First published Tue Feb 24, 2004; substantive revision Wed Oct 27, 2021

Anaphora is sometimes characterized as the phenomenon whereby the interpretation of an occurrence of one expression depends on the interpretation of an occurrence of another or whereby an occurrence of an expression has its referent supplied by an occurrence of some other expression in the same or another sentence.[1] However, these are at best very rough characterizations of the phenomena, since things other than anaphoric expressions satisfy the first characterization and many cases of anaphora fail to satisfy the second. For example, in some sense of “interpretation”, the interpretation of the expression “bank” in the following sentence depends on the interpretation of other expressions (in particular, “of the river”):

John is down by the bank of the river.

But no one would say this is an example of anaphora. And as to the second characterization, though all agree that the following is an example of anaphora (and “he” is an anaphoric pronoun here on one reading of the sentence), it is not a case of the referent of one expression being supplied by another expression, (since “he” is not a referring expression on the reading in question):

Every male lawyer believes he is smart.

Hence, rather than attempting to characterize anaphora generally and abstractly, we shall begin with some examples. There is generally thought to be many types of anaphora, though in some cases there is disagreement as to whether to classify those cases as anaphora or not.[2]

Pronominal anaphora:

John left. He said he was ill. (The antecedent is “John” and the anaphoric expression is “he”.)

VP anaphora (also called VP ellipsis):

Mary Anne took out the garbage. Claudia did too. (The antecedent is “took out the garbage” and the anaphoric expression a null VP. See Partee and Bach (1984), Prüst et al. (1994).)

Propositional anaphora:

One plaintiff was passed over for promotion three times. But the jury didn’t believe this. (The antecedent is the proposition expressed by the first sentence. The anaphoric expression is “this”. Example from Asher and Lascarides (2003).)

Adjectival anaphora:

A kind stranger returned my wallet. Such people are rare. (The antecedent is “kind stranger” and the anaphoric expression “such”.)

Modal anaphora:

John might give a presentation. He would use slides. (The antecedent is the possibility described by the first sentence, and the anaphoric expression is the modal “would”. Example from Stone and Hardt 1999)

Temporal anaphora:

Sheila had a party last Friday and Sam got drunk. (The time at which Sam got drunk is anaphoric on the time at which Sheila had the party. Example from Partee 1984.)

Kind-level anaphora:

John gave a presentation. Sarah gave one too. (The antecedent is “a presentation”, and the anaphoric expression is “one”.)

The antecedent also does not always have to precede the anaphoric expression; when it doesn’t, these are called cases of cataphora or backwards anaphora:

If she doesn’t show up soon, Jane will be disqualified from the competition.

Despite there being many kinds of anaphora, this article will focus on pronominal anaphora, since this is the type of anaphora that has received the most attention in the linguistics and (especially) philosophical literature. Some anaphoric pronouns are referring expressions that inherit their referents from other referring expressions. For example, on the anaphoric reading of (3), “He” inherits its referent from “John”, which is said to be the antecedent of the pronoun. Such anaphora is simple and well understood. In cases such as (2) above, the anaphoric pronoun has as its antecedent a quantifier (“Every male lawyer” in (2)), and essentially functions as a variable bound by the quantifier. Again, such cases are well understood. There are some anaphoric pronouns that cannot be understood as referring expressions that inherit their referents from other referring expressions, nor as variables bound by quantified antecedents. These cases of anaphora are of interest to philosophers and linguists because formulating proper semantic theories for them has proved to be a difficult and interesting task. Many theories of these cases are currently being advocated.

1. Unproblematic Anaphora

The simplest sorts of anaphoric pronouns are those that “pick up” a reference from a previous referring expression whether in the same sentence or another. Consider for example:

John left. He said he was ill.
John left his wallet on the table.

on the readings of these sentences on which “he” and “his” co-refer with “John”. In such cases, the pronouns are anaphoric, and the expression “John” is called the antecedent of the anaphoric expression. The semantics of such anaphoric pronouns is very simple: the referent of the anaphoric pronoun is the referent of its antecedent.

As indicated above, there are also anaphoric pronouns with quantifier (rather than referring expression) antecedents. Examples include (2) above and:

Every male skier loves his mother.

Again, on the readings of these sentences on which “he” and “his” “look back” to their antecedents for interpretation rather than being assigned independent reference (e.g., by pointing to Chris when uttering “his” in (12)). It is widely held that in such cases, the pronouns function semantically as variables bound by their quantifier antecedents. Thus, their semantic function is just like that of bound variables of first order logic. [3] The insight that some pronouns with quantifier antecedents function like bound variables in first order logic goes back at least to Quine (1960, see chapter IV section 28). Historically, these cases have been of more interest to linguists than philosophers. For example, one thing that needs to be explained is that in a sentence like “Sarah likes her”, “Sarah” and “her” cannot co-refer (in order to get a co-reference reading, we must say “Sarah likes herself”), though we can get the co-reference reading (or not) in a sentence like “Sarah likes her sister”. Accounting for these types of patterns of sentence-internal anaphora is the central concern of the area of linguistics called binding theory (see May 1980; Higginbotham and May 1981; Chomsky 1981; Reinhardt 1983a,b; Büring 2005). Though these insights are all important, if examples like (3), (11), and (12) were the only kinds of pronominal anaphora, they currently would not be of much interest to so many philosophers and linguists.

2. Problematic Anaphora

Significant interest in anaphoric pronouns grew out of the realization that there are anaphoric pronouns that cannot be understood as having their references fixed by their antecedents (as in (3) and (11) above) nor as being variables bound by their quantifier antecedents (as in (2) and (12) above). The three sorts of examples of this discussed here have figured prominently in the literature on anaphora.

First, there is discourse anaphora: cases in which an anaphoric pronoun has an antecedent in another sentence, where that antecedent at least appears to be a quantifier.[4] Examples include:

An anthropologist discovered the skeleton called “Lucy”. He named the skeleton after a Beatle’s song.
Few professors came to the party. They had a good time.

There are at least two reasons for thinking that the pronouns in (13) and (14) are not variables bound by their quantifier antecedents. Both reasons are discussed by Evans (1977). The first is that such a treatment clearly yields the wrong truth conditions for examples like (14). If “they” is a bound variable in (14), the two sentences should be equivalent to

Few professors : x (x came to the party and x had a good time)

(Or, more colloquially, “Few professors are such that they both came to the party and had a good time.”) This is clearly incorrect, since the sentences of (14) entail that few professors attended the party (i.e., the first sentence entails this), whereas (14a) could be true if many professors attended.[5]

The second reason for thinking pronouns in cases of discourse anaphora aren’t bound variables is that it seems committed to the claim that the following anomalous sentences aren’t anomalous:

John bought no sheep and Harry vaccinated them.
Every professor came to the party. He had a great time.

If the (apparent) quantifiers in (13) and (14) can bind variables in sentences after those in which they occur, why can’t the quantifiers in (15) and (16)? If this could happen, (15) and (16) should be fine and should together be equivalent to, respectively:

No sheep were both bought by John and vaccinated by Harry.
Every professor came to the party and had a great time.

But they are not. Thus, pronouns in discourse anaphora are not variables (syntactically) bound by their quantifier antecedents.[6]

Furthermore, there are cases of (plural) anaphora in which the denotation of “they” is derived in a more indirect way from the antecedent, as in (17), an example of complement anaphora:

Few students came to the party. They were busy studying.

Unlike in (14), where “they” picks out the professors who came to the party, in (17), “they” picks out the students who didn’t come to the party. (For more about complement anaphora, see Nouwen (2003a), for complement anaphora in the psycholinguistics literature, see Sanford & Moxey (1993).)

Nor are these like example (3), in which the pronoun simply refers to the same thing as the antecedent. Indefinite descriptions like “an anthropologist” are commonly thought to be quantifiers, and expressions like “few professors” are certainly quantifiers, not referring expressions. On most theories of indefinite descriptions, the first sentence of (13) is true just in case there is at least one anthropologist who discovered the skeleton called “Lucy”; its truth does not depend on any particular anthropologist. Thus there is no referential antecedent in the first sentence for the pronoun in the second sentence to be co-referential with.

A further problem with thinking of these pronouns as referential can be seen by considering a slightly more complex example:

A man broke into Sarah’s apartment. Scott believes he came in the window.

The crucial point is that the second sentence has a reading on which it attributes to Scott a general belief instead of a belief about a particular person. This reading would be true, for example, if Scott believed that some man broke into Sarah’s apartment by coming in the window, but had no idea about who might have broken in. This is (prima facie) evidence that the pronoun in the second sentence is not a referring expression, because if it were, the second sentence of (18) would only have a reading on which it attributes to Scott a belief about the particular person the pronoun refers to. But this is incorrect.[7] (On the other hand, for a treatment of such de dicto readings while maintaining that the pronoun is a referring expression, see Elbourne 2005: 99–106.)

