we often do not know in a different context. Moreover, just as in other things speed or slowness is enhanced by training, so it is with arguments too, so that supposing we are unpractised, even though a point is clear to us, we are often too late for the right moment. Sometimes too it happens as with diagrams; for there we can sometimes analyse the figure, but not construct it again: so too in refutations, though we know on what the connexion of the argument depends, we still are at a loss to split the argument apart. (SR, 16, 175a20-30) {§2.4}

  2. We must next explain how to reduce syllogisms to the figures previously described; this part of our inquiry still remains. For if we examine the means by which syllogisms are produced, and possess the ability to discover them, and can also analyse [analuoimen] the syllogisms when constructed into the figures previously described, our original undertaking will be completed. ((PrA, I, 32, 46b40-47a6; Tredennick tr. slightly modified) {§2.4}

  3. Thus it is evident (1) that the types of syllogism which cannot be analysed in these figures [viz., second figure syllogisms into the third figure, and third figure syllogisms into the second figure] are the same as those which we saw could not be analysed into the first figure; and (2) that when syllogisms are reduced to the first figure these alone are established per impossibile.

    It is evident, then, from the foregoing account [taken as including the discussion prior to chapter 45] how syllogisms should be reduced; and also that the figures can be analysed into one another. (PrA, I, 45, 51a40-b5; Tredennick tr., substituting ‘analysed’ for ‘resolved’) {§2.4}

  4. If it were impossible to prove truth from falsehood, it would be easy to make analyses [analuein]; for then the propositions would convert from necessity. Let A be something that is the case; and if A is the case, then these things are the case (things which I know to be the case—call them B). From the latter, then, I shall prove that the former is the case. (In mathematics conversion is more common because mathematicians assume nothing incidental—and in this too they differ from those who argue dialectically—but only definitions.) (PoA, I, 12, 78a6-13) {§2.4}

  5. We deliberate not about ends but about means. For a doctor does not deliberate whether he shall heal, nor an orator whether he shall convince, nor a statesman whether he shall produce law and order, nor does any one else deliberate about his end. Having set the end, they consider how and by what means it is to be attained; and if it seems to be produced by several means they consider by which it is most easily and best produced, while if it is achieved by one only they consider how it will be achieved by this and by what means this will be achieved, till they come to the first cause, which in the order of discovery is last. For the person who deliberates seems to inquire and analyse in the way described as though he were analysing a geometrical construction (not all inquiry appears to be deliberation—for instance mathematical inquiries—but all deliberation is inquiry), and what is last in the order of analysis seems to be first in the order of becoming. And if we come on an impossibility, we give up the search, e.g. if we need money and this cannot be got; but if a thing appears possible we try to do it. (NE, III, 3, 1112b8-27) {§2.4}

Arnauld, Antoine and Nicole, Pierre

  1. The art of arranging a series of thoughts properly, either for discovering the truth when we do not know it, or for proving to others what we already know, can generally be called method.

    Hence there are two kinds of method, one for discovering the truth, which is known as analysis, or the method of resolution, and which can also be called the method of discovery. The other is for making the truth understood by others once it is found. This is known as synthesis, or the method of composition, and can also be called the method of instruction.

    Analysis does not usually deal with the entire body of a science, but is used only for resolving some issue. (LAT, 233-4) {§4.1}

  2. Now analysis consists primarily in paying attention to what is known in the issue we want to resolve. The entire art is to derive from this examination many truths that can lead us to the knowledge we are seeking.

    Suppose we wondered whether the human soul is immortal, and to investigate it we set out to consider the nature of the soul. First we would notice that it is distinctive of the soul to think, and that it could doubt everything without being able to doubt whether it is thinking, since doubting is itself a thought. Next we would ask what thinking is. Since we would see nothing contained in the idea of thought that is contained in the idea of the extended substance called body, and since we could even deny of thought everything belonging to body - such as having length, width, and depth, having different parts, having a certain shape, being divisible, etc. - without thereby destroying the idea we have of thought, from this we would conclude that thought is not at all a mode of extended substance, because it is the nature of a mode not to be able to be conceived while the thing of which it is a mode is denied. From this we infer, in addition, that since thought is not a mode of extended substance, it must be the attribute of another substance. Hence thinking substance and extended substance are two really distinct substances. It follows from this that the destruction of one in no way brings about the destruction of the other, since even extended substance is not properly speaking destroyed, but all that happens in what we call destruction is nothing more than the change or dissolution of several parts of matter which exist forever in nature. Likewise it is quite easy to judge that in breaking all the gears of a clock no substance is destroyed, although we say that the clock is destroyed. This shows that since the soul is in no way divisible or composed of parts, it cannot perish, and consequently is immortal.

    This is what we call analysis or resolution. We should notice, first, that in this method - as in the one called composition - we should practice proceeding from what is better known to what is less known. For there is no true method which could dispense with this rule.

    Second, it nevertheless differs from the method of composition in that these known truths are taken from a particular examination of the thing we are investigating, and not from more general things as is done in the method of instruction. Thus in the example we presented, we did not begin by establishing these general maxims: that no substance perishes, properly speaking; that what is called destruction is only a dissolution of parts; that therefore what has no parts cannot be destroyed, etc. Instead we rose by stages to these general notions.

    Third, in analysis we introduce clear and evident maxims only to the extent that we need them, whereas in the other method we establish them first, as we will explain below.

    Fourth and finally, these two methods differ only as the route one takes in climbing a mountain from a valley differs from the route taken in descending from the mountain into the valley, or as the two ways differ that are used to prove that a person is descended from St. Louis. One way is to show that this person had a certain man for a father who was the son of a certain man, and that man was the son of another, and so on up to St. Louis. The other way is to begin with St. Louis and show that he had a certain child, and this child had others, thereby descending to the person in question. This example is all the more appropriate in this case, since it is certain that to trace an unknown genealogy, it is necessary to go from the son to the father, whereas to explain it after finding it, the most common method is to begin with the trunk to show the descendants. This is also what is usually done in the sciences where, after analysis is used to find some truth, the other method is employed to explain what has been found.

    This is the way to understand the nature of analysis as used by geometers. Here is what it consists in. Suppose a question is presented to them, such as whether it is true or false that something is a theorem, or whether a problem is possible or impossible; they assume what is at issue and examine what follows from that assumption. If in this examination they arrive at some clear truth from which the assumption follows necessarily, they conclude that the assumption is true. Then starting over from the end point, they demonstrate it by the other method which is called composition. But if they fall into some absurdity or impossibility as a necessary consequence of their assumption, they conclude from this that the assumption is false and impossible.

    This is what may be said in a general way about analysis, which consists more in judgment and mental skill than in particular rules. (LAT, 236-8) {§4.1}

Ayer, A. J.

  1. It is advisable to stress the point that philosophy, as we understand it, is wholly independent of metaphysics, inasmuch as the analytic method is commonly supposed by its critics to have a metaphysical basis. Being misled by the associations of the word ‘analysis’, they assume that philosophical analysis is an activity of dissection; that it consists in ‘breaking up’ objects into their constituent parts, until the whole universe is ultimately exhibited as an aggregate of ‘bare particulars’, united by external relations. If this were really so, the most effective way of attacking the method would be to show that its basic presupposition was nonsensical. For to say that the universe was an aggregate of bare particulars would be as senseless as to say that it was Fire or Water or Experience. It is plain that no such possible observation would enable to veify such an assertion. But, so far as I know, this line of criticism is in fact never adopted. The critics content themselves with pointing out that few, if any, of the complex objects in the world are simply the sum of their parts. They have a structure, an organic unity, which distinguishes them, as genuine wholes, from mere aggregates. But the analyst, so it is said, is obliged by his atomistic metaphysics to regard an object consisting of parts a, b, c, and d, in a distinctive configuration as being simply a + b + c + d, and thus gives an entirely false account of its nature.

    If we follow the Gestalt psychologists, who of all men talk most constantly about genuine wholes, in defining such a whole as one in which the properties of every part depend to some extent on its position in the whole, then we may accept it as an empirical fact that there exist genuine, or organic, wholes. And if the analytic method involved a denial of this fact, it would indeed be a faulty method. But, actually, the validity of the analytic method is not dependent on any empirical, much less any metaphysical, presupposition about the nature of things. For the philosopher, as an analyst, is not directly concerned with the physical properties of things. He is concerned only with the way in which we speak about them.

    In other words, the propositions of philosophy are not factual, but linguistic in character – that is, they do not describe the behaviour of physical, or even mental, objects; they express definitions, or the formal consequences of definitions. Accordingly, we may say that philosophy is a department of logic. For we shall see that the characteristic mark of a purely logical inquiry is that it is concerned with the formal consequences of our definitions and not with questions of empirical fact.

    It follows that philosophy does not in any way compete with science. The difference in type between philosophical and scientific propositions is such that they cannot conceivably contradict one another. And this makes it clear that the possibility of philosophical analysis is independent of any empirical assumptions. That it is independent of any metaphysical assumptions should be even more obvious still. For it is absurd to suppose that the provision of definitions, and the study of their formal consequences, involves the nonsensical assertion that the world is composed of bare particulars, or any other metaphysical dogma.

    What has contributed as much as anything to the prevalent misunderstanding of the nature of philosophical analysis is the fact that propositions and questions which are really linguistic are often expressed in such a way that they appear to be factual. A striking instance of this is provided by the proposition that a material thing cannot be in two places at once. This looks like an empirical proposition, and is constantly invoked by those who desire to prove that it is possible for an empirical proposition to be logically certain. But a more critical inspection shows that it is not empirical at all, but linguistic. It simply records the fact that, as the result of certain verbal conventions, the proposition that two sense-contents occur in the same visual or tactual sense-field is incompatible with the proposition that they belong to the same material thing. And this is indeed a necessary fact. But it has not the least tendency to show that we have certain knowledge about the empirical properties of objects. For it is necessary only because we happen to use the relevant words in a particular way. There is no logical reason why we should not so alter our definitions that the sentence ‘A thing cannot be in two places at once’ comes to express a self-contradiction instead of a necessary truth. (1936, 75-7) {§6.7}

  2. From our assertion that philosophy provides definitions, it must not be inferred that it is the function of the philosopher to compile a dictionary, in the ordinary sense. For the definitions which philosophy is required to provide are of a different kind from those which we expect to find in dictionaries. In a dictionary we look mainly for what may be called explicit definitions; in philosophy, for definitions in use. ...

    We define a symbol in use, not by saying that it is synonymous with some other symbol, but by showing how the sentences in which it significantly occurs can be translated into equivalent sentences, which contain neither the definiendum itself, nor any of its synonyms. A good illustration of this process is provided by Bertrand Russell’s so-called theory of descriptions, which is not a theory at all in the ordinary sense, but an indication of the way in which all phrases of the form ‘the so-and-so’ are to be defined. (Ibid., 80-1) {§6.7}

  3. [A serious mistake in my account in Language, Truth and Logic] was my assumption that philosophical analysis consisted mainly in the provision of ‘definitions in use’. It is, indeed, true that what I describe as philosophical analysis is very largely a matter of exhibiting the inter-relationship of different types of propositions; but the cases in which this process actually yields a set of definitions are the exception rather than the rule. ...

    ... Thus, when Professor Moore suggests that to say that ‘existence is not a predicate’ may be a way of saying that ‘there is some very important difference between the way in which “exist” is used in such a sentence as “Tame tigers exist” and the way in which “growl” is used in “Tame tigers growl”’, he does not develop his point by giving rules for the translation of one set of sentences into another. What he does is to remark that whereas it makes good sense to say ‘All tame tigers growl’ or ‘Most tame tigers growl’ it would be nonsense to say ‘All tame tigers exist’ or ‘Most tame tigers exist’. Now this may seem a rather trivial point for him to make, but in fact it is philosophically illuminating. For it is precisely the assumption that existence is a predicate that gives plausibility to ‘the ontological argument’; and the ontological argument is supposed to demonstrate the existence of a God. Consequently Moore by pointing out a peculiarity in the use of the word ‘exist’ helps to protect us from a serious fallacy; so that his procedure, though different from that which Russell follows in his theory of descriptions, tends to achieve the same philosophical end. (1946, 31-3) {§6.7}

Bentham, Jeremy

  1. By the word paraphrasis may be designated that sort of exposition which may be afforded by transmuting into a proposition, having for its subject some real entity, a proposition which has not for its subject any other than a fictitious entity. (EL, 246) {§5.6}

Bergson, Henri

  1. By intuition is meant the kind of intellectual sympathy by which one places oneself within an object in order to coincide with what is unique in it and consequently inexpressible. Analysis, on the contrary, is the operation which reduces the object to elements already known, that is, to elements common both to it and other objects. To analyse, therefore, is to express a thing as a function of something other than itself. All analysis is thus a translation, a development into symbols, a representation taken from successive points of view from which we note as many resemblances as possible between the new object which we are studying and others which we believe we know already. In its eternally unsatisfied desire to embrace the object around which it is compelled to turn, analysis multiplies without end the number of its points of view in order to complete its always incomplete representation, and ceaselessly varies its symbols that it may perfect the always imperfect translation. It goes on, therefore, to infinity. But intuition, if intuition is possible, is a simple act. (1903, 6-7) {§5.1}

  2. [Analysis] operates always on the immobile, whilst intuition places itself in mobility, or, what comes to the same thing, in duration. There lies the very distinct line of demarcation between intuition and analysis. The real, the experienced and the concrete are recognised by the fact that they are variability itself, the element by the fact that it is invariable. And the element is invariable by definition, being a diagram, a simplified reconstruction, often a mere symbol, in any case a motionless view of the moving reality. (1903, 40-1) {§5.1}

  3. Modern science is neither one nor simple. It rests, I freely admit, on ideas which in the end we find clear; but these ideas have gradually become clear through the use made of them; they owe most of their clearness to the light which the facts, and the applications to which they led, have by reflection shed on them - the clearness of a concept being scarcely anything more at bottom than the certainty, at last obtained, of manipulating the concept profitably. At its origin, more than one of these concepts must have appeared obscure, not easily reconcilable with the concepts already admitted into science, and indeed very near the borderline of absurdity. This means that science does not proceed by an orderly dovetailing together of concepts predestined to fit each other exactly. True and fruitful ideas are so many close contacts with currents of reality, which do not necessarily converge on the same point. However the concepts in which they lodge themselves manage somehow, by rubbing off each other's corners, to settle down well enough together. (1903, 74) {§5.1}

Black, Max

  1. It may help to be reminded that many philosophers who might allow themselves to be described as “analysts” have been strongly influenced by the work of Russell, Moore, and Wittgenstein. For while all three have been engaged in “clarification of meaning” they have done so in different and distinctive ways; and the resulting divergences in conceptions of philosophical method have not yet been reconciled. This makes it hard to give any simple account of what is meant today by “philosophical analysis”. (1950a, 2) {§6.1}

  2. A man who had to describe “philosophical analysis” might resort to talking about a climate of opinion. The weather, he might say, is congenial to empiricists, naturalists, agnostics; the well acclimatized have admired the two Principia’s and the Tractatus and have read a hundred pages of Hume for one of Kant. Here rhetoric is viewed with suspicion and enthusiasm barely tolerated; this is a land of “prose writers, hoping to be understood” [J.M. Keynes, A Treatise on Probability, 1921, preface].

