Notes to The Analytic/Synthetic Distinction

1. Hence “analytic philosophy,” although this composite term has long ceased to have any commitment to actual “analyses” of meanings, or even to the viability of the analytic/synthetic distinction, and refers now more generally to philosophy done in the associated closely reasoned style. Broadly “analytic” methods have a complex history from ancient Greece to modern philosophy in both Western and Eastern Europe (and likely elsewhere) beyond what it will be possible to include here (see Analysis, as well as Coffa (1991) and Wolenski (2004, pp. 30–53) for rich details of some of that history, particularly from Kant to Carnap.

2. That providing a serious, positive account of the “analytic” was not Kant’s concern is perhaps brought out by his scepticism at his (1787 [1998], B755–760), at least about definitions outside of mathematics.

3. An important figure between Kant and Frege whose work was, for various reasons, not as influential as theirs, is Bernard Brentano [1837 [1972]), who anticipated by a century contemporary treatments of logic, such as the one that will be sketched below (see the entry on him, as well as Coffa,1991, chapter 2; Quine, 1956 [1976], p. 110fn2; and Hale and Wright, 2015).

4. Devitt stressed the epistemological reading in many conferences in Europe and America beginning in 1989, as well as in his (1993a and b) and (1996). It also occurs explicitly in Frege (1884 [1980], §3). See Boghossian (1996, 1997) and Williamson (2007, chapter 3) for independent, influential discussions of the point. Glock (2003, chapter 3), Gillian Russell (2008) and Hale and Wright (2015), make interesting attempts to resuscitate the “metaphysical” work.

5. Karl Popper (1935 [2002]) emphasized dis-confirmation, or “falsifiability,” in his discussions of the issues. See Alston (1955) for detailed discussion of the origins of Verificationism in the writings of Peirce, and Quine (1969, p. 80) for an explicit appeal to him. Note also its precedent in Kant (1787 [1998]):

All concepts and with them all principles, however a priori they may be, are nevertheless related to empirical intuitions, i.e., to data for possible experience. Without this they have no objective validity at all, but are rather a mere play, whether it be with representations of the imagination or of the understanding. (B298)

Forms of verificationism persist to this day, particularly with regard to mental matters, as when Dennett (1991, pp. 461ff) defends what he calls “Urbane Verificationism” (see Rey 1994 for discussion).

6. There’s also a problem of uniqueness. Bealer (1998) notes that the concept of a circle can be analyzed as the concept of a set of co-planar points equidistant from a given point and as a closed figure of constant curvature. Which is the “correct” analysis?

7. See Priest 1987 [2006]. Williamson (2007:95–6) provides a nice discussion of how people might perfectly reasonably resist standard deductive rules in response to the preface and lottery paradoxes, as well as to problems of vagueness: asked “Is Bill bald,” someone might reply, “He is and isn’t”, without being committed to “He is bald,” pace, e.g., Peacocke’s 1992 claim that anyone who grasps “and” must find such an inference “primitively compelling.” The psychologist Daniel Kahneman received the Nobel prize in 2002 for the extensive experimental work he, Amos Tversky and others did on quite compelling fallacies in reasoning to which virtually everyone seems to be prey (see Kahneman 2011 for an extensive review and discussion).

8. Indeed, so obvious that a denial of them would have to be a case of misunderstanding: in an aside about “pre-logical” people who seem to accept certain simple self-contradictions as true, Quine (CLT, p. 109) interestingly insists that these must be cases of mis-translation. This prefigures his later (1960 [2013], p. 54) appeal to a “principle of charity” as a constraint on translation – “For translation theory, banal messages are the breath of life” (p. 63) – a view that was developed at length by Quine’s student, Donald Davidson (1980) (see Theories of Meaning for critical discussion). It would appear that, for Quine and Davidson, this charity principle and “norms of rationality” are doing some of the work the analytic was supposed to do, protecting some claims as rationally undeniable (see Rey, 2007).