Thus, with pronouns in discourse anaphora, we have examples of pronouns that can neither be understood as picking up their referents from their antecedents nor as being variables bound by their antecedents. Discourse anaphora provides further interesting examples to philosophers and linguists when the antecedents are under the scope of quantifiers, modals, or negation. For example, the pronouns in (19), (20), and (22) are infelicitous, but those in (21) and (23) are felicitous. This is something further that an account of discourse anaphora needs to explain.[8]

Bryan didn’t buy a bottle of wine. #It is a pinot noir.
Bryan might buy a bottle of wine. #It is a pinot noir.
Bryan might buy a bottle of wine. It would be a pinot noir. (This an example of modal subordination. For an introduction to modal subordination see Roberts (1987, 1989, 1996).)
Bryan bought a bottle of wine at every store in the neighborhood. #It was a pinot noir.
Bryan bought a bottle of wine at every store in the neighborhood. It was always a pinot noir. (This is an example of quantificational subordination. For more on quantificational subordination see Brasoveanu 2006.)

A second sort of anaphoric pronoun that cannot be understood as a referring expression or as a bound variable is in fact a special case of discourse anaphora. However, it deserves separate mention because it has generated so much interest. Consider the following discourse, which we shall call a Geach Discourse, adapted from the analogous conjunction in Geach 1967:

Hob thinks a witch blighted Bob’s mare. Nob wonders whether she killed Cob’s sow.

There is a reading of this discourse on which both sentences in it are true even if there are no witches, so that “a witch” in the first sentence must take narrow scope with respect to “Hob thinks”. But then the scope of “a witch” cannot extend to the second sentence to bind the pronoun “she”, since the “scope” of “Hob thinks” doesn’t extend to the second sentence. Hence on the reading in question, which we shall call the Geach Reading, the pronoun “she” is not a bound variable. Further, since there are no witches, and “she” is anaphoric on “a witch”, “she” in the second sentence must in some sense being used to “talk about” a non-existent witch. Thus, it apparently cannot be a referring term either, since its alleged referent doesn’t exist. So here again we have an anaphoric pronoun that cannot be understood as a referring expression nor as a bound variable. Examples of this sort are sometimes referred to (misleadingly, in our view) as instances of intentional identity.

The third sort of case in which an anaphoric pronoun cannot be understood as a referring expression nor as a bound variable is that of “donkey anaphora”.[9] Here there are two varieties, which are called conditional and relative clause donkey sentences, respectively:

If Sarah owns a donkey, she beats it.
Every woman who owns a donkey beats it.

On the readings we are concerned with, neither (25) nor (26) is talking about any particular donkey, and so the pronoun “it” cannot be a term referring to a particular donkey. Further, in the case of (25), all independent evidence available suggests that a quantifier can’t take wide scope over a conditional and bind variables in its consequent (*“If John owns every donkeyi, he beats iti”). This suggests that the (apparent) quantifier “a donkey” in (25) cannot bind the pronoun in the consequent. In addition, even if “a donkey” could magically do this in (25), assuming it is an existential quantifier, we still wouldn’t get the intuitive truth conditions of (25), which require that Sarah beats every donkey she owns. Similarly, the independent evidence available suggests that quantifiers can’t scope out of relative clauses (*“A man who owns every donkeyi beats iti”), and so again the pronoun in (26) is not within the scope of its quantifier antecedent and so is not bound by it. Thus, the pronouns in both conditional and relative clause donkey sentences can be neither understood as referring expressions nor as bound variables.

So now we have three cases of anaphoric pronouns that cannot be understood as referring expressions nor as bound variables: 1) pronouns in discourse anaphora; 2) pronouns in Geach discourses and 3) pronouns in (conditional and relative clause) donkey sentences. Let’s call these cases of problematic anaphora. The recent interest in anaphora is largely an interest in finding a semantic theory for problematic anaphora. In the next section, we outline the main theories that have arisen to fill this void.

3. Recent Theories of Problematic Anaphora

Before discussing recent theories of problematic anaphora, a few caveats are in order. First, our discussion will not be exhaustive. We cover what we take to be the best known and most promising theories. Second, because each theory is a formal, sophisticated semantic theory, to describe a single theory in detail would itself be a paper length project. Thus, we try instead to give a simple, informal sketch of the main features of each theory. The notes and references point the interested reader to places where he/she can get more detail. Third, we shall confine ourselves to briefly describing how each theory handles simple discourse anaphora of the sort exhibited by (13) above, in which a pronoun in one sentence is anaphoric on an indefinite noun phrase in a previous sentence, and donkey anaphora like (25) and (26). Readers interested in more details on how these theories deal with embedding under quantifiers, negation, or modals should consult the readings cited both in the previous section and in the sections below. Readers interested in Geach discourses or “intentional identity” should begin by consulting Asher (1987), Edelberg (1986), Geach (1967), Kamp (1990), King (1994), Braun (2012), and the works mentioned therein.

The first two of the theories discussed below, discourse representation theory and dynamic semantics, represent departures from traditional semantics, departures which were largely motivated at the beginning by the problematic anaphora cases. The second two theories discussed below, d-type theories and the CDQ theory, represent ways in which the problematic anaphora data is dealt with within a traditional semantic framework.

3.1 Discourse Representation Theory

In the early 1980s, Irene Heim (1982) and Hans Kamp (1981) independently formulated very similar semantic theories that were in part designed to handle problematic anaphora, particularly donkey and discourse anaphora. The theories developed by Heim and Kamp have come to be known as Discourse Representation Theory or DRT (see entry on Discourse Representation Theory).[10] We shall not attempt to describe differences between the formulations of Heim and Kamp. Indeed, in our exposition we shall combine elements of the two theories. Readers interested in the differences between the two accounts should consult Heim (1982) and Kamp (1981) directly.

We believe it is fair to say that it was the development of DRT that made the semantics of anaphora a central issue in philosophy of language. One reason for this was the following bold statement by Kamp (1981):

A theory of this form differs fundamentally from those familiar from the truth-theoretical and model-theoretical literature, and thus a substantial argument will be wanted that such a radical departure from existing frameworks is really necessary. The particular analysis carried out in the main part of this paper should be seen as a first attempt to provide such an argument. The analysis deals with only a small number of linguistic problems, but careful reflection upon just those problems already reveals, I suggest, that a major revision of semantic theory is called for. (Kamp 1981: 278)

The problems that Kamp goes on to address are the treatment of donkey anaphora and simple discourse anaphora. Hence Kamp appears to be saying that these problems cannot be handled within more traditional frameworks and thus that a DRT approach is necessary. Obviously, the claim that the semantics of anaphora requires a radical revision in semantic theory got the attention of philosophers of language. Thus, the study of problematic anaphora blossomed during the 1980s and 1990s.

The first way in which DRT departs from more traditional approaches is that it claims that indefinite noun phrases such as “an anthropologist” or “a donkey” are essentially predicates with free variables rather than existential quantifiers. Thus, the above indefinites might as well look as follows at the level of “logical form”:


In effect, an indefinite introduces a “novel” variable, (i.e., in DRT’s terminology, establishes a discourse referent) and a pronoun anaphoric on an indefinite is interpreted as the same variable as was introduced by its indefinite antecedent. Hence a simple discourse such as:

A man loves Annie. He is rich.

in effect can be represented as[11]

x loves Annie
x is rich

In addition to this, DRT builds in to the assignment of truth conditions default existential quantification over free variables. Thus, (27a) is true iff there is some assignment to the variable “x” that is in the extension of “man”, “loves Annie” and “rich”, that is, iff something is a man who loves Annie and is rich. Thus, that indefinites appear to have the force of existential quantifiers in cases like (27) is not because they are existential quantifiers but because of the default existential quantification of free variables.

Let us turn now to the DRT treatment of donkey anaphora. First, note that both relative clause and conditional donkey anaphora appear to have a sort of “universal force”: the truth of (25) and (26) above, repeated here, require that Sarah beats every donkey she owns and that every donkey owning woman beats every donkey she owns.[12]

If Sarah owns a donkey, she beats it.
Every woman who owns a donkey beats it.

