Notes to The Analytic/Synthetic Distinction

1. See also Quine (1956/76, p.106), Boghossian (1997, pp.335–6) and particularly Williamson (2007:chapter 3) for a vivid, extended discussion of the point; and Glock (2003, chapter 3) and Gillian Russell (2008) for interesting attempts to resuscitate the “metaphysical” work.

2. Williamson (2007:95–6) provides a nice discussion of how people might perfectly reasonably resist standard deductive rules in response to the preface and lottery paradoxes, as well as to problems of vagueness: asked “Is Bill bald,” someone might reply, “He is and isn’t”, without being committed to “He is bald,” pace, e.g., Peacocke’s 1992 claim that anyone who grasps “and” must find such an inference “primitively compelling.” The psychologist Daniel Kahneman received the Nobel prize in 2002 for the extensive experimental work he, Amos Tversky and others did on quite compelling fallacies in reasoning to which virtually everyone seems to be prey (see Kahneman 2011 for an extensive review and discussion).

3. A complex issue remains about whether conventional rules might not be “implicit” in a practice, and so implicitly definable in terms of it; see Lewis (1969), Boghossian (1997), Horwich (2000), Hale and Wright (2000) and §4.1 below for discussion.

4. See Juhl and Loomis (2010) and Ebbs (forthcoming) for a more detailed history of the debate between Carnap and Quine, which is also nicely set out in the latter’s correspondence and related texts gathered together in Creath (1991). In their own account of the analytic (what they call “analytic*”), Juhl and Loomis (2010, pp.235–6) explicitly distance themselves from many of the scientific cases that concerned Quine and Putnam, confining themselves to only “explicit stipulations understood as such by a linguistic community” (p.236). They hope to include mathematical claims as empirically indefeasible and analytic* by relying on a distinction between “canonical justification[s]”, which do not depend upon “any premises justified by empirical statements” (p.251), and “second-order justifications” which do (p251). Quite apart from worries one might have about incompleteness and undecidability of such canonical justifications, it’s hard to see how or why Quine or Putnam should think that an appeal to the them is any better off than the original appeal to the analytic.

5. It is worth noting, however, just how very rare such empirically motivated proposals have ever been, and that, moreover, one needs to distinguish revising one’s logic from revising one’s account of one’s logic. Perhaps all that Putnam could show was that our theory of our own logic was wrong. See Stairs (2015) for nuanced discussion.

6. Expanding on a “two-dimensional semantics” first proposed by Stalnaker (1978), Chalmers imagines two ways to do this, either by asking what someone would say if evidence showed that the actual world turned out to be a certain way (the “primary intension”) or by asking what one would say about other possible worlds on the assumption that the actual world has turned out to be a certain way (the “secondary intension”). The former is supposed to capture the aspect of meaning that is untouched by the a posteriori necessities discussed by Kripke and Putnam that are supposed to be captured by the latter. Thus, the primary intension of “water” would be “the watery stuff,” the secondary intension, H2O itself. A similar view is developed by G. Russell (2008, 2010) in her view of analyticity as “truth by virtue of reference determiners” (2010:193). Note that all the Quinean worries about the analytic (and/or its significance) could be raised even more obviously against such primary intensions and references fixers, which involve often false beliefs of a user of a term or concept (water may turn out not to be “watery,” e.g., neither odorless, tasteless or the main ingredient of rain).

7. This general approach emanating from the work of Lewis and Jackson, as well as Chalmers (1998, 2011), has come to be known as “the Canberra Plan,” whereby concepts are characterized by applying the technical procedure of “ramsification” to folk platitudes (see Papineau 2015 for discussion). Jackson (1998, pp. 29–30) notes the need for some account of meaning in order to distinguish “reductionist” theories of some phenomenon that preserve its reality, as the case of theories of water, from so-called “eliminativist” theories that in effect deny its reality, as in the case of standard explanations of devils and witches. Note, however, that insofar as all mental concepts are to be defined by relying on folk platitudes, we risk thereby eliminating all mental phenomena, since it’s hard to see how to exclude the extravagant platitudes, believed by the majority of people in the world, in likely mistaken ideas of dualism, immortal souls and contra-causal freedom. –But in any case, in all consistency, Quine (1960, pp. 264–6), himself, happily acknowledges there may be no principled difference between reduction and elimination.

8. See Devitt (2005, 2007, 2013) for vigorous critiques of neo-Cartesian approaches along such Quinean lines, but also Rey (2013) for a qualified defense of them.

9. We’ve slightly simplify his proposal. Note that he supplies here only a sufficient condition for “S means p ”, indeed, one that he regards only as sufficient for meeting a certain class of difficulties, so-called “disjunction” problems; see Fodor 1990b, pp. 127–31. The dependence is synchronic to avoid irrelevant issues of, e.g., etymology, were it to be understood diachronically.

10. Note that the suggestion here is not the same as the suggestion, variously raised by Gillian Russell (2008, 2010) and advocates of “two dimensional semantics,” such as Chalmers (1998, 2011), that what’s analytic would be its “a reference determiner,” its “primary intension” (see fn 6 above), since the description used to introduce a term might not pick out the intended referent even in the actual world. Reference determination in such cases would have to be determined in some other ways, e.g., by mere causal relations between a word and its referent, or other features of the context of its use, along lines suggested by the work of Sperber and Wilson (1995), Pietroski (2002, 2005, forthcoming), Devitt (2015) and Carsten (2016)

Copyright © 2017 by
Georges Rey <>

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