    ... If a formula or a slogan is wanted, it is easy enough to say that these writers (like Russell, Moore, and Wittgenstein before them) are engaged in clarification of meaning. ... And if those who are best at the work of clarification might feel embarrassed to provide a satisfactory analysis of “analysis”, that is perhaps no cause for apology or alarm. For it is a mark of life to resist arbitrary confinement, and “philosohical analysis” is still much alive. (1950a, 12-13) {§6.1}

Bos, Henk J. M.

  1. Analysis comprises mathematical methods for finding the solutions (in geometry: the constructions) of problems or the proofs of theorems, doing so by introducing unknowns. (2001, 129) {§4.2}

Bradley, F. H.

  1. It is a very common and most ruinous superstition to suppose that analysis is no alteration, and that, whenever we distinguish, we have at once to do with divisible existence. It is an immense assumption to conclude, when a fact comes to us as a whole, that some parts of it may exist without any sort of regard for the rest. Such naive assurance of the outward reality of all mental distinctions, such touching confidence in the crudest identity of thought and existence, is worthy of the school which so loudly appeals to the name of Experience. ... If it is true in any sense (and I will not deny it) that thought in the end is the measure of things, yet at least this is false, that the divisions we make within a whole all answer to elements whose existence does not depend on the rest. It is wholly unjustifiable to take up a complex, to do any work we please upon it by analysis, and then simply predicate as an adjective of the given these results of our abstraction. These products were never there as such, and in saying, as we do, that as such they are there, we falsify the fact. You can not always apply in actual experience that coarse notion of the whole as the sum of its parts into which the school of ‘experience’ so delights to torture phenomena. If it is wrong in physiology to predicate the results, that are reached by dissection, simply and as such of the living body, it is here infinitely more wrong. The whole that is given to us is a continuous mass of perception and feeling; and to say of this whole, that any one element would be what it is there, when apart from the rest, is a very grave assertion. We might have supposed it not quite self-evident, and that it was possible to deny it without open absurdity. (PL, §64/ WLM, 77-8) {§5.6}

  2. judgement is the differentiation of a complex whole, and hence always is analysis and synthesis in one. (AR, 149/WLM, 158) {§5.6}

  3. At any moment my actual experience, however relational its contents, is in the end non-relational. No analysis into relations and terms can ever exhaust its nature or fail in the end to belie its essence. What analysis leaves for ever outstanding is no mere residue, but is a vital condition of the analysis itself. Everything which is got out into the form of an object implies still the felt background against which the object comes, and, further, the whole experience of both feeling and object is a non-relational immediate felt unity. The entire relational consciousness, in short, is experienced as falling within a direct awareness. This direct awareness is itself non-relational. It escapes from all attempts to exhibit it by analysis as one or more elements in a relational scheme, or as that scheme itself, or as a relation or relations, or as the sum or collection of any of these abstractions. And immediate experience not only escapes, but it serves as the basis on which the analysis is made. Itself is the vital element within which every analysis still moves, while, and so far as, and however much, that analysis transcends immediacy. (ETR, 176/WLM, 280-1) {§5.6}

  4. I would rather now lay more stress on the logical vice of all Analysis and Abstraction – so far as that means taking any feature in the Whole of Things as ultimately real except in its union with the Whole. (Collected Works of F.H. Bradley: Selected Correspondence 1905-1924, Bristol, Thoemmes Press, 1999, 275)

  5. Analysis and synthesis I take in the end to be two aspects of one principle … Every analysis proceeds from and on the basis of a unity ... The point before us is the question as to how, without separation in its existence, we can discriminate ideally in analysis. (ETR, 300)

Brandom, Robert B.

  1. Socratic method is a way of bringing our practices under rational control by expressing them explicitly in a form in which they can be confronted with objections and alternatives, a form in which they can be exhibited as the conclusions of inferences seeking to justify them on the basis of premises advanced as reasons, and as premises in further inferences exploring the consequences of accepting them. (2000, 56) {§6.9}

  2. I think of analytic philosophy as having at its center a concern with semantic relations between what I will call ‘vocabularies’. … Its characteristic form of question is whether and in what way one can make sense of the meanings expressed by one kind of locution interms of the meanings expressed by another kind of locution. So, for instance, two early paradigmatic projects were to show that everything expressible in the vocabulary of number-theory, and again, everything expressible using definite descriptions, is expressible already in the vocabulary of first-order quantificational logic with identity.

    The nature of the key kind of semantic relation between vocabularies has been variously characterized during the history of analytic philosophy: as analysis, definition, paraphrase, translation, reduction of different sorts, truth-making, and various kinds of supervenience—to name just a few contenders. In each case, however, it is characteristic of classical analytic philosophy that logical vocabulary is accorded a privileged role in specifying these semantic relations. It has always been taken at least to be licit to appeal to logical vocabulary in elaborating the relation between analysandum and analysans—target vocabulary and base vocabulary—and, according to stronger versions of this thesis, that may be the only vocabulary it is licit to employ in that capacity. I will refer to this aspect of the analytic project as its commitment to ‘semantic logicism’. (2006, Lecture One, §1) {§6.9}

  3. What I want to call the “classical project of analysis”, then, aims to exhibit the meanings expressed by various target vocabularies as intelligible by means of the logical elaboration of the meanings expressed by base vocabularies thought to be privileged in some important respects—epistemological, ontological, or semantic—relative to those others. This enterprise is visible in its purest form in what I have called the “core programs” of empiricism and naturalism, in their various forms. In my view the most significant conceptual development in this tradition—the biggest thing that ever happened to it—is the pragmatist challenge to it that was mounted during the middle years of the twentieth century. Generically, this movement of thought amounts to a displacement from the center of philosophical attention of the notion of meaning in favor of that of use: in suitably broad senses of those terms, replacing concern with semantics by concern with pragmatics. (Ibid., Lecture One, §2) {§6.9}

Carnap, Rudolf

  1. the analysis or, more precisely, quasi-analysis of an entity that is essentially an indivisible unit into several quasi-constituents means placing the entity in several kinship contexts on the basis of a kinship relation, where the unit remains undivided. (1928a, §71; English tr. by Rolf A. George slightly altered) {§6.7}

  2. The logical analysis of a particular expression consists in the setting-up of a linguistic system and the placing of that expression in this system. (1936, 143) {§6.7}

  3. That part of the work of philosophers which may be held to be scientific in its nature—excluding the empirical questions which can be referred to empirical science—consists of logical analysis. The aim of logical syntax is to provide a system of concepts, a language, by the help of which the results of logical analysis will be exactly formulable. Philosophy is to be replaced by the logic of science—that is to say, by the logical analysis of the concepts and sentences of the sciences, for the logic of science is nothing other than the logical syntax of the language of science. (1937, xiii) {§6.7}

  4. The task of making more exact a vague or not quite exact concept used in everyday life or in an earlier stage of scientific or logical development, or rather of replacing it by a newly constructed, more exact concept, belongs among the most important tasks of logical analysis and logical construction. We call this the task of explicating, or of giving an explication for, the earlier concept … (1947, 8-9) {§6.7}

  5. By the procedure of explication we mean the transformation of an inexact, prescientific concept, the explicandum, into a new exact concept, the explicatum. Although the explicandum cannot be given in exact terms, it should be made as clear as possible by informal explanations and examples. ...

    The term ‘explicatum’ has been suggested by the following two usages. Kant calls a judgement explicative if the predicate is obtained by analysis of the subject. Husserl, in speaking about the synthesis of identification between a confused, nonarticulated sense and a subsequently intended distinct, articulated sense, calls the latter the ‘Explikat’ of the former. (For both uses see Dictionary of philosophy [1942], ed. D. Runes, p. 105). What I mean by ‘explicandum’ and ‘explicatum’ is to some extent similar to what C.H. Langford calls ‘analysandum’ and ‘analysans’: “the analysis then states an appropriate relation of equivalence between the analysandum and the analysans” [Langford 1942, 323 {§6.4}]; he says that the motive of an analysis “is usually that of supplanting a relatively vague idea by a more precise one” (ibid., p. 329).

    (Perhaps the form ‘explicans’ might be considered instead of ‘explicatum’; however, I think that the analogy with the terms ‘definiendum’ and ‘definiens’ would not be useful because, if the explication consists in giving an explicit definition, then both the definiens and the definiendum in this definition express the explicatum, while the explicandum does not occur.) The procedure of explication is here understood in a wider sense than the procedures of analysis and clarification which Kant, Husserl, and Langford have in mind. The explicatum (in my sense) is in many cases the result of analysis of the explicandum (and this has motivated my choice of the terms); in other cases, however, it deviates deliberately from the explicandum but still takes its place in some way; this will become clear by the subsequent examples. (1950, 3) {§6.7}

Cassirer, Ernst

  1. [T]he sense of all objective judgments reduces to a final original relation, which can be expressed in different formulations as the relation of “form” to “content”, as the relation of “universal” to “particular”, as the relation of “validity [Geltung]” to “being [Sein]”. Whatever designation one may finally choose here, what is alone decisive is that the basic relation itself is to be retained as a strictly unitary relation, which can only be designated through the two opposed moments that enter into it – but never constructed out of them, as if they were independent constituents present in themselves. The original relation is not to be defined in such a way that the “universal” somehow “subsists” next to or above the “particular” – the form somehow separate from the content – so that the two are then melded with one another by means of some or another fundamental synthesis of knowledge. Rather, the unity of mutual determination constitutes the absolutely first datum, behind which one can go back no further, and which can only be analyzed via the duality of two “viewpoints” in an artificially isolating process of abstraction. It is the basic flaw of all metaphysical epistemologies that they always attempt to reinterpret this duality of “moments” as a duality of “elements”. (1913, 13-14; cited and tr. by Friedman 2000, 34) {§5.4}

Cohen, L. Jonathan

  1. conceptual analysis typically relates one kind of reason for using a certain word to another. (1986, 51) {§6.9}

  2. When philosophical analysis proceeds from intuitively sanctioned premisses to a reasoned conclusion, it may be described as moving from analysandum to analysans. It seeks to ensure that any muddles or inconsistencies in our unreasoned inclinations and passive prejudices are replaced by an explicitly formulated, consciously co-ordinated, adequately reasoned, and freely adopted system of acceptable principles. (1986, 96) {§6.9}

Collingwood, R. G.

  1. Socrates was essentially the inventor of a method. ... His revolt against the study of nature was essentially a revolt against observation in favour of thought; and whereas mathematical method, as an example of thought, had already been discovered by his predecessors, his own discovery was that a similar method, for which he invented an appropriate technique, could be applied to ethical questions. This technique, as he himself recognized, depended on a principle which is of great importance to any theory of philosophical method: the principle that in a philosophical inquiry what we are trying to do is not to discover something of which until now we have been ignorant, but to know better something which in some sense we knew already; not to know it better in the sense of coming to know more about it, but to know it better in the sense of coming to know it in a different and better way—actually instead of potentially, or explicitly instead of implicitly, or in whatever terms the theory of knowledge chooses to express the difference: the difference itself has been a familiar fact ever since Socrates pointed it out. (1933, 10-11) {§5.6}

  2. [The] work of disentangling and arranging questions, which ... I [call] analysis, may be alternatively described as the work of detecting presuppositions. ... The analysis which detects absolute presuppositions I call metaphysical analysis; but as regards procedure and the qualifications necessary to carry it out there is no difference whatever between metaphysical analysis and analysis pure and simple ... (1940, 39-40) {§5.6}

  3. It is only by analysis that any one can ever come to know either that he is making any absolute presuppositions at all or what absolute presuppositions he is making.

    Such analysis may in certain cases proceed in the following manner. If the inquirer can find a person to experiment upon who is well trained in a certain type of scientific work, intelligent and earnest in his devotion to it, and unaccustomed to metaphysics, let him probe into various presuppositions that his ‘subject’ has been taught to make in the course of his scientific education, and invite him to justify each or alternatively to abandon it. If the ‘inquirer’ is skilful and the ‘subject’ the right kind of man, these invitations will be contemplated with equanimity, and even with interest, so long as relative presuppositions are concerned. But when an absolute presupposition is touched, the invitation wil be rejected, even with a certain degree of violence.

    The rejection is a symptom that the ‘subject’, co-operating with the work of analysis, has come to see that the presupposition he is being asked to justify or abandon is an absolute presupposition; and the violence with which it is expressed is a symptom that he feels the importance of this absolute presupposition for the kind of work to which he is devoted. This is what ... I called being ‘ticklish in one’s absolute presuppositions’; and the reader will see that this ticklishness is a sign of intellectual health combined with a low degree of analytical skill. A man who is ticklish in that way is a man who knows, ‘instinctively’ as they say, that absolute presuppositions do not need justification. (Ibid., 43-4) {§5.6}

  4. metaphysical analysis, the discovery that certain presuppositions actually made are absolute presuppositions, is an integral part or an indispensable condition, you can put it whichever way you like, of all scientific work.(Ibid., 84) {§5.6}

Davidson, Donald

  1. In philosophy we are used to definitions, analyses, reductions. Typically these are intended to carry us from concepts better understood, or clear, or more basic epistemologically or ontologically, to others we want to understand. The method I have suggested fits none of these categories. I have proposed a looser relation between concepts to be illuminated and the relatively more basic. (‘Radical Interpretation’, 1972, Inquiries into Truth and Interpretation, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2001, 137)

De Chardin, Teilhard

  1. Unlike the primitives who gave a face to every moving thing, or the early Greeks who defined all the aspects and forces of nature, modern man is obsessed by the need to depersonalise (or impersonalise) all that he most admires. There are two reasons for this tendency. The first is analysis, that marvellous instrument of scientific research to which we owe all our advances but which, breaking down synthesis after synthesis, allows one soul after another to escape, leaving us confronted with a pile of dismantled machinery, and evanescent particles. The second reason lies in the discovery of the sidereal world, so vast that it seems to do away with all proportion between our own being and the dimensions of the cosmos around us. (The Phenomenon of Man, 1955, 282; tr. Bernard Wall, Fontana, 1965; tr. first publ. 1959)

Derrida, Jacques

  1. Up until now the idea of philosophy remained defined in a formal way as an idea of an infinite task theoria. Could a history of this infinite theoretical life, which merges itself in its efforts and failures with a simple realization of the self, take on the value of a genetic description? Will the history of the “transcendental motive” through all the stages of European philosophy, enlighten us at last on the genesis of transcendental subjectivity? But such a history presupposes the possibility of such a going backward, the possibility of finding again the originary sense of the former presents as such. It implies the possibility of a transcendental “regression” (Ruckfrage) through a history that is intelligible and transparent to consciousness, a history whose sedimentations can be unmade and remade without alteration. (The Problem of Genesis in Husserl's Philosophy, The University of Chicago Press, 2003, 161; tr. Marian Hobson)

Descartes, René

  1. [discussing his ‘Rule Four’: “We need a method if we are to investigate the truth of things”] … the human mind has within it a sort of spark of the divine, in which the first seeds of useful ways of thinking are sown, seeds which, however neglected and stifled by studies which impede them, often bear fruit of their own accord. This is our experience in the simplest of sciences, arithmetic and geometry: we are well aware that the geometers of antiquity employed a sort of analysis which they went on to apply to the solution of every problem, though they begrudged revealing it to posterity. At the present time a sort of arithmetic called ‘algebra’ is flourishing, and this is achieving for numbers what the ancients did for figures. (Rules for the Direction of the Mind, in PW, I, 16-17) {§4.2}

  2. As for the method of demonstration, this divides into two varieties: the first proceeds by analysis and the second by synthesis.