Thus, the indefinite here mysteriously has universal force and expresses something about every donkey owned by someone. Recall that according to DRT, an indefinite is effectively a one-place predicate with a free variable. The central idea of DRT in the case of both conditional and relative clause donkey sentences is that the universal force of the indefinite results from the variable in it being bound by an operator with genuine universal force. In the case of (25), the “conditional operator” has universal force, since it in effect says that in every case (assignment to free variables) in which the antecedent is true, the consequent is true. So (25) claims that every assignment to “x” that makes “Sarah owns x” and “x is a donkey” true, also makes “Sarah beats x” true. So (25) is true iff Sarah beats every donkey she owns. In (26), by contrast, the universal quantifier (determiner) “every” not only binds the variables associated with the predicative material “woman who owns a donkey” (for example, presumably there is such a variable in the subject argument place of “beats”), but it also binds the variable introduced by the predicate-with-free-variable “a donkey”. So it is as though (26) has the “logical form”.[13]

Every x,y (woman(x) & donkey(y) & x owns y) (x beats y)

Note that this account requires allowing quantificational determiners (“every”) to bind multiple variables. This, again, is a departure from more classical approaches.[14]

Now since the DRT approach claims that indefinites get their apparent quantificational force from other elements that bind the variables in them, it predicts that when different determiners are involved in relative clause donkey sentences, as in

Most women who own a donkey beat it.

the indefinite should appear to have the quantificational force of the new determiner (“Most”). So (16) should be true if most pairs of women and donkeys they own are such that the women beat the donkeys. Similar remarks apply to conditionals containing “non-universal” quantifiers such as “usually”, as in

Usually, if a woman owns a donkey, she beats it.

This should be true if most pairs of women and donkeys they own are such that the women beat the donkeys. But this prediction, particularly in the case of (28), seems clearly false. If there are exactly ten donkey owning women and one woman owns ten donkeys and beats them all, while the nine other women own a donkey each and don’t beat them, (28) intuitively seems false: most donkey owning women fail to beat the donkeys they own. However, the DRT account as formulated claims (28) is true in this situation. This difficulty is one of the main criticisms of classical DRT in the literature and is often called the proportion problem (Heim (1990) claims that Nirit Kadmon so dubbed it). The criticism is damaging, because it appears to refute what was claimed to be a central insight of DRT: that the apparent quantificational force of indefinites comes from other elements that bind the variables in them.

A second difficulty with classical DRT as formulated here involves cases such as (18) above, repeated here:

A man broke into Sarah’s apartment. Scott believes he came in the window.

As mentioned above, (18) has a reading on which the second sentence of the discourse attributes a general belief to Scott (something like the belief that a man who broke into Sarah’s apartment came in through the window). But as formulated, DRT doesn’t get this reading. For the default existential quantification of free variables acts in effect like a wide scope existential quantifier over the entire discourse. Thus, it is as if (18) were as follows:

(∃x)(x is a man & x broke into Sarah’s apartment & Scott believes x came in the window).

But this attributes a belief about a specific person to Scott. Hence it can’t capture the reading mentioned. Similarly, consider the following sentences:

Every women who has a secret admirer thinks he is stalking her.
If a woman has a secret admirer, usually she thinks he is stalking her

These sentences also appear to have readings on which they attribute general or de dicto beliefs to the women in question. That is, they have readings on which they attribute to the women in question general beliefs to the effect that they are being stalked by secret admirers. This is why these sentences can be true even though the women in question don’t know who their secret admirers are, and so have no beliefs about particular persons stalking them. For reasons exactly similar to those given for the case of the analogous reading of the second sentence of (18), these readings can’t be captured by DRT as formulated here. We shall see below that dynamic approaches have exactly similar problems. Asher (1987) and Kamp (1990) attempt to remedy this problem (among others). For further elaboration of the DRT framework, see also Kamp and Reyle (1993) and van Eijck and Kamp (1997). For expansions of the DRT framework, e.g., SDRT (segmented discourse representation theory), see Asher and Lascarides (2003), for compositional versions of DRT, see Muskens (1996) and Brasoveanu (2006, 2007, 2008).

3.2 Dynamic Semantic Approaches

As its name suggests, Discourse Representation Theory was designed to capture the way in which certain features of a discourse, particularly inter-sentential relations such as inter-sentential anaphora, affect the interpretation of sentences in the discourse. At the same time, Discourse Representation Theory as originally formulated in Kamp (1981) failed to be compositional, at least in the sense of that term familiar from Montagovian approaches.[15]

The initial motivation for a dynamic semantic (see entry on dynamic semantics) approach to discourse and donkey anaphora was on the one hand to preserve the “dynamic” elements of DRT, that is the view that what an expression means is given by the way in which the addition of the expression to a discourse changes the information available to a hearer of the discourse, (“meaning as potential for changing the state of information”). On the other hand, dynamic semantic approaches wanted to adhere to compositionality. This is made very clear in the introduction of the classic statement of the dynamic semantic approach to discourse and donkey anaphora, namely Groenendijk and Stokhof (1991). We shall here discuss their treatment of discourse and donkey anaphora, Dynamic Predicate Logic (henceforth DPL), and gesture at other treatments in the dynamic semantic tradition. First generation dynamic semantic theories of anaphora like DPL give an account of singular cross-sentential anaphora as well as donkey sentences. Subsequent work in dynamic semantics has adapted and added to these tools to account for things like plural anaphora, quantificational subordination, and other issues. (See for example van den Berg (1996), Krifka (1996a), Nouwen (2003b), Brasoveanu (2007, 2010), and Keshet (2018).) Of the theories discussed in this entry, this is the most difficult to explain informally. We shall keep the discussion as informal as possible, and urge interested readers to consult the works cited directly for more detail.

To begin with, let’s look at how simple discourse anaphora is handled on DPL. So consider again:

A man loves Annie. He is rich.

Now in DPL, indefinites such as “a man” are treated as existential quantifiers. Further, DPL treats consecutive sentences in discourses as being conjoined. So we can think of (27) as follows:

(∃x)(man x & x loves Annie) & x is rich

Here we have rendered the anaphoric pronoun “He” as the variable “x”, the same variable that is the variable of its quantifier antecedent. This represents the anaphoric connection. The important point to notice is that the anaphoric pronoun/variable in (27b) is not within the syntactic scope of its quantifier antecedent. This corresponds to the fact that in DPL, the syntactic scopes of quantifiers are confined to the sentences in which they occur, as current syntactic theory tells us they should be.

The key to understanding the DPL account of discourse anaphora lies in understanding its semantics of the existential quantifier and conjunction. Let’s begin with existential quantification. The basic idea here it that when we interpret an existential quantifier, the output of that interpretation may affect the interpretation of subsequent expressions. In standard predicate logic, the interpretation of an existential quantifier is a set of assignment functions. In DPL, it is a set of ordered pairs of input and output assignment functions. The output assignment functions act as the input to subsequent formulas. Take for example the simple formula “\((\exists x)(\mbox{man } x)\)”. In DPL, such a formula takes all the input functions g, and for each one outputs all the possible assignment functions h such that they differ from g at most in that they assign x to an object in the interpretation of “man” (i.e., they assign x to a man). More generally, accounting for possibly more complex formulas in the scope of the existential (including another quantifier), a pair of sequences \(\langle g, h\rangle\) is in the interpretation of an existential formula “\((\exists x)\Phi\)” just in case there is an assignment function k differing from g at most on x such that \(\langle k,h\rangle\); is in the interpretation of “\(\Phi\)”.[16] So note how interpreting the existential quantifier results in shifting from the input function g to k, where k is now the input to “\(\Phi\)”. This makes the existential quantifier internally dynamic, capable of affecting the interpretation of expressions within its syntactic scope. Further, the fact that the output assignment functions of interpreting the whole existentially quantified sentence are allowed to be different from the input to the interpretation means that the processing of the existentially quantified formula may affect the interpretation of expressions after the existentially quantified formula, and hence outside the scope of the existential quantifier. This is to say that the existential quantifier is externally dynamic, capable of affecting the interpretation of expressions outside its syntactic scope. As we will see, an expression can be internally dynamic and externally static (as well as internally and externally static). At any rate, putting things very roughly, the idea here is that once the existential quantifier “resets” the value of “x” so that it satisfies the formula the quantifier embeds, that value stays reset (unless there is a subsequent existential quantifier attached to the same variable) and can affect the interpretation of subsequent formulas.

Turning now to conjunction, the idea here is similar. Again, the fundamental idea is that the interpretation of the left conjunct can affect the interpretation of the right conjunct. A bit more formally, a pair of assignment functions \(\langle g,h\rangle\); is in the interpretation of a conjunction just in case there is an assignment function k such that \(\langle g,k\rangle\); is in the interpretation of the left conjunct and \(\langle k,h\rangle\); the right conjunct.[17] So note how interpreting the left conjunct changes the input sequence for the interpretation of the right conjunct. Again, this means that conjunction is internally dynamic, possibly affecting the interpretation of expressions in its scope. And again, that the output of interpreting a conjunction, here h, can differ from the input, here g, means that a conjunction is capable of affecting things outside of it and hence outside of the scope of that conjunction sign. Again, this is to say that conjunction is externally dynamic.