9. The strategy of defining logical concepts implicitly by appeal to patterns in people’s reasoning has been pursued by a number of writers, e.g., 5 (1969), Peacocke (1992, 2004), Boghossian (1996), Horwich (2000), Hale and Wright (2000) and Warren (2017)(see footnote 16 below for further discussion). But in order to abstract from people’s often confused or sometimes perhaps theoretically over-informed patterns of reasoning, the strategy is likely best considered within the context of an internal psychology that we’ll consider in the Supplement.

10. See also Harman (1967 [1999]) for other examples and an extended discussion of the issue. (Chomsky, 2000, pp. 67,152, though, reasonably cautions against drawing conclusions about natural language semantics from consideration of the practices of science, which he suspects involve very different systems, an issue to which we’ll return in the supplement.) Note there’s no reason to agree here with Quine’s pragmatist understanding of the justification of scientific theory, in terms merely of the kind of “elegance and convenience” that might be at work in selecting a set theory. It’s the holism of the explanatory power of the theory that’s crucial, however that is to be assessed

11. See Juhl and Loomis (2010) and Ebbs (2019) for a more detailed history of the debate between Carnap and Quine, which can be followed directly in their correspondence and related texts gathered together in Creath (1991). Quine (1960 [2013], p. 61fn6) discusses how shared misgivings about analyticity emerged in discussions that he, Tarski, Goodman and Morton White had with Carnap in 1939–40.

12. Ironically enough, Quine (1986:155), himself, continued to adhere to a weaker verifiability conception of meaning, his confirmation holism leading him merely to embrace a meaning holism – “the unit of empirical significance is the whole of science” Quine (1953 [1980a], p. 42) – which in turn led him to his notorious “thesis of the indeterminacy of translation” (see his 1969, pp. 80–81, and §3.5 below, as well as Fodor and LePore 1993 for extensive discussion).

13. It’s not clear what entitles Quine to this crucial “only” – why shouldn’t considerations of the whole be only one of many ways in which theories are confirmed? – but his doctrine has been read as standardly including it. Quine (1975 [1981], p. 71) himself retreats from the full holism, noting that confirmation needn’t include quite all our statements about the external world, but merely “large chunks” of them. But, if it’s only large chunks, then there’s no longer any principled challenge to the a priority of a good “chunk” of logic and mathematics – or even the analytic! – all of which might remain quite as insulated as they appear to be (see Rey 1998, 2020b, for discussion).

14. Expanding on a “two-dimensional semantics” first proposed by Stalnaker (1978), Chalmers imagines two ways to do this, either by asking what someone would say if evidence showed that the actual world turned out to be a certain way (the “primary intension”) or by asking what one would say about other possible worlds on the assumption that the actual world has turned out to be a certain way (the “secondary intension”). The former is supposed to capture the aspect of meaning that is untouched by the a posteriori necessities discussed by Kripke and Putnam that are supposed to be captured by the latter. Thus, the primary intension of “water” would be “the watery stuff,” the secondary intension, H2O itself. A similar view is developed by Gillian Russell (2008, 2010) in her view of analyticity as “truth by virtue of reference determiners” (2010:193). Note that all the Quinean worries about the analytic (and/or its significance) could be raised even more obviously against such primary intensions and references fixers, which may involve often false beliefs (water may turn out not to be what comes from taps or fills the seas).

15. Perhaps moved by such observations, Quine (1974) later proposed that “A sentence is analytic if everybody learns it’s true by learning its words” (p. 79), providing as an example “No bachelor is married,” since “we all learned ‘bachelor’ by learning that our elders were uniformly disposed to assent to it in just the circumstances in which they will assent to ‘unmarried man’” (p. 80) (see Willard van Orman Quine). It’s not entirely clear whether he intended this as a genuine (as it were) analysis of “analytic,” or as simply an explanation of the appearance of something’s being so. Either way it seems quite unsatisfactory: it’s likely children learn “Columbus” from “Columbus was the discoverer of America,” and “Water” from “Water is what you drink that comes out of taps,” but of course neither of these are remotely analytic or appear to be so.