    Analysis shows the true way by means of which the thing in question was discovered methodically and as it were a priori, so that if the reader is willing to follow it and give sufficient attention to all points, he will make the thing his own and understand it just as perfectly as if he had discovered it for himself. But this method contains nothing to compel belief in an argumentative or inattentive reader; for if he fails to attend even to the smallest point, he will not see the necessity of the conclusion. Moreover there are many truths which - although it is vital to be aware of them - this method often scarcely mentions, since they are transparently clear to anyone who gives them his attention.

    Synthesis, by contrast, employs a directly opposite method where the search is, as it were, a posteriori (though the proof itself is often more a priori than it is in the analytic method). It demonstrates the conclusion clearly and employs a long series of definitions, postulates, axioms, theorems and problems, so that if anyone denies one of the conclusions it can be shown at once that it is contained in what has gone before, and hence the reader, however argumentative or stubborn he may be, is compelled to give his assent. However, this method is not as satisfying as the method of analysis, nor does it engage the minds of those who are eager to learn, since it does not show how the thing in question was discovered.

    It was synthesis alone that the ancient geometers usually employed in their writings. But in my view this was not because they were utterly ignorant of analysis, but because they had such a high regard for it that they kept it to themselves like a sacred mystery.

    Now it is analysis which is the best and truest method of instruction, and it was this method alone which I employed in my Meditations. As for synthesis, which is undoubtedly what you are asking me to use here, it is a method which it may be very suitable to deploy in geometry as a follow-up to analysis, but it cannot so conveniently be applied to these metaphysical subjects.

    The difference is that the primary notions which are presupposed for the demonstration of geometrical truths are readily accepted by anyone, since they accord with the use of our senses. Hence there is no difficulty there, except in the proper deduction of the consequences, which can be done even by the less attentive, provided they remember what has gone before. Moreover, the breaking down of propositions to their smallest elements is specifically designed to enable them to be recited with ease so that the student recalls them whether he wants to or not.

    In metaphysics by contrast there is nothing which causes so much effort as making our perception of the primary notions clear and distinct. Admittedly, they are by their nature as evident as, or even more evident than, the primary notions which the geometers study; but they conflict with many preconceived opinions derived from the senses which we have got into the habit of holding from our earliest years, and so only those who really concentrate and meditate and withdraw their minds from corporeal things, so far as is possible, will achieve perfect knowledge of them. Indeed, if they were put forward in isolation, they could easily be denied by those who like to contradict just for the sake of it. (‘Second Set of Replies’, in PW, II, 110-11) {§4.2}


  1. [interpolated into the text of the Elements] What is analysis and what is synthesis. Analysis is the assumption of that which is sought as if it were admitted [and the arrival] by means of its consequences at something admitted to be true. Synthesis is an assumption of that which is admitted [and the arrival] by means of its consequences at something admitted to be true. (E, Book XIII, Prop. 1; Vol. III, 442, where Heath comments on the interpolation) {§2.2}

Frege, Gottlob

  1. [In replying to the objections that Husserl had raised in his Philosophie der Arithmetik (1891) to Frege’s Grundlagen definitions] If words and combinations of words refer to [bedeuten] ideas, then for any two of them there are only two possibilities: either they designate the same idea or they designate different ideas. In the former case it is pointless to equate them by means of a definition: this is ‘an obvious circle’; in the latter case it is wrong. These are also the objections the author raises, one of them regularly. A definition is also incapable of analysing the sense, for the analysed sense just is not the original one. In using the word to be explained, I either think clearly everything I think when I use the defining expression: we then have the ‘obvious circle’; or the defining expression has a more richly articulated sense, in which case I do not think the same thing in using it as I do in using the word to be explained: the definition is then wrong. One would think that a definition was unobjectionable in the case where the word to be explained had as yet no sense at all, or where we were asked explicitly to regard its sense as non-existent so that it was first given a sense by the definition. But in the last case too, the author refutes the definition by reminding us of the difference between the ideas (p. 107). To evade all objections, one would accordingly have to create a new verbal root and form a word out of it. This reveals a split between psychological logicians and mathematicians. What matters to the former is the sense of the words, as well as the ideas which they fail to distinguish from the sense; whereas what matters to the latter is the thing itself: the Bedeutung of the words. The reproach that what is defined is not the concept but its extension actually affects all mathematical definitions. For the mathematician, it is no more right and no more wrong to define a conic as the line of intersection of a plane with the surface of a circular cone than to define it as a plane curve with an equation of the second degree in parallel coordinates. His choice of one or the other of these expressions or of some other one is guided solely by reasons of convenience and is made irrespective of the fact that the expressions have neither the same sense nor evoke the same ideas. I do not intend by this that a concept and its extension are one and the same, but that coincidence in extension is a necessary and sufficient criterion for the occurrence between concepts of the relation that corresponds to identity [Gleichheit] between objects. (RH, 319-20/FR, 225-6) {§6.2}

  2. We come to definitions. Definitions proper must be distinguished from elucidations [Erläuterungen]. In the first stages of any discipline we cannot avoid the use of ordinary words. But these words are, for the most part, not really appropriate for scientific purposes, because they are not precise enough and fluctuate in their use. Science needs technical terms that have precise and fixed Bedeutungen, and in order to come to an understanding about these Bedeutungen and exclude possible misunderstandings, we provide elucidations. Of course in so doing we have again to use ordinary words, and these may display defects similar to those which the elucidations are intended to remove. So it seems that we shall then have to provide further elucidations. Theoretically one will never really achieve one’s goal in this way. In practice, however, we do manage to come to an understanding about the Bedeutungen of words. Of course we have to be able to count on a meeting of minds, on others’ guessing what we have in mind. But all this precedes the construction of a system and does not belong within a system. In constructing a system it must be assumed that the words have precise Bedeutungen and that we know what they are. (LM, 224/FR, 313) {§6.2}

  3. We have ... to distinguish two quite different cases:

    1. We construct a sense out of its constituents and introduce an entirely new sign to express this sense. This may be called a ‘constructive definition’ [‘aufbauende Definition’], but we prefer to call it a ‘definition’ tout court.

    2. We have a simple sign with a long-established use. We believe that we can give a logical analysis [Zerlegung] of its sense, obtaining a complex expression which in our opinion has the same sense. We can only allow something as a constituent of a complex expression if it has a sense we recognize. The sense of the complex expression must be yielded by the way in which it is put together. That it agrees with the sense of the long established simple sign is not a matter for arbitrary stipluation, but can only be recognized by an immediate insight. No doubt we speak of a definition in this case too. It might be called an ‘analytic definition’ [‘zerlegende Definition’] to distinguish it from the first case. But it is better to eschew the word ‘definition’ altogether in this case, because what we should here like to call a definition is really to be regarded as an axiom. In this second case there remains no room for an arbitrary stipulation, because the simple sign already has a sense. Only a sign which as yet has no sense can have a sense arbitrarily assigned to it. So we shall stick to our original way of speaking and call only a constructive definition a definition. According to that a definition is an arbitrary stipulation which confers a sense on a simple sign which previously had none. This sense has, of course, to be expressed by a complex sign whose sense results from the way it is put together.

    Now we still have to consider the difficulty we come up against in giving a logical analysis when it is problematic whether this analysis is correct.

    Let us assume that A is the long-established sign (expression) whose sense we have attempted to analyse logically by constructing a complex expression that gives the analysis. Since we are not certain whether the analysis is successful, we are not prepared to present the complex expression as one which can be replaced by the simple sign A. If it is our intention to put forward a definition proper, we are not entitled to choose the sign A, which already has a sense, but we must choose a fresh sign B, say, which has the sense of the complex expression only in virtue of the definition. The question now is whether A and B have the same sense. But we can bypass this question altogether if we are constructing a new system from the bottom up; in that case we shall make no further use of the sign A – we shall only use B. We have introduced the sign B to take the place of the complex expression in question by arbitrary fiat and in this way we have conferred a sense on it. This is a definition in the proper sense, namely a constructive definition.

    If we have managed in this way to construct a system for mathematics without any need for the sign A, we can leave the matter there; there is no need at all to answer the question concerning the sense in which – whatever it may be – this sign had been used earlier. In this way we court no objections. However, it may be felt expedient to use sign A instead of sign B. But if we do this, we must treat it as an entirely new sign which had no sense prior to the definition. We must therefore explain that the sense in which this sign was used before the new system was constructed is no longer of any concern to us, that its sense is to be understood purely from the constructive definition that we have given. In constructing the new system we can take no account, logically speaking, of anything in mathematics that existed prior to the new system. Everything has to be made anew from the ground up. Even anything that we may have accomplished by our analytical activities is to be regarded only as preparatory work which does not itself make any appearance in the new system itself.

    Perhaps there still remains a certain unclarity. How is it possible, one may ask, that it should be doubtful whether a simple sign has the same sense as a complex expression if we know not only the sense of the simple sign, but can recognize the sense of the complex one from the way it is put together? The fact is that if we really do have a clear grasp of the sense of the simple sign, then it cannot be doubtful whether it agrees with the sense of the complex expression. If this is open to question although we can clearly recognize the sense of the complex expression from the way it is put together, then the reason must lie in the fact that we do not have a clear grasp of the sense of the simple sign, but that its outlines are confused as if we saw it through a mist. The effect of the logical analysis of which we spoke will then be precisely this – to articulate the sense clearly. Work of this kind is very useful; it does not, however, form part of the construction of the system, but must take place beforehand. Before the work of construction is begun, the building stones have to be carefully prepared so as to be usable; i.e. the words, signs, expressions, which are to be used, must have a clear sense, so far as a sense is not to be conferred on them in the system itself by means of a constructive definition.

    We stick then to our original conception: a definition is an arbitrary stipulation by which a new sign is introduced to take the place of a complex expression whose sense we know from the way it is put together. A sign which hitherto had no sense acquires the sense of a complex expression by definition. (LM, 227-9/FR, 317-8) {§6.2}

Geertz, Clifford

  1. Analysis … is sorting out the structures of signification … and determining their social ground and import. (The Interpretation of Cultures, New York: Basic Books, 1973, 9)

  2. Cultural analysis is (or should be) guessing at meanings, assessing the guesses, and drawing explanatory conclusions from the better guesses, not discovering the Continent of Meaning and mapping out its bodiless landscape. (Ibid., 20)

Hegel, Georg W.F.

  1. The analysis of an idea, as it used to be carried out, was, in fact, nothing else than ridding it of the form in which it had become familiar. To break an idea up into its original elements is to return to its moments, which at least do not have the form of the given idea, but rather constitute the immediate property of the self. This analysis, to be sure, only arrives at thoughts which are themselves familiar, fixed, and inert determinations. But what is thus separated and non-actual is an essential moment; for it is only because the concrete does divide itself, and make itself into something non-actual, that it is self-moving. The activity of dissolution is the power and work of the Understanding, the most astonishing and mightiest of powers, or rather the absolute power. The circle that remains self-enclosed and, like substance, holds its moments together, is an immediate relationship, one therefore which has nothing astonishing about it. But that an accident as such, detached from what circumscribes it, what is bound and is actual only in its context with others, should attain an existence of its own and a separate freedom—this is the tremendous power of the negative; it is the energy of thought, of the pure ‘I’. Death, if that is what we want to call this non-actuality, is of all things the most dreadful, and to hold fast what is dead requires the greatest strength. Lacking strength, Beauty hates the Understanding for asking of her what it cannot do. But the life of Spirit is not the life that shrinks from death and keeps itself untouched by devastation, but rather the life that endures it and maintains itself in it. It wins its truth only when, in utter dismemberment, it finds itself. It is this power, not as something positive, which closes its eyes to the negative, as when we say of something that it is nothing or is false, and then, having done with it, turn away and pass on to something else; on the contrary, Spirit is this power only by looking the negative in the face, and tarrying with it. This tarrying with the negative is the magical power that converts it into being. This power is identical with what we earlier called the Subject, which by giving determinateness an existence in its own element supersedes abstract immediacy, i.e. the immediacy which barely is, and thus is authentic substance: that being or immediacy whose mediation is not outside of it but which is this mediation itself. (PS, ‘Preface’, §32, 18-19)

    [Summary of above passage offered by J.N. Findlay] The analysis of an idea is the removal of its familiarity, its reduction to elements that are the true possessions of the thinking self. In such reduction the idea itself changes and renders itself unreal. The force which effects analysis is that of the Understanding, the most remarkable and absolute of powers, the power of the thinking self and also of death. It is above all marvellous that this thinking self should be able to isolate, and to look at apart, what can only exist as an aspect or ‘moment’ in a living whole. Thinking Spirit can, however, only grasp such a whole by first tearing it into parts, each of which it must look at separately for a while, before putting them back in the whole. The thinking self must destroy an immediate, existent unity in order to arrive at a unity which includes mediation, and is in fact mediation itself. (‘Analysis of the Text’, §32, in PS, 499) {§5.2}

Heidegger, Martin

  1. What we are trying to bring to light here by means of phenomenological analysis in regard to the intentional structure of production is not contrived and fabricated but already present in the everyday, pre-philosophical productive behaviour of the Dasein. In producing, the Dasein lives in such an understanding of being without conceiving it or grasping it as such. (1927, §12, 114-15) {§5.8}

Hobbes, Thomas

  1. every method by which we investigate the causes of things is either compositive, or resolutive, or partly compositive, partly resolutive. And the resolutive is usually called analytic, while the compositive is usually called synthetic. (Logica, ‘On Method’, §1, 289) {§4.1}

  2. What philosophers seek to know. Philosophers seek scientific knowledge either simply or indefinitely, that is, they seek to knkow as much as they can when no definite question is proposed or the cause of some definite phenomenon or at least to discover something definite, such as what the cause of light is, or of heat, or gravity, of a figure which has been proposed, and similar things; or in what subject some proposed accident inheres; or which of many accidents is above all conducive to the production of some proposed effect; or in what way particular proposed causes ought to be conjoined in order to produce a definite effect. Because of the variety of the things sought for, sometimes the analytic method, sometimes the synthetic method, and sometimes both ought to be applied.