To go through an example, we also need to understand the semantics of an atomic formula like “man x”. Atomic formulas act like a test on the input assignments, allowing those assignments that satisfy the condition to pass through and act as input to subsequent assignments and rejecting the rest. However, atomic formulas do not change assignment functions. More specifically, an input output pair \(\langle g,h\rangle\) is in the interpretation of an atomic formula “\(Rt_1 \ldots t_n\)” just in case \(h=g\) and h assigns “\(t_1\)”… “\(t_n\)” to something in the interpretation of R.

Putting these elements all together, we are now in a position to see how DPL accounts for (27b). Informally speaking, the first sentence of (27b) takes all the input assignment functions g and outputs all those assignments h in that they differ at most from g in assigning “x” to a man who loves Annie. Thus the output of the first sentence is all (and only) the possible assignments of “x” (given the model) to men who love Annie. The output of the first sentence is the input to the second. The second sentence tests these assignments, allowing only those through which also assign “x” to something in the interpretation of “rich”. The output of the second sentence includes all and only the assignments of “x” to rich men who love Annie. As long as the model includes at least one rich man who loves Annie, there will be at least one such output assignment. Hence the discourse is true iff there is at least one rich man who loves Annie. Since conjunction is externally dynamic, we can keep adding sentences with anaphoric pronouns to similar effect. Thus in a discourse such as

A man loves Annie. He is rich. He is famous.

the discourse is all true iff some rich famous man loves Annie.

Thus the dynamic semantic treatment yields a truth conditional equivalence between \[ (\exists x)(\Phi) \mathbin{\&} \Psi \] and \[ (\exists x)(\Phi \mathbin{\&} \Psi) \] even when “\(\Psi\)” contains free occurrences of “x”. Hence it is often said that in DPL quantifiers semantically bind free variables outside their syntactic scope. This doesn’t encounter the same problems as the syntactic binding treatment rejected in section 2, since it allows quantifiers to provide values for subsequent anaphoric pronouns without actually binding them in a way that falsely predicts, e.g., that “Exactly one man loves Annie. He is rich” is truth-conditionally equivalent to \(\mbox{“}(\exists !x)(\mbox{man } x \mathbin{\&} x \mbox{ loves Annie} \mathbin{\&} x \mbox{ is rich})\mbox{”}\).

Because the treatment of donkey anaphora is a bit more complicated technically, and because some of the main ideas of DPL are now on the table, we will be more suggestive here. Again, we urge the interested reader to consult Groenendijk and Stokhof (1991) directly.

First, consider conditional donkey anaphora:

If a farmer owns a donkey, he beats it.

(32) gets regimented in DPL as follows:

\((\exists x)(\mbox{farmer } x \mathbin{\&} \exists y(\mbox{donkey } y \mathbin{\&} \mbox{own }x,y)) \rightarrow \mbox{beat } x,y\)

There are three crucial points to the DPL treatment here. (1) The existential quantifier is externally dynamic and hence may affect the interpretation of variables outside its scope, and in particular “x” in the consequent of (32a). (2) “\(\rightarrow\)” is internally dynamic and allows the interpretation of its antecedent to affect the interpretation of its consequent (just as is conjunction). 1 and 2 together mean that the quantifier in the antecedent of (32)/(32a) can semantically bind the variable in the consequent, even though it is not in the syntactic scope of the quantifier. But without doing anything further, we would be left with (32a) having the truth conditions of

\( (\exists x)(\mbox{farmer } x \mathbin{\&} \exists y(\mbox{donkey } y \mathbin{\&} \mbox{own } x,y)) \rightarrow \mbox{beat } x,y)\)

where “\(\rightarrow\)” is the standard material conditional. This doesn’t give the intuitive truth conditions of (32) on the reading that concerns us, i.e., that every donkey-owning farmer beats every donkey he owns. The third and final element we need to get the truth conditions to come out right is to say that a pair of assignments \(\langle h,h\rangle\) is in the interpretation of a conditional iff for all k such that \(\langle h,k\rangle\) satisfies the antecedent, there is a j such that \(\langle k,j\rangle\) satisfies the consequent.[18] This says, roughly, that for any output assignment k of a pair of assignments satisfying the antecedent of the conditional (assignment of a donkey-owning farmer to x and a donkey owned by x to y in the case of (32)/(32a)), k is the input of a pair \(\langle k,j\rangle\) that satisfies the consequent, for some j. Since the consequent of the conditional in (32)/(32a) is an atomic formula, j=k. So the account claims that any output of a pair of sequences that satisfies the existentially quantified antecedent also satisfies “x beats y”, and so also assigns to “x” and “y” to something that stands in the beating relation. That is, the truth of (32)/(32a) requires every donkey-owning farmer to beat every donkey he owns.

Turning now to our relative clause donkey sentence, (repeated here)

Every woman who owns a donkey beats it.

we shall be even more schematic. This gets regimented in DPL as follows, (giving the predicate letters here the obvious meanings):

\((\forall x)((Wx \mathbin{\&} (\exists y)(Dy \mathbin{\&} Oxy)) \rightarrow Bxy)\)

Note in particular that the “y” in “Bxy” is not in the scope of the existential quantifier. Now given a quite straightforward treatment of the universal quantifier, on which it allows dynamic effects in its scope,[19] in all essentials, the example works like (32)/(32a). For stripping the universal quantifier away, we have:

\( ((Wx \mathbin{\&} (\exists y)(Dy \mathbin{\&} Oxy))\rightarrow Bxy\)

And overlooking the free variables left by stripping away the universal quantifier (which anyway were in its scope and bound by it), we simply have another conditional with an existential quantifier in its antecedent and a formula in the consequent containing an occurrence of the variable of that existential quantifier. So the treatment goes essentially as it did for (32)/(32a) itself, with the externally dynamic existential quantifier, internally dynamic conditional, and universal quantification over assignments in the semantics of the conditional all working their magic so that (26)’s truth requires every donkey owning woman to beat every donkey she owns.

Though DPL cannot handle relative clause donkey sentences such as:

Most women who own a donkey beat it.

since it is working within the framework of a first order logic without generalized quantifiers, this is only a limitation of this particular formulation and not of dynamic approaches generally. Others have formulated systems of dynamic semantics with generalized quantifiers that are capable of dealing with examples like (33).[20]

On the other hand, DPL and dynamic approaches generally do face a problem. Put crudely, DPL (and dynamic approaches generally) solve the problems of discourse and donkey anaphora by formulating semantics for quantifiers that allows quantifiers to semantically bind variables that aren’t in their syntactic scopes. In this they (self-consciously) resemble DRT. But then they face a problem similar to one faced by DRT and mentioned above. Consider again our discourse (18), repeated here

A man broke into Sarah’s apartment. Scott believes he came in the window.

As mentioned above, (18) has a reading on which the second sentence of the discourse attributes a general belief to Scott (something like the belief that a man who broke into Sarah’s apartment came in through the window). On a dynamic approach to (18), the quantifier in the first sentence semantically binds the variable in the second sentence. But then this semantically amounts to quantification into the verb of attitude, and so will not result in a reading of the second sentence on which it attributes a general belief to Scott. Hence, dynamic approaches need to invoke some other mechanism to get the reading of the second sentence in question.[21]

Similarly, again consider the following sentences discussed in connection with DRT above :

Every woman who has a secret admirer thinks he is stalking her.
If a woman has a secret admirer, usually she thinks he is stalking her.

As mentioned there, these sentences also appear to have readings on which they attribute general or de dicto beliefs to the women in question. That is, they have readings on which they attribute to the women in question general beliefs to the effect that they are being stalked by secret admirers. This is why these sentences can be true even though the women in question don’t know who their secret admirers are, and so have no beliefs about particular persons stalking them. For reasons exactly similar to those given for the case of the analogous reading of the second sentence of (18), these readings can’t be captured by DPL or dynamic approaches generally.

Paul Elbourne (2005) reviews three other serious problems for dynamic approaches. The first is the problem of disjunctive antecedents (discussed in detail in Stone 1992). The problem is with sentences like the following:

If Mary hasn’t seen John lately, or Ann misses Bill, she calls him. (Elbourne 2005: 19)

This is problematic because the pronouns cannot co-refer with the antecedent (since it is disjunctive), but the antecedent also does not introduce any suitable variables or quantifiers to provide values for the pronouns, since they are definites (names) and not indefinites or other quantificational expressions.