16. This general approach of “implicit definition” has been championed in the work of Lewis (1972), Jackson (1998), Braddon-Mitchell and Nola (2008), and Chalmers (2012), and has come to be known as “the Canberra Plan” (after the place where these philosophers have worked): concepts are characterized by applying the technical procedure of “Ramsification” to folk platitudes, whereby many terms (whether folk or scientific) are simultaneously defined by their relations to one another and to other terms (see Naturalism, §2.2, and Harman 1994 [1999] for discussion). Jackson (1998, pp. 29–30) argues for the need for some such account of meaning in order to distinguish “reductionist” theories of some phenomenon that preserve its reality, as the case of theories of water, from so-called “eliminativist” theories that in effect deny its reality, as in the case of standard explanations of devils and witches. Note, however, that insofar as mental concepts are to be defined by folk platitudes, we risk thereby eliminating all mental phenomena, since it’s hard to see how to exclude the extravagant platitudes regarding ghosts, immortal souls, race and gender that are believed by the majority of people in the world. But in any case, in all consistency, Quine (1960 [2013], pp. 264–6), himself, happily acknowledges there may be no principled difference between reduction and elimination.

17. It is some indication of the historical fragility of intuitions in this regard that Chomsky (1965 – note the year) presents as one of several “standard examples of purely semantic (pragmatic) incongruity”: Both of John’s parents are married to aunts of mine (1965, pp. 76–7), which is, of course, now legally possible. See Supplement §§3–4 for further discussion.

18. As Derek Leben (2015) remarks about many standard linguistics examples (supplement, §4, fn32), “Even if we can discover the ‘skeleton’ of even concepts like cut, break, spray, send and touch, there are not many philosophical debates centered around these concepts” (p. 63). He does briefly discuss some potential philosophical relevance of linguistic structure for concepts such as know and cause, but concedes that, e.g., cause may not be “even a real property of the world at all, but a mere projection of our conceptual structure” (p. 66).

Notes to Supplement

19. Although this supplement will be focusing largely on Chomsky’s views, “Chomskyan” is used in the title to indicate that the views and the general approach are by no means limited to him, but are shared by a wide number of linguists. For excellent, non-technical introductions to this work in general see Pinker (1994 [2007]) and Smith and Allott (2016), as well as Newmeyer (1996) for a survey of the range of its influence. Rey (2020a) addresses a number of philosophical issues surrounding it. For a much richer, but still summary treatment of Chomsky’s views on semantics than is possible here, see Glanzberg (2021).

20. These and a plethora of similar examples from all examined languages provide some of the crucial data that motivates a Chomskyan linguistics (see standard textbooks such as Haegeman, 1994, or Radford, 2004, and Rey, 2020a, chapter 1 for many more examples). One need only reflect for a moment upon how possibly speakers can so readily reject the likes of (1)-(4) to appreciate the plausibility of Chomsky’s claim that the principles of grammar are largely innate. Most speakers have never heard or produced, much less been corrected for such strings, and so are extremely unlikely to have learned to exclude them as a result of training or convention (see Innateness of Language).

21. In his early monumental work, The Logical Structure of Linguistic Theory (1955 [1975]), Chomsky both expresses agreement with Quine’s reservations about semantics as a basis for linguistics, but, unlike Quine, insists that an adequate linguistics theory must ultimately account for semantic phenomena (see esp. pp. 85–97). Note that his later disagreements in the 1970s with “generative” semanticists had to do not with the legitimacy of semantic issues, but with whether purely semantic considerations entered into syntactic or phonological derivations, or at later stage, as in what he called “interpretive” semantics (see 1965, p. 226fn15), a controversy that, for various reasons, has largely abated (see Newmeyer, 1996, and Glanzberg, 2021, pp. 420–421).