    The first part, by which principles are found, is purely analytic. Seeing that the causes of all singulars are composed from the causes of universals or simples, it is necessary for those who are looking simply for scientific knowledge, which consists of the knowledge of the causes of all things insofar as this can be achieved, to know the causes of universals or those accidents which are common to all bodies, that is, to every material thing, before they know the causes of singular things, that is, of the accidents by which one thing is distinguished from another. Again, before the causes of those things can be known, it is necessary to know which things are universals. But since universals are contained in the nature of singular things, they must be unearthed by reason, that is, by resolution. For example, let any conception or idea of a singular thing be proposed, say a square. The square is resolved into: plane, bounded by a certain number of lines equal to one another, and right angles. Therefore we have these universals or components of every material thing: line, plane (in which a surface is contained), being bounded, angle, rectitude, and equality. If anyone finds the causes or origin of these, he will put them together as the cause of the square. Again, if he proposes to himself the conception of gold, the ideas of being solid, visible, and heavy (that is, of tending to the center of the earth or of motion downwards) and many others more universal than gold itself, which can be resolved further until one arrives at the most universal, will come from this by resolution. And by this same method of resolving things into other things one will know what those things are, of which, when their causes are known what those things are, of which, when their causes are known and composed one by one, the causes of all singular things are known. We thus conclude that the method of investigating the universal notions of things is purely analytic. (Ibid., §§ 3-4, 291-5) {§4.1}

  3. The method of scientific knowledge, civil as well as natural, [starting] from sense-experience and [going] to principles is analytic; while [starting] from principles is synthetic. (Ibid., §7, 301) {§4.1}

  4. it is obvious that in the investigation of causes there is a need partly for the analytic method, partly for the synthetic method. The analytic method is needed for understanding the circumstances of the effect one by one; the synthetic method for putting together those things which, single in themselves, act as one. (Ibid., §10, 311) {§4.1}

  5. that art of geometers which they call logistic is ... the method according to which by supposing that the thing asked about is true they come upon in reasoning either things known [to be true], from which they can prove the truth of the thing sought, or [they come upon] impossibilities, from which it can be understood that what was supposed [to be true] was false. (Ibid., §19, 329) {§4.1}

Hodges, Wilfrid

  1. [Logical analysis] stands somewhere between translating and paraphrasing. (Logic, Harmondsworth: Penguin, 1977, 86)

Holton, Gerald

  1. The terms “analysis” and “synthesis” bring to mind, on the one hand, certain methodological practices in the works of Plato, Descartes, Newton, Kant, Hegel, and others and, on the other hand, techniques in fields as disparate as chemistry and logic, mathematics and psychology. The width of this spectrum of associations alerts us to the realization that at the base of these two related terms there lies a specific methodological thema-antithema ... pair. Indeed, it is one of the most pervasive and fundamental ones, in science and outside. This chapter attempts to uncover and identify this thematic content, to clarify the meanings and uses of the terms “analysis” and “synthesis”, and especially to distinguish among four general meanings: (1) Analysis and Synthesis, and particularly synthesis, used in the grand, cultural sense, (2) Analysis and Synthesis used in the reconstitutional sense (e.g., where an analysis, followed by a synthesis, re-establishes the original condition), (3) Analysis and Synthesis used in the transformational sense (e.g., where the application of Analysis and Synthesis advances one to a qualitatively new level), and (4) Analysis and Synthesis used in the judgmental sense (as in the Kantian categories and their modern critiques). (1998, 111) {§5.5}

Husserl, Edmund

  1. The point of view of function is the central one for phenomenology; the investigations radiating from it comprise almost the whole phenomenological sphere, and in the end all phenomenological analyses somehow enter into its service as component parts or preliminary stages. In place of analysis and comparison, description and classification restricted to particular experiences [Erlebnisse], the particulars are considered from the “teleological” point of view of their function, to make possible “synthetic unity”. (IPP, I, §86; Kersten’s tr. modified) {§5.8}

  2. Explication is penetration of the internal horizon of the object by the direction of perceptual interest. In the case of the unobstructed realization of this interest, the protentional expectations fulfill themselves in the same way; the object reveals itself in its properties as that which it was anticipated to be, except that what was anticipated now attains original givenness. A more precise determination results, eventually perhaps partial corrections, or—in the case of obstruction—disappointment of the expectations, and partial modalization. (EJ, §22, 105) {§5.8}

  3. The process of explication in its originality is that in which an object given at first hand is brought to explicit intuition. The analysis of its structure must bring to light how a twofold constitution of sense [Sinngebung] is realized in it: “object as substrate” and “determination α ...”; it must show how this constitution of sense is realized in the form of a process which goes forward in separate steps, through which, however, extends continuously a unity of coincidence—a unity of coincidence of a special kind, belonging exclusively to these sense-forms. (EJ, §24a, 114) {§5.8}

Kant, Immanuel


    There are two ways in which one can arrive at a general concept: either by the arbitrary combination of concepts, or by separating out that cognition which has been rendered distinct by means of analysis. Mathematics only ever draws up its definitions in the first way. For example, think arbitrarily of four straight lines bounding a plane surface so that the opposite sides are not parallel to each other. Let this figure be called a trapezium. The concept which I am defining is not given prior to the definition itself; on the contrary, it only comes into existence as a result of that definition. Whatever the concept of a cone may ordinarily signify, in mathematics, the concept is the product of the arbitrary representation of a right-angled triangle which is rotated on one of its sides. In this and in all other cases the definition obviously comes into being as a result of synthesis.

    The situation is entirely different in the case of philosophical definitions. In philosophy, the concept of a thing is always given, albeit confusedly or in an insufficiently determinate fashion. The concept has to be analysed; the characteristic marks which have been separated out and the concept which has been given have to be compared with each other in all kinds of contexts; and this abstract thought must be rendered complete and determinate. For example, everyone has a concept of time. But suppose that that concept has to be defined. The idea of time has to be examined in all kinds of relation if its characteristic marks which have been abstracted have to be combined together to see whether they yield an adequate concept; they have to be collated with each other to see whether one characteristic mark does not partly include another within itself. If, in this case, I had tried to arrive at a definition of time synthetically, it would have had to have been a happy coincidence indeed if the concept, thus reached synthetically, had been exactly the same as that which completely expresses the idea of time which is given to us. (IDP, 2:276-7/TP, 248-9) {§4.5}

  2. The true method of metaphysics is basically the same as that introduced by Newton into natural science and which has been of such benefit to it. Newton’s method maintains that one ought, on the basis of certain experience and, if need be, with the help of geometry, to seek out the rules in accordance with which certain phenomena of nature occur. (IDP, 2:286/TP, 259) {§4.5}

  3. What I am chiefly concerned to establish is this: in metaphysics one must proceed analytically throughout, for the business of metaphysics is actually the analysis of confused cognitions. If this procedure is compared with the procedure which is adopted by philosophers and which is currently in vogue in all schools of philosophy, one will be struck by how mistaken the practice of philosophers is. With them, the most abstracted concepts, at which the understanding naturally arrives last of all, constitute their starting point, and the reason is that the method of the mathematicians, which they wish to imitate throughout, is firmly fixed in their minds. This is why there is a strange difference to be found between metaphysics and all other sciences. In geometry and in the other branches of mathematics, one starts with what is easier and then one slowly advances to the more difficult operations. In metaphysics, one starts with what is the most difficult: one starts with possibility, with existence in general, with necessity and contingency, and so on – all of them concepts which demand great abstraction and close attention. And the reason for this is to be sought chiefly in the fact that the signs for these concepts undergo numerous and imperceptible modifications in use; and the differences between them must not be overlooked. One is told that one ought to proceed synthetically throughout. Definitions are thus set up right at the beginning, and conclusions are confidently drawn from them. Those who practise philosophy in this vein congratulate each other for having learnt the secret of thorough thought from the geometers. What they do not notice at all is the fact that geometers acquire their concepts by means of synthesis, whereas philosophers can only acquire their concepts by means of analysis – and that completely changes the method of thought. ...

    Metaphysics has a long way to go yet before it can proceed synthetically. It will only be when analysis has helped us towards concepts which are understood distinctly and in detail that it will be possible for synthesis to subsume compound cognitions under the simplest cognition, as happens in mathematics. (IDP, 2:289-90/TP, 262-3) {§4.5}

  4. Such a system of pure (speculative) reason I hope myself to deliver under the title Metaphysics of Nature, which will be not half so extensive but will be incomparably richer in content than this critique, which had first to display the sources and conditions of its possibility, and needed to clear and level a ground that was completely overgrown. Here I expect from my reader the patience and impartiality of a judge, but there I will expect the cooperative spirit and assistance of a fellow worker; for however completely the principles of the system may be expounded in the critique, the comprehensiveness of the system itself requires also that no derivative concepts should be lacking, which, however, cannot be estimated a priori in one leap, but must be gradually sought out; likewise, just as in the former the whole synthesis of concepts has been exhausted, so in the latter it would be additionally demanded that the same thing should take place in respect of their analysis, which would be easy and more entertainment than labor. (CPR, Axxi) {§4.5}

  5. I understand by an analytic of concepts not their analysis, or the usual procedure of philosophical investigations, that of analyzing [zergliedern] the content of concepts that present themselves and bringing them to distinctness, but rather the much less frequently attempted analysis [Zergliederung] of the faculty of understanding itself, in order to research the possibility of a priori concepts by seeking them only in the understanding as their birthplace and analyzing its pure use in general; for this is the proper business of a transcendental philosophy; the rest is the logical treatment of concepts in philosophy in general. We will therefore pursue the pure concepts into their first seeds and predispositions in the human understanding, where they lie ready, until with the opportunity of experience they are finally developed and exhibited in their clarity by the very same understanding, liberated from the empirical conditions attaching to them. (CPR, A65-6/B90-1) {§4.5}

  6. [in offering a refutation of Mendelssohn’s proof of the persistence of the soul] If we take the above propositions in a synthetic connection, as valid for all thinking beings, as they must be taken in rational psychology as a system, and if from the category of relation, starting with the proposition “All thinking beings are, as such, substances” we go backward through the series of propositions until the circle closes, then we finally come up against the existence of thinking beings, which in this system are conscious of themselves not only as independent of external things but also as being able to determine themselves from themselves (in regard to the persistence belonging necessarily to the character of a substance). But from this it follows that idealism, at least problematic idealism, is unavoidable in that same rationalistic system, and if the existence of external things is not at all required for the determination of one’s own existence in time, then such things are only assumed, entirely gratuitously, without a proof of them being able to be given.

    If, on the contrary, we follow the analytic procedure, grounded on the “I think” given as a proposition that already includes existence in itself, and hence grounded on modality, and then we take it apart so as to cognize its content, whether and how this I determines its existence in space or time merely through it, then the propositions of the rational doctrine of the soul begin not from the concept of a thinking being in general but from an actuality; and from the way this is thought, after everything empirical has been detached from it, it is concluded what pertains to a thinking being in general ... (CPR, B416-19) {§4.5}

  7. Give a philosopher the concept of a triangle, and let him try to find out in his way how the sum of its angles might be related to a right angle. He has nothing but the concept of a figure enclosed by three straight lines, and in it the concept of equally many angles. Now he may reflect on this concept as long as he wants, yet he will never produce anything new. He can analyze [zergliedern] and make distinct the concept of a straight line, or of an angle, or of the number three, but he will not come upon any other properties that do not already lie in these concepts. But now let the geometer take up this question. He begins at once to construct a triangle. Since he knows that two right angles together are exactly equal to all of the adjacent angles that can be drawn at one point on a straight line, he extends one side of his triangle, and obtains two adjacent angles that together are equal to two right ones. Now he divides the external one of these angles by drawing a line parallel to the opposite side of the triangle, and sees that here there arises an external adjacent angle which is equal to an internal one, etc. In such a way, through a chain of inferences that is always guided by intuition, he arrives at a fully illuminating and at the same time general solution of the question. (CPR, A716-7/B744-5) {§4.5}

  8. although a mere plan that might precede the Critique of Pure Reason would be unintelligible, undependable, and useless, it is by contrast all the more useful if it comes after. For one will thereby be put in the position to survey the whole, to test one by one the main points at issue in this science, and to arrange many things in the exposition better than could be done in the first execution of the work.

    Here then is such a plan subsequent to the completed work, which now can be laid out according to the analytic method, whereas the work itself absolutely had to be composed according to the synthetic method, so that the science might present all of its articulations, as the structural organization of a quite peculiar faculty of cognition, in their natural connection. (PFM, 4:263/ 13) {§4.5}

  9. In the Critique of Pure Reason I worked on this question [Is metaphysics possible at all?] synthetically, namely by inquiring within pure reason itself, and seeking to determine within this source both the elements and the laws of its pure use, according to principles. This work is difficult and requires a resolute reader to think himself little by little into a system that takes no foundation as given except reason itself, and that therefore tries to develop cognition out of its original seeds without relying on any fact whatever. Prolegomena should by contrast be preparatory exercises; they ought more to indicate what needs to be done in order to bring a science into existence if possible, than to present the science itself. They must therefore rely on something already known to be dependable, from which we can go forward with confidence and ascend to the sources, which are not yet known, and whose discovery not only will explain what is known already, but will also exhibit an area with many cognitions that all arise from these same sources. The methodological procedure of prolegomena, and especially of those that are to prepare for a future metaphysics, will therefore be analytic. (PFM, 4:274-5/ 25-6) {§4.5}

Lakatos, Imre

  1. [interpreting the method of analysis in ancient Greek geometry] Rule of analysis and synthesis: Draw conclusions from your conjecture, one after the other, assuming that it is true. If you reach a false conclusion, then your conjecture was false. If you reach an indubitably true conclusion, your conjecture may have been true. In this case reverse the process, work backwards, and try to deduce your original conjecture via the inverse route from the indubitable truth to the dubitable conjecture. If you succeed, you have proved your conjecture. (1978a, 72-3) {§2.2}

Leibniz, Gottfried Wilhelm

  1. Synthesis is when, beginning from principles and running through truths in order, we discover certain progressions and form tables, as it were, or sometimes even general formulae, in which the answers to what arises later can be discovered. Analysis, however, goes back to principles solely for the sake of a given problem, just as if nothing had been discovered previously, by ourselves or by others. It is better to produce a synthesis, since that work is of permanent value, whereas when we begin an analysis on account of particular problems we often do what has been done before. However, to use a synthesis which has been established by others, and theorems which have already been discovered, is less of an art than to do everything by oneself by carrying out an analysis; especially as what has been discovered by others, or even by ourselves, does not always occur to us or come to hand. There are two kinds of analysis: one is the common type proceeding by leaps, which is used in algebra, and the other is a special kind which I call ‘reductive’. This is much more elegant, but is less well-known. In practice, analysis is more necessary, so that we may solve the problems which are presented to us; but the man who can indulge in theorising will be content to practice analysis just far enough to master the art. For the rest, he will rather practise synthesis, and will apply himself readily only to those questions to which order itself leads him. For in this way he will always progress pleasantly and easily, and will never feel any difficulties, nor be disappointed of success, and in a short time he will achieve much more than he would ever have hoped for at the outset. (USA, 16-17) {§4.4}

  2. Primary truths are those which either state a term of itself, or deny an opposite of its opposite. For example, ‘A is A’, or ‘A is not not-A’ ...