The other two problems involve anaphoric pronouns that don’t have a proper linguistic antecedent. The following example, originally from Jacobson (2000), is one in which there is no linguistic antecedent for the pronoun “it”, though the pronoun has a covarying interpretation with the quantifier “most faculty members”:

A new faculty member picks up her first paycheck from her mailbox. Waving it in the air, she says to a colleague: Do most faculty members deposit it in the Credit Union? (Elbourne 2005: 20)

The second kind of example involves what is commonly called a paycheck pronoun:

John gave his paycheck to his mistress. Everybody else put it in the bank. (Elbourne 2005: 21)

The problematic (salient) reading is the one is which everybody else put their own paychecks in the bank. The first sentence only introduces John’s paycheck, hence “it” doesn’t have a proper antecedent. Standard dynamic accounts don’t have the machinery for dealing with pronouns without the proper linguistic antecedent, since it is the antecedent’s effect on the context that accounts for the anaphoric pronoun’s interpretation (but see Keshet (2018) for a recent dynamic semantics of anaphora that includes an account of paycheck pronouns).[22]

3.3 Descriptive Approaches

There have been many accounts of the semantics of anaphora according to which anaphoric pronouns in some sense function like definite descriptions. Though there are important differences between such theories, examples of theories of this sort include Evans (1977), Parsons (1978, Other Internet Resources), Davies (1981), Neale (1990), Heim (1990) and Elbourne (2005). Theories of this sort are often called E-Type or D-type approaches. Though it is beyond the scope of this article to compare all the different accounts, some of the main differences in types of accounts are as follows. E-type accounts are sometimes distinguished as ones in which a definite description fixes the referent of an anaphoric pronoun, whereas D-type accounts are ones in which the pronoun itself has the semantics of a definite description. However, it is common to describe the latter as 'E-type' as well. These are further sub-divided into those that treat pronouns as definite descriptions merely at the level of semantics and those that also treat them as descriptions at the level of syntax. Finally, accounts differ in how the descriptive material is recovered. Some accounts hold that the descriptive material has to be recovered linguistically, from prior discourse. Others hold that it can be any contextually salient description.

We will discuss two of the best known versions of the view, Neale (1990) and Elbourne (2005). We should add that though Neale developed the view in question in greater detail, Davies (1981) had earlier defended essentially the same view in all crucial respects.[23] Thus, the view we go on to describe should probably be called the Davies-Neale view. But since we shall focus on Neale’s presentation of the view, we shall talk of Neale’s view.

On Neale’s view, in all instances of problematic anaphora, anaphoric pronouns “go proxy for” definite descriptions understood as quantifiers along roughly Russellian lines. First, consider discourse anaphora. Neale’s view is that in a discourse such as:

John bought a donkey. Harry vaccinated it.

the pronoun “it” “goes proxy for” the definite description “the donkey John bought.” Hence the second sentence of such a discourse is equivalent to the sentence “Harry vaccinated the donkey John bought” with the description understood in the standard Russellian fashion. Within a generalized quantifier type framework, where “the” is treated as a determiner that, like other determiners, combines with a set term to form a quantified NP, the evaluation clause for sentences containing a singular description (with wide scope) can be given as follows

“[The \(x:Fx](Gx)\)” is true iff \(|\mathbf{F}|=1\) and \(|\mathbf{F-G}|=0\)

So the second sentence of (37) is true iff Harry vaccinated the unique donkey John bought. Thus far, then, the view is that pronouns anaphoric on singular indefinites are interpreted as Russellian definite descriptions.

There is, however, a further complication in Neale’s theory that is invoked in the explanation of donkey anaphora. In particular, Neale introduces what he calls a “numberless description”: a description that, unlike semantically singular descriptions, puts no cardinality constraint on the denotation of the set term that combines with the determiner to form the quantified NP (other than that it must be nonempty—note above how in the singular case \(|\mathbf{F}|\) is constrained to equal one.) Following Neale, let “whe” be the determiner (corresponding to “the”) used to form “numberless descriptions.” Then the evaluation clause for sentences containing numberless descriptions, analogous to (38) above, would be

“[whe \(x: Fx](Gx)\)” is true iff \(|\mathbf{F}| \ge 1\) and \(|\mathbf{F-G}|=0\)

Thus numberless descriptions are in effect universal quantifiers.

In addition to going proxy for Russellian singular descriptions in the way we have seen, Neale claims that anaphoric pronouns sometimes go proxy for numberless descriptions. In particular, Neale holds that pronouns anaphoric on singular existential quantifiers (but outside of their scope) can be interpreted either as standard Russellian descriptions or as numberless descriptions. Now if the pronouns in our conditional and relative clause donkey sentences (repeated here)

If Sarah owns a donkey, she beats it.
Every woman who owns a donkey beats it.

are interpreted as a numberless description, (25) asserts that if Sarah owns a donkey, she beats all the donkeys she owns and (26) asserts that every donkey owning woman beats every donkey she owns. Thus, Neale’s account of donkey anaphora requires the pronouns here to be interpreted as numberless descriptions.

Having seen how Neale’s theory handles discourse anaphora and donkey anaphora, we turn to difficulties with the account. An obvious question concerning an account like this that allows pronouns anaphoric on singular existential quantifiers to go proxy for both Russellian and numberless descriptions is: what determines whether such a pronoun is going proxy for a Russellian, as opposed to a numberless, description? This question is pressing for Neale’s account, since there will be a substantial difference in the truth conditions of a pronoun-containing sentence depending on whether the pronoun receives a numberless or Russellian interpretation. In his most explicit statement about the matter (1990: 237) Neale makes clear that it is primarily whether the utterer had a particular individual in mind in uttering the indefinite description that determines whether a pronoun anaphoric on it receives a Russellian or a numberless interpretation.[24]

If this is correct, then discourses of the form

A(n) F is G. He/she/it is H.

generally ought to display both readings (in the suitable contexts), depending on whether the utterer of the discourse had a particular individual in mind in uttering “A(n) F”. So the second sentences of discourses of the form of (40) ought to have readings on which they mean the unique F that is G is H (Russellian) and on which they mean every F that is G is H (numberless). But this does not seem to be the case. In particular, such discourses do not have readings corresponding to the numberless interpretation of the pronoun. Consider the discourse anaphora analogue of the donkey conditional (25):

Sarah owns a donkey. She beats it.

It seems clear that this discourse has no reading on which the second sentence means that Sarah beats every donkey she owns, even if we imagine that the utterer of the discourse had no particular donkey in mind when she uttered the first sentence. Suppose, for example, that the Homeland Security and Donkey Care Bureau comes to town and wants information about local donkey ownership and beating. The speaker tells them that she really don’t know how many donkeys anybody owns, and has never seen or had any other contact with particular local donkeys. But she tells them that she has received some information from reliable sources and it has been deemed “credible”. Asked what she has heard, she responds: “Sarah owns a donkey and she beats it”.

Even though she has no particular donkey in mind in uttering these sentences, we simply don’t get a numberless reading here. If Sarah beats some donkey she owns, the speaker has spoken truly even if she owns others she fails to beat. Or again, suppose we are debating whether anybody has an eight track tape player anymore, and one of us says “I’ll bet the following is true: some guy with a ‘68 Camaro owns an eight track player and he still uses it.” Again, there is no numberless reading for the pronoun in the second sentence, even though the speaker clearly has no particular eight-track player in mind. If some ‘68 Camaro driving guy owns and uses an eight-track player, the sentence is true even if he owns other eight track players that aren’t used.[25]

So it appears that Neale’s account has no explanation of why the pronouns in discourses like (25a) never have numberless readings. Neale’s account has similar problems with sentences like:

Some woman who owns a donkey beats it.

Here again, Neale’s theory predicts that this sentence has a reading on which its truth requires that some woman beats every donkey she owns. And again, even if we imagine the sentence being uttered without any particular woman or donkey in mind, we don’t get this reading of the sentence predicted by Neale’s theory, (say we are discussing women’s tendencies towards animals they own, and one of us utters (41) simply thinking it is statistically likely to be true). So Neale’s account has no explanation as to why the second sentence of discourse (25a) and sentence (41) lack the relevant readings assigned to those sentences by his theory.[26]

Elbourne (2005) proposes a different D-type theory. The main thesis of the book is that pronouns of all types, proper names, and definite descriptions have a unified syntax and semantics: they are all of type \(\langle s, e\rangle\) (functions from situations to individuals) and are syntactically comprised of a definite determiner that takes two arguments: an index and an NP (noun phrase).

His theory of unbound pronouns is NP-deletion theory. NP-deletion is when an NP at the level of syntax is (felicitously) unpronounced at the surface level as in:

I like Bill’s wine, but Max’s is even better.

On Elbourne’s theory, pronouns undergo obligatory NP-deletion. That is, a sentence like (25), at the level of syntax is actually (25b):

If Sarah owns a donkey, she beats it.
If Sarah owns a donkey, she beats [it donkey].

Following Elbourne, we’ll suppress mention of the index, since it doesn’t do any work here (anaphoric pronouns have a null index on his view, though he does provide arguments for why this null index is present—see Elbourne (2005: 118–126)). Pronouns have the same semantics as the determiner “the” (abstracting away from the phi-features of pronouns) so that (25b) has the same semantics as (25c):

If Sarah owns a donkey, she beats the donkey.