22. Although see D. Israel’s (1991) reservation about “implication,” quoted in ASD:§2. Note that Fodor, himself, soon came to be moved by Quinean challenges to the feasibility of such a program (cf. ASD:§3.4), and so abandoned it, eventually defending a radical “atomist” view of meaning, where the meaning of any term is specified externally, completely independent of the meaning of any other term (see Fodor, 1990b, 1998 and ASD:§4.2). In his (2001), he also argued against the semantic compositionality – or of any semantics! – of language, as opposed to thought (for reasons related to the issues to be discussed shortly in §3).

23. Such an example might be standardly covered by the at least quasi-syntactic “Principle A” of Binding Theory, whereby a reflexive must be locally bound (see, e.g., Haegeman, 1994, pp. 228–9), and so is not clearly semantic. Indeed, this latter fact might be captured merely by co-indexing “herself” with the three occurrences of “Mary,” and leaving it to a separate semantic default rule that occurrences of co-indexed names and pronouns in a sentence are to be treated as co-referential, without any appeal to “analyticity” as it has standardly been conceived.

24. Chomsky enriches the discussion of analytic data with many interesting examples not traditionally discussed by philosophers:

In the case of “I painted my house brown,” the semantic features impose an analysis in terms of specific properties of intended design and use, a designated exterior, and indeed far more intricacy. … If I paint my house brown, it has a brown exterior; I can, however, paint my house brown on the inside. The exterior interior dimension has a marked and unmarked option; if neither is indicated, the exterior is understood. That is a typical property of the lexicon…. I certainly cannot be near my house if I am inside it, even though it is a surface, in the unmarked case. Similarly, a geometrical cube is just a surface, but if we are using natural language, a point inside the cube cannot be near it. These properties hold quite generally: of boxes, igloos, airplanes, mountains, and so on. (2000, p. 126)

Other examples that begin to straddle syntax and semantics will be discussed in footnote 32 below).

25. The “I-” prefix stands for “internal” “individual,” and “intensional,” i.e. individuated by computational rules; the “E-” for “external/social” and “extensional,” i.e. individuated by the set of actual expressions that would be produced in some specific speech community. (Note that I-languages are computational systems, not to be confused with idiolects, which are E-languages with a community of perhaps only one). “E-languages” only approximately capture the folk notion of language, which Chomsky thinks is actually some mix of I- and E- notions. Indeed, extensionality was a demand only of many linguistics and philosophers of ca. 1920–80, which was in line with their behaviorist scruples, but likely not shared by the folk. Both those scruples and extensionalism having abated in recent decades, “E-language” will be used here without any presumption of extensionality, but as capturing, nearly enough, some idealization of the ordinary folk notion of an external, social language spoken or signed by some stable group. (Note that when Chomskyans refer to “English” or “Mandarin” they intend to be referring to no more than a computational I-language shared to varying degrees by some group.)

26. Shapiro and Roberts, 2019, provide a useful, recent discussion of the relation of open texture to analyticity, which includes references to Waismann’s many articles on the topic.

27. It would be impossible to do justice here to the abundant literature that has emerged on the topic in the last forty years, much of it influenced by Wittgenstein (1953 [1967] and Grice (1975. 1989). In addition to the authors so far mentioned, see also Travis (1985 [2008]), Sperber and Wilson (1986/95), Fodor (2001), Recanati (2004), Glanzberg (2014), and Quilty-Dunn, J. (2021). Vicente and Falkum (2017), Allott and Textor (2017) and McCourt (2021) provide rich reviews and discussion, and Devitt (2021) voices many reservations. Such largely pragmatic views of semantics are connected to Chomsky’s (1955, 2000: pp. 129–133, 177–181) scepticism about standard standard model-theoretic treatments of semantics based upon what he thinks are inappropriate analogies between formal and natural languages, such as those explored in Montague (1974), Partee and Hensriks (1997) and Heim and Krater (1998), in which, e.g,, names are taken to refer to individuals and predicates to sets and/or functions (see Pietroski, 2018, and Glanzberg, 2021, for discussion of Chomsky’s views in this regard).