    All other truths are reduced to primary truths by the aid of definitions—i.e. by the analysis of notions; and this constitutes a priori proof, independent of experience. ...

    The predicate or consequent, therefore, is always in the subject or antecedent, and this constitutes the nature of truth in general, or, the connexion between the terms of a proposition, as Aristotle also has observed. In identities this connexion and inclusion of the predicate in the subject is express, whereas in all other truths it is implicit and must be shown through the analysis of notions, in which a priori demonstration consists. (PT, 87-8) {§4.4}

  3. There are two kinds of truths, those of reason and those of fact. Truths of reason are necessary and their opposite is impossible; truths of fact are contingent and their opposite is possible. When a truth is necessary, its reason can be found by analysis, resolving it into simpler ideas and truths, until we come to those that are primitive. (M, §33; tr. R. Latta) {§4.4}

Lichtenberg, Georg Christoph

  1. Our whole philosophy is rectification of colloquial linguistic usage. (Aphorisms, 115) {§4.5}

  2. Writing is an excellent means of awakening in every man the system slumbering within him; and everyone who has ever written will have discovered that writing always awakens something which, though it lay within us, we failed clearly to recognize before. (Ibid., 119) {§4.5}

  3. Whichever way you look at it, philosophy is always analytical chemistry. The peasant employs all the propositions of the most abstract philosophy, only he employs them enveloped, concealed, compounded, latent, as the chemist and physicist says; the philosopher gives us the propositions pure. (Ibid., 162) {§4.5}

Locke, John

  1. There are therefore three ways whereby we get the complex Ideas of mixed Modes. 1. By Experience and Observation of things themselves. Thus by seeing two Men wrestle, or fence, we get the Idea of wrestling or fencing. 2. By Invention, or voluntary putting together of several simple Ideas in our own Minds: So he that first invented Printing, or Etching, had an Idea of it in his Mind, before it ever existed. 3. Which is the most usual way, by explaining the names of Actions we never saw, or Notions we cannot see; and by enumerating, and thereby, as it were, setting before our Imaginations all those Ideas which go to the making them up, and are the constituent parts of them. For having by Sensation and Reflection stored our Minds with simple Ideas, and by use got the Names, that stand for them, we can by those Names represent to another any complex Idea, we would have him conceive; so that it has in it no simple Idea, but what he knows, and has, with us, the same name for. For all our complex Ideas are ultimately resolvable into simple Ideas, of which they are compounded, and originally made up, though perhaps their immediate Ingredients, as I may so say, are also complex Ideas. Thus the mixed Mode, which the word Lye stands for, is made of these simple Ideas: 1. Articulate Sounds. 2. Certain Ideas in the Mind of the Speaker. 3. Those words the signs of those Ideas. 4. Those signs put together by affirmation or negation, otherwise than the Ideas they stand for, are in the mind of the Speaker. I think I need not go any farther in the Analysis of that complex Idea, we call a Lye: What I have said is enough to shew, that it is made up of simple Ideas: And it could not be an offensive tediousness to my Reader, to trouble him with a more minute enumeration of every particular simple Idea, that goes to this complex one; which, from what has been said, he cannot but be able to make out to himself. The same may be done in all our complex Ideas whatsoever; which however compounded, and decompounded, may at last be resolved into simple Ideas, which are all the Materials of Knowledge or Thought we have or can have. (Essay, II, xxii, 9) {§4.3}

Lodge, David

  1. Analysis has a way of unravelling the self: the longer you pull on the thread, the more flaws you find. (Therapy, London, 31)

Mendelssohn, Moses

  1. The certainty of mathematics is based upon the general axiom that nothing can be and not be at the same time. In this science each proposition such as, for example, “A is B”, is proven in one of two ways. Either one unpacks the concepts of A and shows “A is B”, or one unpacks the concepts of B and infers from this that not-B must also be not-A. Both types of proof are thus based upon the principle of contradiction, and since the object of mathematics in general is magnitude and that of geometry in particular extension, one can say that in mathematics in general our concepts of magnitude are unpacked and analyzed, while in geometry in particular our concepts of extension are unpacked and analyzed. In fact, since geometry lays nothing else as its basis than the abstract concept of extension and derives all its conclusions from this single source – deriving them, to be sure, in such a way that one recognizes distinctly that everything maintained in it is necessarily connected by the principle of contradiction with the abstracted concept of extension, there is no doubt that all geometric truths that geometry teaches us to unpack or untangle from the concept of extension must be encountered all tangled up in it. For what else can the profoundest inferences do but analyze a concept and make distinct what was obscure? Such inferences cannot bring in what is not to be found in the concept, and it is easy to see that it is also not possible, by means of the principle of contradiction, to derive from the concept what is not to be found in it. In the concept of extension, for example, there lies the inner possibility that a space is limited by three straight lines in such a way that two of them include a right angle. For it follows from the essence of extension that it is capable of many sorts of limitations and that the assumed sort of limitation of one of its level planes contains no contradiction. If one subsequently shows that the concept of this assumed limitation or of a right-angled triangle necessarily entails that the square of the hypotenuse is such-and-such, then it must have also been possible to find this truth originally and implicitly in the initial concept of extension. Otherwise it could never have been derived from it by means of the principle of contradiction. The idea of extension is inseparable from the idea of the possibility of such a limitation, as was previously assumed, and the limitation is in turn necessarily connected to the concept of the equality of the aforesaid square. Thus, this truth also lay tangled up, as one might say, in the original concept of extension, but it escaped our attention and could not be distinctly known and distinguished until, through analysis, we unpacked all the parts of this concept and separated them from one another. The analysis of concepts is for the understanding nothing more than what the maginfying glass is for sight. It does not produce anything that was not to be found in the object. But it spreads out the parts of the object and makes it possible for our senses to distinguish much that they would otherwise not have noticed. The analysis of concepts does nothing different from this; it makes the parts and members of these concepts, which were previously obscure and unnoticed, distinct and recognizable, but it does not introduce anything into the concepts that was not already to be found in them. (1763, §1/PW, 257-8) {§4.5}

Moore, G. E.

  1. It seems necessary, then, to regard the world as formed of concepts. These are the only objects of knowledge. They cannot be regarded fundamentally as abstractions either from things or from ideas; since both alike can, if anything is to be true of them, be composed of nothing but concepts. A thing becomes intelligible first when it is analysed into its constituent concepts. (NJ, 8) {§6.4}

  2. It appears to me that in Ethics, as in all other philosophical studies, the difficulties and disagreements, of which its history is full, are mainly due to a very simple cause: namely to the attempt to answer questions, without first discovering precisely what question it is which you desire to answer. I do not know how far this source of error would be done away, if philosophers would try to discover what question they were asking, before they set about to answer it; for the work of analysis and distinction is often very difficult: we may often fail to make the necessary discovery, even though we make a definite attempt to do so. But I am inclined to think that in many cases a resolute attempt would be sufficient to ensure success; so that, if only this attempt were made, many of the most glaring difficulties and disagreements in philosophy would disappear. (PE, vii) {§6.4}

  3. My point is that ‘good’ is a simple notion, just as ‘yellow’ is a simple notion; that, just as you cannot, by any manner of means, explain to any one who does not already know it, what yellow is, so you cannot explain what good is. Definitions of the kind that I was asking for, definitions which describe the real nature of the object or notion denoted by a word, and which do not merely tell us what the word is used to mean, are only possible when the object or notion in question is something complex. You can give a definition of a horse, because a horse has many different properties and qualities, all of which you can enumerate. But when you have enumerated them all, when you have reduced a horse to his simplest terms, then you no longer define those terms. They are simply something which you think of or perceive, and to any one who cannot think of or perceive them, you can never, by any definition, make their nature known. (PE, 7) {§6.4}

Newton, Isaac

  1. As in Mathematicks, so in Natural Philosophy, the Investigation of difficult Things by the Method of Analysis, ought ever to precede the Method of Composition. This Analysis consists in making Experiments and Observations, and in drawing general Conclusions from them by Induction, and admitting of no Objections against the Conclusions, but such as are taken from Experiments, or other certain Truths. For Hypotheses are not to be regarded in experimental Philosophy. And although the arguing from Experiments and Observations by Induction be no Demonstration of general Conclusions; yet it is the best way of arguing which the Nature of Things admits of, and may be looked upon as so much the stronger, by how much the Induction is more general. And if no Exception occur from Phænomena, the Conclusion may be pronounced generally. But if at any time afterwards any Exception shall occur from Experiments, it may then begin to be pronounced with such Exceptions as occur. By this way of Analysis we may proceed from Compounds to Ingredients, and from Motions to the Forces producing them; and in general, from Effects to their Causes, and from particular Causes to more general ones, till the Argument end in the most general. This is the Method of Analysis: and the Synthesis consists in assuming the Causes discover’d, and establish’d as Principles, and by them explaining the Phænomena proceeding from them, and proving the Explanations. (Opticks, Book Three, Part I, 404-5) {§4.1}

Nietzsche, Friedrich

  1. All concepts in which an entire process is semiotically telescoped elude definition. (On the Genealogy of Morals, 1887, tr. Walter Kaufmann, New York: Random House, 1968, 80)

  2. the most valuable insights are methods. (The Antichrist, 1895, §13)


  1. The so-called Treasury of Analysis [analuomenos] .. is, in short, a special body of doctrines furnished for the use of those who, after going through the usual elements, wish to obtain the power of solving theoretical problems, which are set to them, and for this purpose only is it useful. It is the work of three men, Euclid the author of the Elements, Apollonius of Perga, and Aristaeus the Elder, and proceeds by the method of analysis and synthesis.

    Now analysis is the way from what is sought—as if it were admitted—through its concomitants [akolouthôn] in order to something admitted in synthesis. For in analysis we suppose that which is sought to be already done, and we inquire from what it results, and again what is the antecedent [proêgoumenon] of the latter, until we on our backward way light upon something already known and being first in order. And we call such a method analysis, as being a solution backwards [anapalin lysin].

    In synthesis, on the other hand, we suppose that which was reached last in analysis to be already done, and arranging in their natural order as consequents [epomena] the former antecedents [proêgoumena] and linking them one with another, we in the end arrive at the construction of the thing sought. And this we call synthesis.

    Now analysis is of two kinds. One seeks the truth, being called theoretical. The other serves to carry out what was desired to do, and this is called problematical. In the theoretical kind we suppose the thing sought as being and as being true, and then we pass through its concomitants [akolouthôn] in order, as though they were true and existent by hypothesis, to something admitted; then, if that which is admitted be true, the thing sought is true, too, and the proof will be the reverse of analysis. But if we come upon something false to admit, the thing sought will be false, too. In the problematic kind we suppose the desired thing to be known, and then we pass through its concomitants [akolouthôn] in order, as though they were true, up to something admitted. If the thing admitted is possible or can be done, that is, if it is what the mathematicians call given, the desired thing will also be possible. The proof will again be the reverse of analysis. But if we come upon something impossible to admit, the problem will also be impossible. (PAC, tr. in Hintikka and Remes 1974, 8-10) {§2.2}


  1. For we should remember that if a person goes on analyzing names into words, and inquiring also into the elements out of which the words are formed, and keeps on always repeating this process, he who has to answer him must at last give up the inquiry in despair … But if we take a word which is incapable of further resolution, then we shall be right in saying that we at last reached a primary element, which need not be resolved any further. (‘Cratylus’, Benjamin Jowett (trans.), in Hamilton and Cairns (ed.), Collected Dialogues, New York: Pantheon Books, 421e)

  2. Then, said I, is not dialectic the only process of inquiry that advances in this manner, doing away with hypotheses, up to the first principle itself in order to find confirmation there? And it is literally true that when the eye of the soul is sunk in the barbaric slough of the Orphic Myth, dialectic gently draws it forth and leads it up, employing as helpers and cooperators in this conversation the studies and sciences which we enumerated, which we called sciences often from habit, though they really need some other designation, connoting more clearness than opinion and more obscurity than science. ‘Understanding’ I believe was the term we employed. But, I presume we shall not dispute about the name when things of such moment lie before us for consideration. (‘Republic VII’, Paul Shorey (trans.), Ibid., 533d)

  3. Understand then, said I, that by the other section of the intelligible I mean that which the reason lays hold of by the power of dialectic, treating its assumptions not as absolute beginnings but literally as hypotheses, underpinnings, footings and springboards so to speak, to enable it to rise to that which requires no assumption and is the starting point of all, and after attaining to that again taking hold of the first dependencies from it, so to proceed downward to the conclusion, making no use whatever of any object of sense but only of pure ideas moving on through ideas to ideas and ending with ideas. (‘Republic VI’, Paul Shorey (trans.), Ibid., 511b)

Poincaré, Jules Henri

  1. In mathematics logic is called analysis, and analysis means division, dissection. It can have, therefore, no tool other than the scalpel and the microscope. (‘Intuition and Logic in Mathematics’, 1900, in William Ewald, ed., From Kant to Hilbert, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996, 1018)

Polya, George

  1. Nonmathematical illustration [of the method of analysis described by Pappus]. A primitive man wishes to cross a creek; but he cannot do so in the usual way because the water has risen overnight. Thus, the crossing becomes the object of a problem; “crossing the creek’ is the x of this primitive problem. The man may recall that he has crossed some other creek by walking along a fallen tree. He looks around for a suitable fallen tree which becomes his new unknown, his y. He cannot find any suitable tree but there are plenty of trees standing along he creek; he wishes that one of them would fall. Could he make a tree fall across the creek? There is a great idea and there is a new unknown; by what means could he tilt the tree over the creek?

    This train of ideas ought to be called analysis if we accept the terminology of Pappus. If the primitive man succeeds in finishing his analysis he may become the inventor of the bridge and of the axe. What will be the synthesis? Translation of ideas into actions. The finishing act of the synthesis is walking along a tree across the creek.