This is motivated by the insight that pronouns pattern with minimal definite descriptions rather than long ones, as other D-type theories have it. For example, a theory like Neale’s predicts that (43a) has the semantics of (43b):

A man murdered Smith, but John does not believe that he murdered Smith.
A man murdered Smith, but John does not believe that the man who murdered Smith murdered Smith.

But this is problematic, because (43a) clearly has a salient, true reading, whereas (43b) does not. However, Elbourne observes that (43c) has the same salient true reading as (43a):

  • (43c) A man murdered Smith, but John does not believe that the man murdered Smith.

Treating pronouns as determiners is motivated more generally by Postal (1966)’s arguments that they at least sometimes have the same semantics as determiners based on examples such as:

You troops will embark but the other troops will remain.

Finally, positing an NP-deletion theory provides an elegant solution to the problem of the formal link, which is that any good account of anaphora has to explain why (45a) is felicitous but (46b) is not:

Every man who has a wife is sitting next to her.
#Every married man is sitting next to her. (Heim 1982, 1990)

Since NP-deletion generally requires a linguistic antecedent, if pronouns are determiners that have undergone NP-deletion, this explains the contrast.

As mentioned above, pronouns have the semantics of determiners. Specifically, Elbourne proposes a situation semantics (situations in natural language semantics), where the semantics of pronouns (and determiners) are treated in a Fregean way, as follows:

\[ [[\mbox{it}]]^g = \lambda_{\langle\langle s,e\rangle\langle s,t\rangle\rangle}. \lambda s: \exists!x(\lambda s'. x)(s) = 1. \iota x\ f(\lambda s'. x)(s) = 1 \]

That is to say, pronouns come with presuppositions that there is a unique individual in each situation that satisfies the predicate, and (when that presupposition is satisfied), they refer to that individual (in that situation). Conditional donkey anaphora works as follows. A sentence like (47) has the structure at LF of (48):

If a man owns a donkey, he beats it.
[[always [if [[a man] [\(\lambda\)6 [[a donkey][ \(\lambda\)2 [t6 owns t2]]]]]]][[he man] beats [it donkey]]] (Elbourne 2005: 52)[27]

The semantics of “always” is crucial to getting the truth conditions right:

\([[\mbox{always}]]^g = \lambda p_{\langle s,t\rangle}. \lambda q_{\langle s,t\rangle}. \lambda s\). for every minimal situation \(s'\) such that \(s' \le s\) and \(p(s') = 1\), there is a situation \(s''\) such that \(s'' \le s\) and \(s''\) is a minimal situation such that \(s' \le s''\) and \(q(s'') = 1\)

Basically, “always” takes two sentences, and returns true iff every minimal situation that satisfies the first sentence has a minimal extension that satisfies the second sentence. A minimal situation is one that contains one or more thin particulars—an individual abstracted away from its properties—and one or more properties or relations that the thin particular(s) instantiate(s). An extension of a minimal situation includes all those same particulars and properties and relations, with (possibly) some more particulars, properties, or relations in addition. On Elbourne’s account “if” doesn’t play any role in contributing to the truth conditions of a donkey conditional; it is semantically vacuous. It is the (sometimes silent) adverb of quantification along with the semantics of the antecedent and consequent that do the work in yielding the truth conditions. The following are the truth conditions for (47) on Elbourne’s account. (We won’t go through the derivation for relative clause donkey anaphora, but it works similarly. See Elbourne 2005: 53.)

\(\lambda s_1\). For every minimal situation \(s_4\) such that
\(s_4 \le s_1\) and there is an individual y and a situation \(s_7\) such that \(s_7\) is a minimal situation such that \(s_7\le s_4\) and y is a man in \(s_7\), such that there is a situation \(s_9\) such that \(s_9\le s_4\) and \(s_9\) is a minimal situation such that
\(s_7\le s_9\) and there is an individual x and a situation \(s_2\) such that \(s_2\) is a minimal situation such that \(s_2\le s_9\) and x is a donkey in \(s_2\), such that there is a situation \(s_3\) such that \(s_3\le s_9\) and \(s_3\) is a minimal situation such that \(s_2 \le s_3\) and y owns x in \(s_3\),
there is a situation \(s_5\) such that
\(s_5\le s_1\) and \(s_5\) is a minimal situation such that \(s_4\le s_5\) and \(\iota x\ x\) is a man in \(s_5\) beats in \(s_5\) \(\iota x\ x\) is a donkey in \(s_5\). (2005: 52)

Thus on Elbourne’s account (47) is true iff each donkey-owning man beats every donkey he owns.

Elbourne surprisingly never goes through a derivation of a case of cross-sentential anaphora as in:

A woman walked in. She sat down.

His view is that this has the same semantics as (49a):

A woman walked in. The woman sat down.

But he doesn’t provide an account of how this works, neither in description nor detailed derivation. One worry about this is that in the conditional and relative clause donkey sentences, the fact that the pronoun(s) co-varies with its antecedent is accounted for by “always” and “every”. These expressions quantify over situations in a way that guarantees that the man who beats the donkey is the same man who owns that same donkey, effectively acting as (semantic) binding. But there is no such mechanism in place to guarantee that “the woman” in (the situation in) the second sentence of (49) in any sense co-varies with the woman (in the situation) in the first. It is not clear how Elbourne’s view can accomplish this without employing either a dynamic notion of binding or a more traditional d-type account with complete descriptions.

However, Elbourne’s account doesn’t encounter the same problem as Neale’s in predicting numberless readings where there are none, as he doesn’t posit a numberless interpretation of the pronoun at all. This highlights a difference between the way that Neale’s theory approaches the truth conditions of conditional donkey sentences and the way DRT, dynamic semantics, the CDQ theory (discussed in the next section) and other D-type theories like Elbourne’s and Heim (1990)’s do (Heim 1990 also employs a situation semantics to account for conditional donkey anaphora). In these other theories, the requirement that all the donkey-owning men beat all the donkeys they own for (47) to be true arises due to the interaction of the semantic of indefinites, the semantics of anaphoric pronouns and the semantics of conditionals.[28] Indeed, it is the latter that is primarily implicated in (47)’s truth requiring that all donkeys owned by donkey-owning men be beaten (since the theories posit some sort of universal quantification in the semantics of conditionals). By contrast, on Neale’s view, the requirement that the men beat all the donkeys they own for (47) to be true (on one of its readings) essentially falls out of the semantics of the anaphoric pronoun alone, since on one of its readings, it expresses universal quantification over donkeys Sarah owns (the numberless description reading).

One problem that D-type theories face is that pronouns come with a uniqueness requirement (either as a presupposition or part of the asserted content). But it has been observed that pronouns anaphoric on indefinites do not have a uniqueness requirement; it seems that the truth conditions for such sentences are existential. This observation is nicely captures by Discourse Representation Theory, File Change Semantics, dynamic semantics, and the Context Dependent Quantifier approach (discussed in the next section). For example, consider (49) again. This seems true even if many women walked into the contextually salient place at the contextually salient time, and regardless of whether they sat down or not, so long as at least one woman walked in and sat down. Mandelkern & Rothschild (2020) call this phenomenon "definiteness filtering" and Lewis (forthcoming) calls it "the problem of non-uniqueness". Both of the cited works argue that there is evidence of uniqueness requirements on definites more generally, and the non-uniqueness is specific to the kind of constructions in (49). Mandelkern & Rothschild tentatively propose a D-type theory that employs situation semantics, while Lewis (forthcoming) argues for a D-type theory that takes definite descriptions to be ambiguous between presupposing worldly uniqueness and discourse uniqueness.[29]

Another problem that all D-type theories must address is the problem of indistinguishable participants. Since on D-type theories, pronouns in one way or another have the semantics of definite descriptions, they come with uniqueness presuppositions. When it comes to conditional donkey anaphora, the way to meet these uniqueness presuppositions is by employing minimal situations—the definite description then picks out the unique object satisfying the description in the minimal situation. (With the exception of Neale’s theory: since he employs numberless pronouns, the pronouns have no uniqueness presupposition.) Thus uniqueness is satisfied within the situation, even if it can’t be satisfied in the larger world. But in examples of indistinguishable participants, uniqueness cannot even be satisfied within a minimal situation. Consider the typical example, (50):

If a bishop meets a bishop, he blesses him.

In the minimal situation that satisfies the antecedent, there are two bishops that have the same property (meeting another bishop). Thus descriptions like “the bishop” or “the bishop who meets a bishop” do not denote uniquely. DRT and dynamic theories don’t have any problem at all with these examples because pronouns are treated as dynamically bound variables, not definite descriptions, and each instance of “a bishop” in the antecedent of (50) is associated with a different variable, which prescribe the anaphoric links to the two pronouns in the consequent. For D-type solutions to this puzzle see Heim(1990), Ludlow (1994), Elbourne (2005, 2016), Lewis (forthcoming).