28. Grammatically, the headline should be The President is shot, and the notice, No vehicles are allowed in the park; see Allott and Shaer, (2013) for detailed discussion. There have been proposals about how some deletions might be licensed by the I-grammar (see, e.g., Merchant, 2005; Progovac et al., 2006), but some ungrammatical utterances are probably due to purely conventional deletions of the output of the I-language. Note that whether one calls mismatches between performance and competence “errors” (which one needn’t) depends upon whether what is “correct” is determined by I-language constraints, or by social conventions associated with a public E-language, or by some combination (as may be the case for headlines).

29. In a famous passage, Wittgenstein (1953 [1967]) wrote:

If you look at [the various uses of a word] you will not see something that is common to all, but similarities, relationships, and a whole series of them at that…I can think of no better expression to characterize these similarities than “family resemblances”; for the various resemblances between members of a family: build, features, colour of eyes, gait, temperament, etc. etc. overlap and cries-cross in the same way (§§66–67).

And he and subsequently many others (e.g. Eleanor Rosch, 1973, Smith and Medin, 1981) claimed that this should be the model for understanding meaning in place of the “Classical” analyses in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions sought by the “analytic” philosophers discussed in ASD:§2 (see Rey, 1983, 1985, and Fodor, 1998, for discussion).

30. One tempting move might be to appeal to the features that are conventionally associated with the identity of a term (see, e.g, Carston, 2016, 2021, Allott and Textor, 2017, Devitt, 2021, Stojnić, 2021). But the trouble is that lots of things are conventionally associated with a term: prototypes, images, stray beliefs. Perhaps the only distinctive information many speakers store with the item “Columbus” is the conventional claim “discovered America,” but, as Kripke (1972) stressed, this hardly constitutes the meaning of the name (there’s no contradiction in thinking he never left home). Recalling the discussion from §§4.2–4.3, perhaps the meaning-determining features are those that figure in laws about the uses of a term on which all other uses asymmetrically-explanatorily depend. Thus, even if reference to paralysis were included in the entry “polio,” usage of the term may asymmetrically-explanatorily depend not upon it, but upon the law linking the term to the actual phenomenon. Allott and Textor (2022) explore this as a way of distinguishing metaphorical from literal uses of a term. For a rich and nuanced discussion of language and conventions see Glanzberg (2018).

31. There is not yet full agreement about how to characterize the category. “Negative” is only a rough intuitive characterization. “Downward entailing” is better: unlike the contrasting “positive” contexts such as know…, “negative” contexts entail more specific information (I doubt anyone went entails I doubt John went, but I know someone went doesn’t entail I know John went). For purposes here, all that’s important is that the phenomenon (apparently universal in all languages) is standardly characterized semantically, even though it has a syntactic reflex (see, e.g., Isac and Reiss, 2006, M. Israel, 2011, for discussion)

32. Of course, NPIs could be embedded in further, nested “negative” contexts, e.g., John doubts Sue knows Tom has ever flown.  Other examples of syntactic effects of semantic features are the apparent connection between kill and cause to die (see Pietroski, 2002), as well as examples from Chomsky (1965, pp. 150–1) regarding who vs. which, and walking vs. amusing, and the Binding principles mentioned above (§2, footnote 23), and Derek Leben (2015) on “alternations” such as

Mary cut at the bread/*John broke at the glass.
Derek sprayed the roses with water/Derek sprayed water onto the roses/
Derek poured water into the glass/*Derek poured the glass with water.

33. Harman (1980) wrote:

Chomsky suggests that there are better examples of analytic connections “involving properties of the verbal system,” such as, if I persuaded you to leave, then at some point you intended to leave. But, in order to persuade you to leave, I might keep you ignorant of the fact that what you are doing is leaving, so that at no point do you intend to leave. (1980, p. 21)

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