    The same objects fill the analysis and the synthesis; they exercise the mind of the man in the analysis and his muscles in the synthesis; the analysis consists in thoughts, the synthesis in acts. There is another difference; the order is reversed. Walking across the creek is the first desire from which the analysis starts and it is the last act with which the synthesis ends. (1957, 145) {§2.2}


  1. beauty and order are common to all branches of mathematics, as are the method of proceeding from things better known to things we seek to know and the reverse path from the latter to the former, the methods called analysis and synthesis. (CEE, 8/6-7) {§2.2}

  2. as Nous is set over understanding and dispenses principles to it from above, perfecting it out of its own riches, so in the same way dialectic, the purest part of philosophy, hovers attentively over mathematics, encompasses its whole development, and of itself contributes to the special sciences their various perfecting, critical, and intellective powers—the procedures, I mean, of analysis, division, definition, and demonstration. Being thus endowed and led towards perfection, mathematics reaches some of its results by analysis, others by synthesis, expounds some matters by division, others by definition, and some of its discoveries binds fast by demonstration, adapting these methods to its subjects and employing each of them for gaining insight into mediating ideas. Thus its analyses are under the control of dialectic, and its definitions, divisions, and demonstrations are of the same family and unfold in conformity with the way of mathematical understanding. It is reasonable, then, to say that dialectic is the capstone of the mathematical sciences. It brings to perfection all the intellectual insight they contain, making what is exact in them more irrefutable, confirming the stability of what they have established and referring what is pure and incorporeal in them to the simplicity and immateriality of Nous, making precise their primary starting-points through definitions and explicating the distinctions of genera and species within their subject-matters, teaching the use of synthesis to bring out the consequences that follow from principles and of analysis to lead up to the first principles and starting-points. (CEE, 42-3/35-6) {§2.2}

  3. Magnitudes, figures and their boundaries, and the ratios that are found in them, as well as their properties, their various positions and motions—these are what geometry studies, proceeding from the partless point down to solid bodies, whose many species and differences it explores, then following the reverse path from the more complex objects to the simpler ones and their principles. It makes use of synthesis and analysis, always starting from hypotheses and first principles that it obtains from the science above it and employing all the procedures of dialectic—definition and division for establishing first principles and articulating species and genera, and demonstrations and analyses in dealing with the consequences that follow from first principles, in order to show the more complex matters both as proceeding from the simpler and also conversely as leading back to them. (CEE, 57/46) {§2.2}

  4. [Euclid’s Elements] contains all the dialectical methods: the method of division for finding kinds, definitions for making statements of essential properties, demonstrations for proceeding from premises to conclusions, and analysis for passing in the reverse direction from conclusions to principles. (CEE, 69/57) {§2.2}

  5. there are certain methods that have been handed down, the best being the method of analysis, which traces the desired result back to an acknowledged principle. Plato, it is said, taught this method to Leodamas, who also is reported to have made many discoveries in geometry by means of it. A second is the method of diaeresis, which divides into its natural parts the genus proposed for examination and which affords a starting-point for demonstration by eliminating the parts irrelevant for the establishment of what is proposed. This method also Plato praised as an aid in all the sciences. A third is the reduction to impossibility, which does not directly show the thing itself that is wanted but by refuting its contradictory indirectly establishes its truth. (CEE, 211-12/165-6) {§2.2}

  6. for problems one common procedure, the method of analysis, has been discovered, and by following it we can reach a solution; for thus it is that even the most obscure problems are pursued. (CEE, 242/189) {§2.2}

  7. In general we must understand that all mathematical arguments proceed either from or to the starting-points, as Porphyry somewhere says. Those that proceed from the starting-points are themselves of two kinds, as it happens, for they proceed either from common notions, that is, from self-evident clarity alone, or from things previously demonstrated. Those that proceed to the starting-points are either affirmative of them or destructive. But those that affirm first principles are called “analyses”, and their reverse procedures “syntheses” (for it is possible from those principles to proceed in orderly fashion to the thing sought, and this is called “synthesis”); when they are destructive, they are called “reductions to impossibility”, for it is the function of this procedure to show that something generally accepted and self-evident is overthrown. There is a kind of syllogism in it, though not the same as in analysis ... (CEE, 255/198-9) {§2.2}

Quine, W.V.O.

  1. A maxim of shallow analysis prevails: expose no more logical structure than seems useful for the deduction or other inquiry at hand. In the immortal words of Adolf Meyer, where it doesn’t itch don't scratch.

    On occasion the useful degree of analysis may, conversely, be such as to cut into a simple word of ordinary language, requiring its paraphrase into a composite term in which other terms are compounded with the help of canonical notation. When this happens, the line of analysis adopted will itself commonly depend on what is sought in the inquiry at hand; again there need be no question of the uniquely right analysis, nor of synonymy. (1960, §33, 160-1) {§6.9}

  2. This construction [of the ordered pair as a class, such as Wiener’s identification of the ordered pair x, y> with the class {{x}, {y, Λ}}] is paradigmatic of what we are most typically up to when in a philosophical spirit we offer an “analysis” or “explication” of some hitherto inadequately formulated “idea” or expression. We do not claim synonymy. We do not claim to make clear and explicit what the users of the unclear expression had unconsciously in mind all along. We do not expose hidden meanings, as the words ‘analysis’ or ‘explication’ would suggest; we supply lacks. We fix on the particular functions of the unclear expression that make it worth troubling about, and then devise a substitute, clear and couched in terms to our liking, that fills those functions. Beyond those conditions of partial agreement, dictated by our interests and purposes, any traits of the explicans come under the head of “don’t-cares” … Under this head we are free to allow the explicans all manner of novel connotations never associated with the explicandum. …

    Philosophical analysis, explication, has not always been seen in this way. Only the reading of a synonymy claim into analysis could engender the so-called paradox of analysis, which runs thus: how can a correct analysis be informative, since to understand it we must already know the meanings of its terms, and hence already know that the terms which it equates are synonymous? The notion that analysis must consist somehow in the uncovering of hidden meanings underlies also the recent tendency of some of the Oxford philosophers to take as their business an examination of the subtle irregularities of ordinary language. And there is no mistaking the obliviousness of various writers to the point about the don’t-cares. …

    ... explication is elimination. We have, to begin with, an expression or form of expression that is somehow troublesome. It behaves partly like a term but not enough so, or it is vague in ways that bother us, or it puts kinks in a theory or encourages one or another confusion. But also it serves certain purposes that are not to be abandoned. Then we find a way of accomplishing those same purposes through other channels, using other and less troublesome forms of expression. The old perplexities are resolved.

    According to an influential doctrine of Wittgenstein’s, the task of philosophy is not to solve problems but to dissolve them by showing that there were really none there. This doctrine has its limitations, but it aptly fits explication. For when explication banishes a problem it does so by showing it to be in an important sense unreal; viz., in the sense of proceeding only from needless usages. (1960, §53, 258-60) {§6.9}

  3. This brings us to the second of the five turning points, the shift from terms to sentences. The medievals had the notion of syncategorematic words, but it was a contemporary of John Horne Tooke who developed it into an explicit theory of contextual definition; namely, Jeremy Bentham. He applied contextual definition not just to grammatical particles and the like, but even to some genuine terms, categorematic ones. If he found some term convenient but ontologically embarrassing, contextual definition enabled him in some cases to continue to enjoy the services of the term while disclaiming its denotation. He could declare the term syncategorematic, despite grammatical appearances, and then could justify his continued use of it if he could show systematically how to paraphrase as wholes all sentences in which he chose to imbed it. Such was his theory of fictions: what he called paraphrasis, and what we now call contextual definition. The term, like the grammatical particles, is meaningful as a part of meaningful wholes. If every sentence in which we use a term can be paraphrased into a sentence that makes good sense, no more can be asked. (1975, 68-9) {§5.6}

Rorty, Richard

  1. The issue is: is there such an activity as “conceptual analysis” or can philosophers do no more than describe usage and, perhaps, make recommendations for change in usage? One’s answer to this question will determine whether one thinks that Wittgenstein was wrong to give up on the idea of a systematic theory of meaning, and Quine right to suggest that the very notion of “meaning” was a hangover of Aristotelean essentialism. If they were right, it is hard to hang on to the idea that “conceptual clarity” is a goal of philosophical inquiry … Metaphilosophical issues hover in the wings of the debates over whether the content of an assertion varies from utterer to utterer and from audience to audience. If it does not, if something remains invariable – the concepts expressed by the words that make up the sentence – then perhaps there really are entities with intrinsic properties which philosophical analysis can hope to pin down. But, if content does vary in this way, then concepts are like persons - never quite the same twice, always developing, always maturing. You can change a concept by changing usage, but you cannot get a concept right, once and for all. (‘Analytic and Conversational Philosophy’, Philosophy as Cultural Politics, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007, 122-3)

Rosen, Stanley

  1. Analysis, to be sure, is articulation rather than dissolution. (1980, 8) {§1.2, §5.8}

  2. we must see where we are going, or what will “count” as the successful resolution to the given exercise of analysis. … Analysis is the admittedly indispensable road to our destination, but it is no more the destination than it is the intention to begin the voyage. One could perhaps say that the destination is an articulated structure. But we know that we have reached the destination only when we recognize a given articulation as the explanation of that structure. We cannot see that an analysis explains a structure by performing an additional step in the analysis. At some point we must see that we are finished. And to see an analysis is not to analyze. It is rather to see an articulated structure as a unity, whole, or synthesis. (Ibid., 9) {§1.2, §5.8}

  3. If to understand is to possess an explanation, and if an explanation is an analysis, it remains the case that an analysis is intelligible because it is also a synthesis. Explanation may be called “recollection” in the Platonic sense because it is the process of retracing, by the method of counting and measuring, the joints of an internally articulated unity, one prefigured within the initial formulation of the entire analytical exercise. In slightly more prosaic terms, analysis is never merely the application of rules. It is also at once a seeing of which rules to apply and how to apply them. This is what it means to say that analysis is also synthesis. And this is why it is false to say, as is at least implied by so much contemporary analytical philosophy, that we begin with intuitions and then replace them with ever more sophisticated analyses. Not only is it false to say this, but strictly speaking, it is meaningless. If “to mean” is “to provide an analysis”, there is no analysis of analysis without ingredient intuition. Without intuition, there is at each stage nothing to analyze. Intuition (of syntheses or unities) without analysis is mute, but analysis without intuition is inarticulate as well as blind: the sounds it utters cannot be distinguished from noise. (Ibid., 9-10) {§1.2, §5.8}

  4. analysis is a cognitive activity and it cannot be coherently understood except by recourse to intuition. There is a non-discursive context of analysis. (Ibid., 27) {§1.2, §5.8}

  5. conceptual analysis is rooted in intuitions which cannot be replaced by the process of analysis but which regulate that process. (Ibid., 48) {§1.2, §5.8}

Russell, Bertrand

  1. That all sound philosophy should begin with an analysis of propositions, is a truth too evident, perhaps, to demand a proof. That Leibniz’s philosophy began with such an analysis, is less evident, but seems to be no less true. (PL, 8) {§6.3}

  2. It is necessary to realize that definition, in mathematics, does not mean, as in philosophy, an analysis of the idea to be defined into constituent ideas. This notion, in any case, is only applicable to concepts, whereas in mathematics it is possible to define terms which are not concepts. Thus also many notions are defined by symbolic logic which are not capable of philosophical definition, since they are simple and unanalyzable. (POM, ch. 2, §31, 27) {§6.3}

  3. For the comprehension of analysis, it is necessary to investigate the notion of whole and part, a notion which has been wrapped in obscurity—though not without certain more or less valid logical reasons—by the writers who may be roughly called Hegelian. (POM, ch. 16, §133, 137) {§6.3}

  4. I have already touched on a very important logical doctrine, which the theory of whole and part brings into prominence—I mean the doctrine that analysis is falsification. Whatever can be analyzed is a whole, and we have already seen that analysis of wholes is in some measure falsification. But it is important to realize the very narrow limits of this doctrine. We cannot conclude that the parts of a whole are not really its parts, nor that the parts are not presupposed in the whole in a sense in which the whole is not presupposed in the parts, nor yet that the logically prior is not usually simpler than the logically subsequent. In short, though analysis gives us the truth, and nothing but the truth, yet it can never give us the whole truth. This is the only sense in which the doctrine is to be accepted. In any wider sense, it becomes merely a cloak for laziness, by giving an excuse to those who dislike the labour of analysis. (POM, ch. 16, §138, 141) {§6.3}

  5. We are sometimes told that things are organic unities, composed of many parts expressing the whole and expressed in the whole. This notion is apt to replace the older notion of substance, not, I think, to the advantage of precise thinking. The only kind of unity to which I can attach any precise sense—apart from the unity of the absolutely simple—is that of a whole composed of parts. But this form of unity cannot be what is called organic; for if the parts express the whole or the other parts, they must be complex, and therefore themselves contain parts; if the parts have been analyzed as far as possible, they must be simple terms, incapable of expressing anything except themselves. A distinction is made, in support of organic unities, between conceptual analysis and real division into parts. What is really indivisible, we are told, may be conceptually analyzable. This distinction, if the conceptual analysis be regarded as subjective, seems to me wholly inadmissible. All complexity is conceptual in the sense that it is due to a whole capable of logical analysis, but is real in the sense that it has no dependence upon the mind, but only upon the nature of the object. Where the mind can distinguish elements, there must be different elements to distinguish; though, alas! there are often different elements which the mind does not distinguish. The analysis of a finite space into points is no more objective than the analysis (say) of causality into time-sequence + ground and consequent, or of equality into sameness of relation to a given magnitude. In every case of analysis, there is a whole consisting of parts with relations; it is only the nature of the parts and the relations which distinguishes different cases. Thus the notion of an organic whole in the above sense must be attributed to defective analysis, and cannot be used to explain things.