Finally, it should be mentioned that there are some who propose mixed approaches, wherein some pronouns are treated as dynamically bound variables whereas others are treated as D-type (see Chierchia 1995; Kurafuji 1998, 1999). On these views, some pronouns are ambiguous between the two readings, while others have only the dynamically bound variable or D-type reading. This type of theory avoids many of the problems raised for each type of account, since they use dynamic semantics for the examples most amenable to a dynamic explanation and d-type pronouns for example most amenable to that sort of explanation. However, the theory comes at a considerable theoretical cost in that it predicts a systematic ambiguity in pronouns that is (arguably) not explicitly marked in any language. (See Elbourne 2005 for further criticisms of these views.)

3.4 The Context Dependent Quantifier Approach

The Context Dependent Quantifier, or CDQ, account of anaphora was suggested in Wilson (1984) and subsequently developed in King (1987, 1991, 1994).[30] The idea underlying the application of CDQ to discourse anaphora is that these expressions look like quantifier-like expressions of generality, where the precise nature of the generality they express is determined by features of the linguistic context in which they occur. On the CDQ account, anaphoric pronouns with quantifier antecedents in discourse anaphora are contextually sensitive devices of quantification. That is, these anaphoric pronouns express quantifications; and which quantifications they express is partly a function of the linguistic environments in which they are embedded. Consider the following discourses:

A man from Sweden climbed Mt. Everest alone. He used no oxygen.
Most students passed the exam. They didn’t get scores below 70%.

Looking at (51), suppose that in fact at least one Swede has soloed Mt. Everest without oxygen. Then it would seem that the sentences of (51) are true. If this is correct, then it appears that the second sentence of (51) expresses a (existentially) general claim. CDQ claims that the pronoun “He” in the second sentence is itself a (existential) quantifier, and this explains why the second sentence expresses a general claim: the generality is a result of the presence of this quantifier in the sentence. Similar remarks apply to (52), (except that “They” expresses a universal quantifier). Further, consider the following example, which is similar to our example (18) above:

A man killed Alan last night. Michelle believes he used a knife to kill him.

The second sentence of this discourse appears to have two different readings. On one reading, it asserts that concerning the man who killed Alan last night, Michelle believes of that very man that he used a knife. This would be the case if, for example, Michelle knew the man who killed Alan, believed that he killed Alan and based on his well-known fondness of knives, believed he used this sort of weapon. But the second sentence has another reading on which it ascribes to Michelle the general belief to the effect that a man killed Alan with a knife last night. On this reading the sentence would be true if e.g., on the basis of conversations with personnel at the hospital and having no particular person in mind, Michelle believed that a man fatally stabbed Alan last night.

Again, CDQ claims these facts are to be explained by holding that the pronoun in the second sentence is a quantifier. For then we should expect that, like other quantifiers, it could take wide or narrow scope relative to “Michelle believes”. On the wide scope reading of the pronoun/quantifier, the second sentence attributes to Michelle a belief regarding a particular person. On the narrow scope reading, it attributes to Michelle a general belief.

Occurrences of “ordinary quantifiers”, such as “every man” have what we might call a force, in this case universal; what we might call a restriction, in this case the set of men; and scope relative to other occurrences of quantifiers, verbs of propositional attitude, and so on. CDQ claims that the anaphoric pronouns in question also have forces (universal, existential, etc.), restrictions (“domains over which they quantify”) and scopes relative to each other, verbs of propositional attitude, etc. However, unlike “ordinary” quantifiers, these anaphoric pronouns qua quantifiers have their forces, restrictions and relative scopes determined by features of their linguistic environments. King (1994) lays out how the forces, restrictions and relative scopes of these anaphoric pronouns are determined, and we shall not describe those details here.

As to donkey anaphora, without going through the details, let me just say that CDQ assigns to a relative clause donkey sentence such as (26) above (repeated here)

Every woman who owns a donkey beats it.

truth conditions according to which (26) is true iff every woman who owns a donkey beats some donkey she owns (see King 2004 for details and discussion). Some think that the truth of (26) requires every woman who owns a donkey to beat every donkey she owns, and as we saw, DRT, DPL, and the D-type theories discussed assign these truth conditions to (26) (though this is not an essential feature of DRT or dynamic semantic approaches more generally). The truth conditions CDQ assigns to (26) correspond to what is often called the weak reading of donkey sentences (Chierchia (1995) calls this the \(\exists\)-reading) and the truth conditions the accounts discussed thus far correspond to the strong reading of donkey sentences (Chierchia calls this the \(\forall\)-reading). There actually has been a debate in the literature as to which truth conditions sentences like (26) have. There are sentences that are exactly like (26) except for the descriptive material in them that clearly seem to have (only) the weak reading. An example is:

Every person who had a credit card paid his bill with it.

It seems clear that the truth of this sentence does not require every person with a credit card to pay his bill with each credit card he has. We will discuss these matters further in section 4, but for now let us simply note that CDQ differs from the other accounts discussed on what truth conditions should be assigned to sentences like (26) and (54) and that it is simply unclear which truth conditions are the correct ones.

As for conditional donkey anaphora, the CDQ account is rather complicated and we are only able to provide the briefest outline of the account here (interested readers should consult King 2004). As we saw above, a conditional donkey sentence such as (25)

If Sarah owns a donkey, she beats it.

is true iff Sarah beats every donkey she owns. Thus, “a donkey” somehow seems to have ended up with universal force. The CDQ account holds that this illusion of universal force for the indefinite is really the result of the interaction of the semantics of the conditional, the indefinite, understood as an existential quantifier, and the CDQ “she”, understood as a context dependent quantifier with existential force ranging over donkeys Sarah owns. Roughly, the account goes as follows. The antecedent of (25) is equivalent to

\((\exists x)(x \mbox{ is a donkey} \mathbin{\&} \mbox{Sarah owns } x)\)

Given the CDQ “it” and its context in (25), the consequent of (25) is equivalent to

\((\exists x)(x \mbox{ is a donkey} \mathbin{\&} \mbox{Sarah owns } x \mathbin{\&} \mbox{Sarah beats } x)\)

The semantics of the conditional involves universal quantification over minimal situations. In particular, a conditional claims that for every minimal situation \(s_1\) in which its antecedent is true, there is a situation \(s_2\) that \(s_1\) is part of in which its consequent is true. In the case of (25), a minimal situation in which the antecedent is true consists of Sarah and a single donkey she owns. The final element here is that the definiteness and/or anaphoricness of the CDQ “it” in the consequent of (25) makes a difference to its truth conditions. The definiteness and anaphoricness of “it” in (25) induces a sort of “familiarity effect”.[31] In particular, for any (minimal) \(s_1\) in which the antecedent is true, there must be an \(s_2\) that \(s_1\) is part of in which the consequent (understood as expressing the claim that Sarah beats a donkey she owns) is true. But in addition, because of the “familiarity” condition induced by the anaphoric definite “it”, there must be a donkey in \(s_2\) that is also in \(s_1\) and that makes the consequent true. In other words, familiarity requires that a donkey that makes the CDQ-containing consequent true in \(s_2\) also be present in \(s_1\). In this sense, the donkey is “familiar”, having been introduced by the antecedent and the situation \(s_1\) in which it is true. To see what this means, consider a situation \(s_1\) that is a minimal situation in which the antecedent is true. \(s_1\) consists of Sarah owning a single donkey. If e.g., Sarah owns ten donkeys, there are ten such minimal situations. For (25) to be true, each such \(s_1\) must be part of a situation \(s_2\) such that \(s_2\) is a situation in which Sarah beats a donkey that she owns and that is in \(s_1\). Now the only way that every minimal \(s_1\) in which Sarah owns a donkey can be part of an \(s_2\) in which Sarah beats a donkey she owns in \(s_1\) is if Sarah beats every donkey she owns. Thus, the CDQ account claims that (25) is true iff Sarah beats every donkey she owns.