    It is also said that analysis is falsification, that the complex is not equivalent to the sum of its constituents and is changed when analyzed into these. In this doctrine, as we saw in Parts I and II, there is a measure of truth, when what is to be analyzed is a unity. A proposition has a certain indefinable unity, in virtue of which it is an assertion; and this is so completely lost by analysis that no enumeration of constituents will restore it, even though itself be mentioned as a constituent. There is, it must be confessed, a grave logical difficulty in this fact, for it is difficult not to believe that a whole must be constituted by its constituents. For us, however, it is sufficient to observe that all unities are propositions or propositional concepts, and that consequently nothing that exists is a unity. If, therefore, it is maintained that things are unities, we must reply that no things exist. (POM, ch. 53, §439, 466-7) {§6.3}

  6. What we want to be clear about is the twofold method of analysis of a proposition, i.e., first taking the proposition as it stands and analyzing it, second taking the proposition as a special case of a type of propositions. Whenever we use variables, we are already necessarily concerned with a type of propositions. E.g. “pq” stands for any proposition of a certain type. When values are assigned to p and q, we reach a particular proposition by a different road from that which would have started with those values plus implication, and have so built up the particular proposition without reference to a type. This is how functions come in. (‘Fundamental Notions’, 1904, in 1994, 118) {§6.3}

  7. We ought to say, I think, that there are different ways of analysing complexes, and that one way of analysis is into function and argument, which is the same as type and instance. (Ibid., 256) {§6.3}

  8. The fundamental epistemological principle in the analysis of propositions containing descriptions is this: Every proposition which we can understand must be composed wholly of constituents with which we are acquainted. (KAKD, 159) {§6.3}

  9. when we say ‘the author of Waverley was Scott’ we mean ‘one and only one man wrote Waverley, and he was Scott’. Here the identity is between a variable, i.e. an indeterminate subject (‘he’), and Scott; ‘the author of Waverley’ has been analysed away, and no longer appears as a constituent of the proposition. (KAKD, 165) {§6.3}

  10. Analysis may be defined as the discovery of the constituents and the manner of combination of a given complex. The complex is to be one with which we are acquainted; the analysis is complete when we become acquainted with all the constituents and with their manner of combination, and know that there are no more constituents and that that is their manner of combination. We may distinguish formal analysis as the discovery of the manner of combination, and material analysis as the discovery of the constituents. Material analysis may be called descriptive when the constituents are only known by description, not by acquaintance. (TK, 119) {§6.3}

  11. Philosophy, if what has been said is correct, becomes indistinguishable from logic as that word has now come to be used. The study of logic consists, broadly speaking, of two not very sharply distinguished portions. On the one hand it is concerned with those general statements which can be made concerning everything without mentioning any one thing or predicate or relation, such for example as ‘if x is a member of the class α and every member of α is a member of β, then x is a member of the class β, whatever x, α, and β may be.’. On the other hand, it is concerned with the analysis and enumeration of logical forms, i.e. with the kinds of propositions that may occur, with the various types of facts, and with the classification of the constituents of facts. In this way logic provides an inventory of possibilities, a repertory of abstractly tenable hypotheses. (SMP, 84-5) {§6.3}

  12. The essence of philosophy as thus conceived is analysis, not synthesis. To build up systems of the world, like Heine’s German professor who knit together fragments of life and made an intelligible system out of them, is not, I believe, any more feasible than the discovery of the philosopher’s stone. What is feasible is the understanding of general forms, and the division of traditional problems into a number of separate and less baffling questions. ‘Divide and conquer’ is the maxim of success here as elsewhere. (SMP, 86) {§6.3}

  13. Kant, under the influence of Newton, adopted, though with some vacillation, the hypothesis of absolute space, and this hypothesis, though logically unobjectionable, is removed by Occam’s razor, since absolute space is an unnecessary entity in the explanation of the physical world. Although, therefore, we cannot refute the Kantian theory of an a priori intuition, we can remove its grounds one by one through an analysis of the problem. Thus, here as in many other philosophical questions, the analytic method, while not capable of arriving at a demonstrative result, is nevertheless capable of showing that all the positive grounds in favour of a certain theory are fallacious and that a less unnatural theory is capable of accounting for the facts.

    Another question by which the capacity of the analytic method can be shown is the question of realism. Both those who advocate and those who combat realism seem to me to be far from clear as to the nature of the problem which they are discussing. If we ask: ‘Are our objects of perception real and are they independent of the percipient?’ it must be supposed that we attach some meaning to the words ‘real’ and ‘independent’, and yet, if either side in the controversy of realism is asked to define these two words, their answer is pretty sure to embody confusions such as logical analysis will reveal. (SMP, 90-1) {§6.3}

  14. The supreme maxim in scientific philosophizing is this:

    Wherever possible, logical constructions are to be substituted for inferred entities.

    Some examples of the substitution of construction for inference in the realm of mathematical philosophy may serve to elucidate the uses of this maxim. Take first the case of irrationals. In old days, irrationals were inferred as the supposed limits of series of rationals which had no rational limit; but the objection to this procedure was that it left the existence of irrationals merely optative, and for this reason the stricter methods of the present day no longer tolerate such a definition. We now define an irrational number as a certain class of ratios, thus constructing it logically by means of ratios, instead of arriving at it by a doubtful inference from them. Take again the case of cardinal numbers. Two equally numerous collections appear to have something in common: this something is supposed to be their cardinal number. But so long as the cardinal number is inferred from the collections, not constructed in terms of them, its existence must remain in doubt, unless in virtue of a metaphysical postulate ad hoc. By defining the cardinal number of a given collection as the class of all equally numerous collections, we avoid the necessity of this metaphysical postulate, and thereby remove a needless element of doubt from the philosophy of arithmetic. A similar method, as I have shown elsewhere, can be applied to classes themselves, which need not be supposed to have any metaphysical reality, but can be regarded as symbolically constructed fictions.

    The method by which the construction proceeds is closely analogous in these and all similar cases. Given a set of propositions nominally dealing with the supposed inferred entities, we observe the properties which are required of the supposed entities in order to make these propositions true. By dint of a little logical ingenuity, we then construct some logical function of less hypothetical entities which has the requisite properties. The constructed function we substitute for the supposed inferred entities, and thereby obtain a new and less doubtful interpretation of the body of propositions in question. This method, so fruitful in the philosophy of mathematics, will be found equally applicable in the philosophy of physics, where, I do not doubt, it would have been applied long ago but for the fact that all who have studied this subject hitherto have been completely ignorant of mathematical logic. I myself cannot claim originality in the application of this method to physics, since I owe the suggestion and the stimulus for its application entirely to my friend and collaborator Dr Whitehead, who is engaged in applying it to the more mathematical portions of the region intermediate between sense-data and the points, instants and particles of physics.

    A complete application of the method which substitutes constructions for inferences would exhibit matter wholly in terms of sense-data, and even, we may add, of the sense-data of a single person, since the sense-data of others cannot be known without some element of inference. This, however, must remain for the present an ideal, to be approached as nearly as possible, but to be reached, if at all, only after a long preliminary labour of which as yet we can only see the very beginning. (RSDP, 115-6) {§6.3}

  15. In the special sciences, when they have become fully developed, the movement is forward and synthetic, from the simpler to the more complex. But in philosophy we follow the inverse direction: from the complex and relatively concrete we proceed towards the simple and abstract by means of analysis, seeking, in the process, to eliminate the particularity of the original subject-matter, and to confine our attention entirely to the logical form of the facts concerned. (OKEW, 189-90) {§6.3}

  16. The nature of philosophic analysis … can now be stated in general terms. We start from a body of common knowledge, which constitutes our data. On examination, the data are found to be complex, rather vague, and largely interdependent logically. By analysis we reduce them to propositions which are as nearly as possible simple and precise, and we arrange them in deductive chains, in which a certain number of initial propositions form a logical guarantee for all the rest. (OKEW, 214) {§6.3}

  17. the chief thesis that I have to maintain is the legitimacy of analysis. (PLA, 189) {§6.3}

  18. it is very important to distinguish between a definition and an analysis. All analysis is only possible in regard to what is complex, and it always depends, in the last analysis, upon direct acquaintance with the objects which are the meanings of certain simple symbols. It is hardly necessary to observe that one does not define a thing but a symbol. (PLA, 194) {§6.3}

  19. Analysis is not the same thing as definition. You can define a term by means of a correct description, but that does not constitute an analysis. (PLA, 196) {§6.3}

  20. The business of philosophy, as I conceive it, is essentially that of logical analysis, followed by logical synthesis. (LA, 341) {§6.3}

  21. Ever since I abandoned the philosophy of Kant and Hegel, I have sought solutions of philosophical problems by means of analysis; and I remain firmly persuaded, in spite of some modern tendencies to the contrary, that only by analysing is progress possible. (MPD, 11) {§6.3}

Ryle, Gilbert

  1. Philosophy must then involve the exercise of systematic restatement. But this does not mean that it is a department of philology or literary criticism.

    Its restatement is not the substitution of one noun for another or one verb for another. That is what lexicographers and translators excel in. Its restatements are transmutations of syntax, and transmutations of syntax controlled not be desire for elegance or stylistic correctness but by desire to exhibit the forms of the facts into which philosophy is the enquiry.

    I conclude, then, that there is, after all, a sense in which we can properly enquire and even say “what it really means to say so and so”. For we can ask what is the real form of the fact recorded when this is concealed or disguised and not duly exhibited by the expression in question. And we can often succeed in stating this fact in a new form of words which does exhibit what the other failed to exhibit. And I am for the present inclined to believe that this is what philosophical analysis is, and that this is the sole and whole function of philosophy. (1932, 100) {§6.8}

  2. I have no special objection to or any special liking for the fashion of describing as ‘analysis’ the sort or sorts of conceptual examination which constitute philosophizing. But the idea is totally false that this examination is a sort of garage inspection of one conceptual vehicle at a time. On the contrary, to put it dogmatically, it is always a traffic inspector’s examination of a conceptual traffic-block, involving at least two streams of vehicles hailing from the theories, or points of view or platitudes which are at cross-purposes with one another. (1953, 32) {§6.8}

  3. It is certain that when I wrote “Systematically Misleading Expressions” I was still under the direct influence of the notion of an “ideal language”—a doctrine according to which there were a certain number of logical forms which one could somehow dig up by scratching away at the earth which covered them. I no longer think, especially not today, that this is a good method. I do not regret having traveled that road, but I am happy to have left it behind me. (In Rorty 1967, 305) {§6.8}

Schiller, Friedrich

  1. alas! intellect must first destroy the object of Inner Sense if it would make it its own. Like the analytical chemist, the philosopher can only discover how things are combined by analysing them, only lay bare the workings of spontaneous Nature by subjecting them to the torment of his own techniques. In order to lay hold of the fleeting phenomenon, he must first bind it in the fetters of rule, tear its fair body to pieces by reducing it to concepts, and preserve its living spirit in a sorry skeleton of words. Is it any wonder that natural feeling cannot find itself again in such an image, or that in the account of the analytical thinker truth should appear as paradox? (AE, I, 4) {§5.2}

Sellars, Wilfrid

  1. analysis without synopsis must be blind. (‘Time and the World Order’, in Herbert Feigl and Grover Maxwell, (eds.), Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science III, Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1962, 527)

Soames, Scott

  1. [in discussing Ryle 1953 {Quotation}] Personally, I have no axe to grind about what it takes to analyze a concept. Very likely, there are different sorts of cases. It may well be that sometimes what we want from an analysis is the tracing of the sort of intricate web of conceptual relations in which Ryle delights. But there is little reason for thinking that this is always so—at least, if analysis is construed as whatever it is that philosophers do to solve their problems. What strikes me as worrisome is Ryle’ tendency to use the web metaphor as a rationale for rejecting the old, Russellian conception of analysis, with its emphasis on precisely formulated logical forms, and replacing it with methodology which, in some cases, may degenerate into a recipe for generating a conceptual fog. It is all well and good to recognize that sometimes the concepts philosophers deal with will be vague, imprecise, and open-ended, with close conceptual connections to other concepts of the same sort. We do have to be able to deal with such cases—perhaps along the lines Ryle suggests. What is not good is a prior ideological commitment to blurred edges, indirectness, and an unwillingness to separate tangential from central issues. Sometimes Ryle and other ordinary language philosophers seem to go too far in this direction; substituting one confining orthodoxy about analysis for another. When this happens, central philosophical points get missed ... (2003, II, 80-1) {§6.1}

  2. Philosophical analysis is a term of art. At different times in the twentieth century, different authors have used it to mean different things. What is to be analyzed (e.g., words and sentences versus concepts and propositions), what counts as a successful analysis, and what philosophical fruits come from analysis are questions that have been vigorously debated since the dawn of analysis as a self-conscious philosophical approach. Often, different views of analysis have been linked to different views of the nature of philosophy, the sources of philosophical knowledge, the role of language in thought, the relationship between language and the world, and the nature of meaning—as well to more focused questions about necessary and apriori truth. Indeed the variety of positions is so great as to make any attempt to extract a common denominator from the multiplicity of views sterile and not illuminating.

    Nevertheless analytic philosophy—with its emphasis on what is called “philosophical analysis”—is a clear and recognizable tradition. Although the common core of doctrine uniting its practitioners scarcely exceeds the platitudinous, a pattern of historical influence is not hard to discern. The tradition begins with G.E. Moore, Bertrand Russell, and Ludwig Wittgenstein (as well as Gottlob Frege, whose initial influence was largely filtered through Russell and Wittgenstein). These philosophers set the agenda, first, for logical positivists such as Rudolf Carnap, Carl Hempel, and A.J. Ayer and then later for Wittgenstein, who in turn ushered in the ordinary language school led by Gilbert Ryle and J.L. Austin. More recently the second half of the twentieth century has seen a revival of Russellian and Carnapian themes in the work of W.V. Quine, Donald Davidson, and Saul Kripke. Analytic philosophy, with its changing views of philosophical analysis, is a trail of influence ... (2005, 144) {§6.1}

Stebbing, L. Susan

  1. In my opinion Logical Positivism fails in its treatment of analysis. Wittgenstein and the other Logical Positivists talk much about analysis, but they do not consider the various kinds of analysis, nor do they show in what sense philosophy is the analysis of facts. They make use of analytic definition of a symbolic expression, and of the analytic clarification of a concept, but they do not distinguish between them. They also employ postulational analysis. But they do not seem to understand directional analysis, and, accordingly, they fail to apprehend the need for it. In this way they depart, in my opinion, from the practice of Moore. Not only is their conception of analysis defective, but, further, their conception of the kinds of facts to be analysed is inadequate. They treat all facts as linguistic facts. Hence, they suppose that the first problem of philosophy is to determine the principles of symbolism, and from these principles to draw limits with regard to what we can think. This assumption has two important consequences. First, it leads to the view that philosophy is ‘the activity of finding meaning’, to quote Schlick’s statement. The second consequence is that they are apt to place too much reliance upon the construction of postulational systems. (1933b, 82-3) {§6.6}

Strawson, Peter F.

  1. An analysis, I suppose, may be thought of as a kind of breaking down or decomposing of something. So we have the picture of a kind of intellectual taking to pieces of ideas or concepts; the discovering of what elements a concept or idea is composed and how they are related. Is this the right picture or the wrong one—or is it partly right and partly wrong? That is a question which calls for a considered response … (Analysis and Metaphysics, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1992, 2)

  2. If we took this notion [of analysis as decomposition] completely seriously for the case of conceptual analysis—analysis of ideas—we should conclude that our task was to find ideas that were completely simple, that were free from internal conceptual complexity; and then to demonstrate how the more or less complex ideas that are of interest to philosophers could be assembled by a kind of logical or conceptual construction out of these simple elements. The aim would be to get a clear grasp of complex meanings by reducing them, without remainder, to simple meanings. Thus baldly stated, this may seem a rather implausible project. And so it is. Nevertheless it, or some close relation of it, has been, and is, taken seriously. Even when not taken to the lengths I have just described, it continues to exercise a certain influence on the philosophical mind. (Ibid. 18)

Urmson, J. O.

  1. Among the philosophers who were most influential in England in the period between the two world wars were the analysts. Their analytic theories were sometimes associated with the metaphysical view which Russell called logical atomism, sometimes with the supposedly anti-metaphysical doctrines of logical positivism, and sometimes, as in the case of G. E. Moore, the analytic practice had no clearly defined dogmatic background at all. But they were united at least in the view that analysis was at least one of the most important tasks of the philosopher; and by analysis they meant something which, whatever precise description of it they chose, at least involved the attempt to rewrite in different and in some way more appropriate terms those statements which they found philosophically puzzling. (1956, vii) {§6.1}

  2. analysis is a familiar philosophical method. I shall not attempt to offer you a complete historical account of analytic philosophy. Even the minute examination of a particular analytic philosopher, or group of analytic philosophers, would not be of great interest. I propose rather to sketch, in broad strokes, four major forms of philosophical analysis which I think important to distinguish carefully from one another. I shall call the first of these: classical analysis. It corresponds, roughly, to the traditional method of analysis used by English philosophers, a method which Russell did so much to develop. I shall then examine three other, more recent forms of philosophical analysis: (1) the type of analysis which involves the construction of artificial languages; (2) the type of analysis practiced by Wittgenstein in his later period; (3) the type of analysis which characterizes present-day Oxford Philosophy.

    The fundamental notion of classical analysis is that propositions couched in ordinary language are correct, in the sense that they are not objectionable in principle. They are neither logically nor metaphysically absurd. On the other hand, insofar as the form of these propositions of ordinary language hides their true meaning, they are neither metaphysically nor logically satisfactory. The task of the analyst is, therefore, to reformulate them so that this meaning will be clearly and explicitly presented, rather then to reject them. To analyze, is to reformulate,—to translate into a better wording. (1962, 294-5) {§6.1}

  3. The logical positivism of the Vienna Circle did not modify the methodology of classical analysis. However, because of the anti-metaphysical standpoint which was characteristic of positivism, it could not accept the notion of the goal of analysis as metaphysical discovery. For the positivists of this school, the goal of philosophical analysis is to clarify the language of science, a clarification which would result from, for example, elucidating the relationships between observation and theory, or between scientific concepts at different levels of abstraction. (Ibid., 296) {§6.1}

  4. A second school [or third school, after ‘classical analysis’ and logical positivism] was inspired (largely, but not entirely) by the thought of Wittgenstein in his later period. Wittgenstein had himself been led tothis new point of view in his criticism of his own Tractatus Logico-Philosophicus (Logische-Philosophische Abhandlung), a book which itself espoused implicitly a certain form of classical analysis. According to Wittgenstein, classical analysis rested upon a false conception of language and of thought. ...

    ... for an analyst of this sort, philosophical problems do not result from ignorance of the precise meaning of a concept, but from an entirely false conception of its function. ... Such a false conception is what Ryle calls a “category mistake”. To resolve a philosophical problem, one should exhibit the generic character of the concepts involved in it, rather than attempting to give a perfect definition or explication of these concepts. ...

    This conception of philosophical analysis—of analysis as the resolution of conceptual enigmas—has sometimes been condescendingly called “therapeutic positivism”. (Ibid., 297-9) {§6.1}

  5. The fourth method of analysis ... is that of Oxford Philosophy. ...

    The analytic philosophers of the Cambridge School—for example, Russell and Wittgenstein—came to philosophy after considerable work in the sciences and in mathematics. Philosophy of mathematics was the first topic to which Russell applied his classical method of analysis. But the Oxford philosophers came to their subject, almost without exception, after extensive study of classics. Thus they were naturally interested in words, in syntax, and in (idioms. They did not wish to use linguistic analysis simply to resolve philosophical problems; they were interested in the study of language for its own sake. Therefore these philosophers are, perhaps, both more given to making linguistic distinctions, and better at finding such distinctions, than most. Ibid., 299) {§6.1}

  6. Many English philosophers (including many who owe allegiance to Oxford Philosophy) would place themselves at a position between that of Wittgenstein and the view I have just sketched. It may therefore be in point to indicate briefly the principal differences between the two schools:

    (1) Wittgensteinian analysis has, for its sole end, the resolution of philosophical enigmas. If there were no such enigmas, there would be no need for analysis. For Oxford, on the other hand, analysis has an intrinsic value.

    (2) According to Wittgenstein and his disciples, all that is necessary is to exhibit the generic character of the concepts which we analyze. For Oxford, a minute analysis is indispensable.

    (3) For Wittgenstein, analysis is the only useful method in philosophy. For Oxford, it is only one among others, and no one claims that it is sufficient, by itself, to resolve all philosophical problems. (Ibid., 301) {§6.1}

  7. It is not sensible to ask for the method of making one‘s fortune (or of ruining oneself); there are many. It is no more sensible to ask “What is the analytical method?” There is not one “analytic philosophy”. There are several. (Ibid., 301 [closing sentences]) {§6.1}

Whitehead, Alfred North

  1. The primary weapon is analysis. And analysis is the evocation of insight by the hypothetical suggestions of thought, and the evocation of thought by the activities of direct insight. In this process the composite whole, the interrelations, and the things related, concurrently emerge into clarity. (Essays in Science and Philosophy, New York: Philosophical Library, 1947, 157)

Wilson, John Cook

  1. Analysis is often understood to imply a whole of which the parts are explicitly known before the analysis; but logical elements are for our ordinary consciousness only implicit: we use them without reflecting on them, just as we use grammatical distinctions long before we have any knowledge of grammar. Logic does not merely analyse: it makes explicit what was implicit. (Statement and Inference, Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1926, 49)

  2. The hypothetical process therefore combines in itself both the method of discovery and the proof, and is the proper scientific exposition. The non-hypothetical proof to which we are accustomed is a sort of scientific pedantry, and it is consequently a great mistake first to give what is called analysis, which corresponds to the hypothetical process, and then to follow it by a synthesis, which is the non-hypothetical part, thus putting aside analysis as if it were a sort of accident. It is an error because it conceals the true process of thinking. (Ibid., 560)

Wittgenstein, Ludwig

  1. I have changed my views on “atomic” complexes: I now think that qualities, relations (like love) etc. are all copulae! That means I for instance analyse a subject-predicate proposition, say, “Socrates is human” into “Socrates” and “something is human”, (which I think is not complex). The reason for this is a very fundamental one. I think that there cannot be different Types of things! In other words whatever can be symbolized by a simple proper name must belong to one type. And further: every theory of types must be rendered superfluous by a proper theory of symbolism: For instance if I analyse the proposition Socrates is mortal into Socrates, mortality and (∃x,y) ∈1 (x,y) I want a theory of types to tell me that “mortality is Socrates” is nonsensical, because if I treat “mortality” as a proper name (as I did) there is nothing to prevent me to make the substitution the wrong way round. But if I analyse (as I do now) into Socrates and (∃x).x is mortal or generally into x and (∃x) φx it becomes impossible to substitute the wrong way round because the two symbols are now of a different kind themselves. What I am most certain of is not however the correctness of my present way of analysis, but of the fact that all theory of types must be done away with by a theory of symbolism showing that what seem to be different kinds of things are symbolized by different kinds of symbols which cannot possibly be substituted in one another’s places. I hope I have made this fairly clear!

    Propositions which I formerly wrote ∈2 (a,R,b) I now write R(a,b) and analyse them into a,b and (∃x,y)R(x,y) [with (∃x,y)R(x,y) marked in the text as “not complex”] (NB, 121-2) {§6.5}

  2. How is it reconcilable with the task of philosophy, that logic should take care of itself? If, for example, we ask: Is such and such a fact of the subject-predicate form?, we must surely know what we mean by “subject-predicate form”. We must know whether there is such a form at all. How can we know this? “From the signs”. But how? For we haven’t got any signs of this form. We may indeed say: We have signs that behave like signs of the subject-predicate form, but does that mean that there really must be facts of this form? That is, when those signs are completely analysed? And here the question arises again: Does such a complete analysis exist? And if not: then what is the task of philosophy?!!? (NB, 2) {§6.5}

  3. Our difficulty now lies in the fact that to all appearances analysability, or its opposite, is not reflected in language. That is to say: We can not, as it seems, gather from language alone whether for example there are real subject-predicate facts or not. But how COULD we express this fact or its opposite? This must be shewn. (NB, 10) {§6.5}

  4. The trivial fact that a completely analysed proposition contains just as many names as there are things contained in its reference [Bedeutung]; this fact is an example of the all-embracing representation of the world through language. (NB, 11) {§6.5}

  5. The completely analysed proposition must image its reference [Bedeutung]. (NB, 18) {§6.5}

  6. A question: can we manage without simple objects in LOGIC?

    Obviously propositions are possible which contain no simple signs, i.e. no signs which have an immediate reference [Bedeutung]. And these are really propositions making sense, nor do the definitions of their component parts have to be attached to them.

    But it is clear that components of our propositions can be analysed by means of a definition, and must be, if we want to approximate to the real structure of the proposition. At any rate, then, there is a process of analysis. And can it not now be asked whether this process comes to an end? And if so: What will the end be?

    If it is true that every defined sign signifies via its definitions then presumably the chain of definitions must some time have an end. [Cf. TLP 3.261.]

    The analysed proposition mentions more than the unanalysed.

    Analysis makes the proposition more complicated than it was, but it cannot and must not make it more complicated than its meaning [Bedeutung] was from the first.

    When the proposition is just as complex as its reference [Bedeutung], then it is completely analysed.

    But the reference [Bedeutung] of our propositions is not infinitely complicated. (NB, 46) {§6.5}

  7. But it also seems certain that we do not infer the existence of simple objects from the existence of particular simple objects, but rather know them—by description, as it were—as the end-product of analysis, by means of a process that leads to them. (NB, 50) {§6.5}

  8. Let us assume that every spatial object consists of infintely many points, then it is clear that I cannot mention all these by name when I speak of that object. Here then would be a case in which I cannot arrive at the complete analysis in the old sense at all; and perhaps just this is the usual case.

    But this is surely clear: the propositions which are the only ones that humanity uses will have a sense just as they are and do not wait upon a future analysis in order to acquire a sense.

    Now, however, it seems to be a legitimate question: Are–e.g.–spatial objects composed of simple parts; in analysing them, does one arrive at parts that cannot be further analysed, or is this not the case?

    —But what kind of question is this?—

    Is it, A PRIORI, clear that in analysing we must arrive at simple components—is this, e.g., involved in the concept of analysis—, or is analysis ad infinitum possible?—Or is there in the end even a third possibility? (NB, 62) {§6.5}

  9. In a proposition a thought can be expressed in such a way that elements of the propositional sign correspond to the objects of the thought.

    I call such elements ‘simple signs’, and such a proposition ‘completely analysed’. (TLP, 3.2, 3.201) {§6.5}

  10. A proposition has one and only one complete analysis. (TLP, 3.25) {§6.5}

  11. It is obvious that the analysis of propositions must bring us to elementary propositions which consist of names in immediate combination.

    This raises the question how such combination into propositions comes about. (TLP, 4.221) {§6.5}

  12. If we know on purely logical grounds that there must be elementary propositions, then everyone who understands propositions in their unanalysed form must know it. (TLP, 5.5562) {§6.5}

  13. A proposition is completely logically analysed if its grammar is made completely clear: no matter what idiom it may be written or expressed in. (PR, 51; cf. BT, 308) {§6.5}

  14. Logical analysis is the analysis of something we have, not of something we don’t have. Therefore it is the analysis of propositions as they stand. (PR, 52) {§6.5}

  15. a mathematical proof is an analysis of the mathematical proposition. (PR, 179) {§6.5}

  16. Complex is not like fact. For I can, e.g., say of a complex that it moves from one place to another, but not of a fact.

    But that this complex is now situated here is a fact. ...

    A complex is composed of its parts, the things of a kind which go to make it up. (This is of course a grammatical proposition concerning the words ‘complex’, ‘part’ and ‘compose’.)

    To say that a red circle is composed of redness and circularity, or is a complex with these component parts, is a misuse of these words and is misleading. (Frege was aware of this and told me.) It is just as misleading to say the fact that this circle is red (that I am tired) is a complex whose component parts are a circle and redness (myself and tiredness).

    Neither is a house a complex of bricks and their spatial relations; i.e. that too goes against the correct use of the word. (PR, 301-2) {§6.5}

  17. When I say: “My broom is in the corner”,—is this really a statement about the broomstick and the brush? Well, it could at any rate be replaced by a statement giving the position of the stick and the position of the brush. And this statement is surely a further analysed form of the first one.—But why do I call it “further analysed”?—Well, if the broom is there, that surely means that the stick and brush must be there, and in a particular relation to one another; and this was as it were hidden in the sense of the first sentence, and is expressed in the analysed sentence. Then does someone who says that the broom is in the corner really mean: the broomstick is there, and so is the brush, and the broomstick is fixed in the brush?—If we were to ask anyone if he meant this he would probably say that he had not thought specially of the broomstick or specially of the brush at all. And that would be the right answer, for he meant to speak neither of the stick nor of the brush in particular. Suppose that, instead of saying “Bring me the broom”, you said “Bring me the broomstick and the brush which is fitted on to it.”!—Isn’t the answer: “DO you want the broom? Why do you put it so oddly?”——Is he going to understand the further analysed sentence better?—This sentence, one might say, achieves the same as the ordinary one, but in a more roundabout way.— Imagine a language-game in which someone is ordered to bring certain objects which are composed of several parts, to move them about, or something else of that kind. And two ways of playing it: in one (a) the composite objects (brooms, chairs, tables, etc.) have names, as in (15); in the other (b) only the parts are given names and the wholes are described by means of them.—In what sense is an order in the second game an analysed form of an order in the first? Does the former lie concealed in the latter, and is it now brought out by analysis?—True, the broom is taken to pieces when one separates broomstick and brush; but does it follow that the order to bring the broom also consists of corresponding parts? ...

    To say, however, that a sentence in (b) is an ‘analysed’ form of one in (a) readily seduces us into thinking that the former is the more fundamental form; that it alone shews what is meant by the other, and so on. For example, we think: If you have only the unanalysed form you miss the analysis; but if you know the analysed form that gives you everything.—But can I not say that an aspect of the matter is lost on you in the latter case as well as the former? (PI, §§ 60, 63) {§6.5}

  18. Our investigation is therefore a grammatical one. Such an investigation sheds light on our problem by clearing misunderstandings away. Misunderstandings concerning the use of words, caused, among other things, by certain analogies between the forms of expression in different regions of language.—Some of them can be removed by substituting one form of expression for another; this may be called an “analysis” of our forms of expression, for the process is sometimes like one of taking a thing apart.

    But now it may come to look as if there were something like a final analysis of our forms of language, and so a single completely resolved form of every expression. That is, as if our usual forms of expression were, essentially, unanalysed; as if there were something hidden in them that had to be brought to light. When this is done the expression is completely clarified and our problem solved.

    It can also be put like this: we eliminate misunderstandings by making our expressions more exact; but now it may look as if we were moving towards a particular state, a state of complete exactness; and as if this were the real goal of our investigation. (PI, §§ 90-1) {§6.5}

  19. We are not analysing a phenomenon (e.g. thought) but a concept (e.g. that of thinking), and therefore the use of a word. (PI, §383) {§6.5}

A list of key works on analysis (monographs and collections) can be found in the

Annotated Bibliography, §1.2.

Copyright © 2014 by
Michael Beaney <>

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