Turning now to difficulties with CDQ, a main difficulty is that it isn’t clear whether the use of the notion of familiarity in the account of conditional donkey sentences can be ultimately upheld. Recall that the idea was that because “it” is a definite NP, and because definite NPs generally are thought to involve some sort of familiarity, the pronoun in the donkey conditional induces a sort of familiarity effect. There are really two distinct problems here. One is that though the pronoun “it” is “syntactically” definite in that the pronoun “it” is thought to be a definite NP, according to CDQ it is “semantically” indefinite in (25), since it expresses an existential quantification (over donkeys owned by Sarah). But then if “it” really is semantically indefinite in (25), why should it induce familiarity effects at all? (Jason Stanley (p.c.) raised this difficulty). One might reply that it is the fact that “it” is “syntactically” definite that triggers the familiarity effects CDQ posits. But familiarity probably is not well enough understood to allow us to assess this response. A second, and perhaps more pressing, difficulty is this. Generally, familiarity has something to do with whether what an expression is being used to talk about is familiar or salient to the audience being addressed. This is vague, of course, but the idea is that if one says “The dog is hungry” to an audience who isn’t even aware of any dog that is around or relevant to the conversation, the remark is somewhat infelicitous. That is because the definite NP “The dog” was used to talk about something not familiar to the audience. Now the question is: is it plausible to claim that this and related phenomena are related to the rather complex effect CDQ claims is induced by the anaphoricness/definiteness of “it” in donkey conditionals? In the latter case, CDQ claims the effect of familiarity is to make the CDQ “it” in the consequent of donkey conditionals quantify over donkeys in the minimal situations introduced by the antecedents of the conditionals (in the case of (25), situations consisting of Sarah and a single donkey she owns). The CDQ can only quantify over “familiar” donkeys—those introduced by the antecedent. One may well wonder whether the effect CDQ posits here can really be seen to be a manifestation of phenomena that have traditionally been explained in terms of familiarity.

4. How Many Readings Do Donkey Sentences Have?

We have already mentioned that there is some disagreement regarding the truth conditions of sentences like

Every woman who owns a donkey beats it.

Some think that the truth of (26) requires every woman who owns a donkey to beat every donkey she owns. As mentioned above, this is called the strong reading of a donkey sentence. Others think that the truth of (26) requires that every donkey owning woman beats some donkey she owns. As above, this is the weak reading of (26). As we mentioned above, there are sentences that are exactly like (26) except for the descriptive material in them that clearly seem to have (only) the weak reading. The example we gave was:

Every person who had a credit card paid his bill with it.

It seems clear that the truth of this sentence does not require every person with a credit card to pay his bill with each credit card he has, but merely with some credit card he has. Our comments to this point have suggested that the debate with respect to (26)/(54) and weak vs. strong readings is over which one of the two sets of truth conditions (26)/(54) have. Each of the theories discussed in this entry only assign one of the existential or universal truth conditions to relative clause donkey sentences (though this may be more of an artifact of the specific implementations of the theories than the theories themselves).

But some think that (at least some) donkey sentences have both weak and strong readings. Chierchia (1994) and Kanazawa (1994b) are examples. In their favor, for a given determiner, one can find pairs of relative clause donkey sentences fronted by that determiner such that one has the existential truth conditions (on its most natural interpretation) and the other has the universal truth conditions (on its most natural reading). For example, consider the following pairs:

Weak Readings:
Every person who had a credit card paid his bill with it.
Most women who have a dime will put it in the meter.
No man with a teenage son lets him drive the car on the weekend.
Strong Readings:
Every student who borrowed a book from Peter eventually returned it.
Most parents who have a teenage son allow him to go out on the weekend.
No man with an umbrella leaves it home on a day like this.

Elbourne, for example, explicitly addresses this issue, since his semantics captures only the strong reading. He claims that while this may present a problem for his semantics, it is not a problem for NP-deletion theory more generally, since replacing the pronoun in a typical weak reading example with a minimal definite description also yields a weak reading, e.g.:

Everyone who has a dime put the dime in the meter. (Elbourne 2005: 84)

However, he doesn’t present an account of how this reading might be captured.

These examples and others suggest that whether a given relative clause donkey sentence appears to favor the strong reading or weak reading is influenced by a variety of factors, including the monotonicity properties of the determiner on the wide scope quantifier, the lexical semantics of the predicates occurring in the sentence, and general background assumptions concerning the situations in which we are to consider the truth or falsity of the sentences. However, it is very hard to find significant generalizations regarding under what conditions a given reading is favored.[32] Further, it is very hard to find sentences that clearly allow both a strong and a weak reading.[33] This makes the view that the sentences actually possess both readings as a matter of their semantics at least somewhat suspect. If they really do possess both readings, why is it so hard to find sentences that clearly allow both readings? And finally, relative clause donkey sentences fronted by the determiner “some” seem always to only have the existential truth conditions:

Some women who own a donkey beat it.

Obviously, the facts here are quite complicated.

Brasoveanu (2006, 2007, 2008) points out that there are also mixed readings of donkey sentences, such as:

Every person who buys a book on and has a credit card uses it to pay for it.

Sentence (59) intuitively is true iff for every book that a credit-card owner buys on, there is some credit card or other that she uses to pay for the book. Hence the mixed strong and weak reading. Brasoveanu accounts for these readings, along with the weak/strong ambiguity in general, within his system of Plural Compositional Discourse Representation Theory (PCDRT) by positing an ambiguity at the level of indefinites. In his account, indefinites are underspecified as to the presence of a maximization operator (which is present in the strong indefinite but not the weak); the decision of which indefinite to use in a specific case is a “context-driven online process”.

Theories that assign both sets of truth conditions to relative clause donkey sentences generally do so by positing some sort of ambiguity, either in the quantifiers, the pronouns, or the indefinites.[34] Though the matter isn’t entirely clear, it seems plausible that the theories discussed in this entry also may be able to assign both the universal and the existential truth conditions to relative clause donkey sentences by positing some sort of ambiguity. These matters require further investigation.[35]

A recent theory that does not rely on any ambiguity is presented in Champollion, Bumford & Henderson (2019). Champollion et al. argue for a trivalent semantics that allows for truth-value gaps for donkey sentences, along with a pragmatic theory that both fills in the gaps and predicts when hearers get a strong or weak interpretation. This explains the different readings of donkey sentences in terms of underspecification rather than ambiguity. The (dynamic) semantics delivers that a sentence like (26) is true iff every female donkey-owner beats every donkey she owns, false if at least one female donkey-owner does not beat any donkey she owns, and otherwise neither true nor false. Relying on Križ (2016)'s framework for plural definites, speakers can use a sentence to address the question under discussion (QUD) that is true enough at a world w even if it lacks a truth value at w, so long as it is not false at any world equivalent to w. If the QUD is such that it requires that every female donkey-owner beat every donkey she owns, then worlds in which (say) some female donkey-owners who own multiple donkeys only beat one of their donkeys will be equivalent to worlds in which some female donkey owners do not beat any of their donkeys. However, if the QUD is such that it requires that every female donkey-owner beat some donkey she owns, such worlds will be equivalent for conversational purposes to worlds in which each female donkey-owner beats all the donkeys she owns, and thus speakers will judge the weak reading true in this scenario.

5. Anaphora in Sign Language

Another recent development in the study of anaphora comes from a series of papers by Philippe Schlenker on anaphora in sign language, particularly ASL (American Sign Language) and LSF (French Sign Language) (2010, 2011, 2012a,b, 2013a,b, 2014, 2015). In sign language, an antecedent is associated with a particular position in signing space called a locus, and an anaphoric link to the antecedent is obtained by pointing at that same locus. Unlike spoken languages, which have a limited number of lexically encoded pronouns, in sign language there seems to be no upper bound on how many loci can simultaneously be used, aside from limitations of performance (since signers have to remember what the loci are assigned to, and be able to distinguish one from another). Schlenker (2015) gives an example of a short discourse that involves 7 distinct loci. Given their unbounded number and their overt connection to antecedents, Schlenker (as well as others) posits that they are the overt realization of formal indices, i.e., the variables that mark anaphoric connections in theories like DRT and dynamic semantics. Despite their differences, sign language and spoken language pronouns have enough in common that a uniform theory is desirable, and Schlenker argues that sign language provides evidence applicable to at least two debates in the anaphora literature. First, there is good evidence that in sign language, there is a single system of anaphora using loci for denoting individuals, times, and worlds. This provides evidence in favor of those who think that there are temporal and modal variables and pronouns in spoken language. Second, Schlenker argues that the use of loci, which look like an overt use of indices, very much resembles the dynamic semantic account of pronominal anaphora since antecedents introduce variables (loci) and anaphoric connections are made by repeating the same variables (loci). Just as in spoken language, this occurs even when the anaphoric pronouns are outside the syntactic scope of their antecedents. Furthermore, according to Schlenker one of the most decisive examples is the bishop example (50), repeated here:

If a bishop meets a bishop, he blesses him.

In sign language, the only way to obtain the intended reading of the sentence is for the pronouns to index different antecedents. This shows that a theory need not only get the truth conditions right (as some D-type theories can), but must account for the formal link between each antecedent and pronoun. For criticism of the thesis that loci are overt variables see Kuhn (2016).

The second major conclusion from Schlenker’s research is that sign language pronouns have an iconic element. For example, the verb “ask” is signed near the chin/neck area of a locus. If the locus denotes a person standing on a branch, “ask” is signed at a fairly high spot in the locus. If the locus denotes a person hanging upside-down from a branch, “ask” is signed lower in the locus. This and many other examples of iconicity in pronouns provides evidence that there needs to be an account of iconicity integrated into the formal semantics.


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