First published Wed Aug 22, 2007; substantive revision Mon Nov 11, 2019

Anaxagoras of Clazomenae (a major Greek city of Ionian Asia Minor), a Greek philosopher of the 5th century B.C.E. (born ca. 500–480), was the first of the Presocratic philosophers to live in Athens. He propounded a physical theory of “everything-in-everything,” and claimed that nous (intellect or mind) was the motive cause of the cosmos. He was the first to give a correct explanation of eclipses, and was both famous and notorious for his scientific theories, including the claims that the sun is a mass of red-hot metal, that the moon is earthy, and that the stars are fiery stones. Anaxagoras maintained that the original state of the cosmos was a mixture of all its ingredients (the basic realities of his system). The ingredients are thoroughly mixed, so that no individual ingredient as such is evident, but the mixture is not entirely uniform or homogeneous. Although every ingredient is ubiquitous, some ingredients are present in higher concentrations than others, and these proportions may also vary from place to place (even if they do not do so in the original state of the cosmos). The mixture is unlimited in extent, and at some point in time it is set into motion by the action of nous (intellect). The mixture begins to rotate around some small point within it, and as the whirling motion proceeds and expands through the mass, the ingredients in the mixture are shifted and separated out (in terms of relative density) and remixed with each other, ultimately producing the cosmos of apparently separate material masses and material objects, with the different properties, that we perceive.

1. Life and Work

Anaxagoras, son of Hegesibulus (or Eubulus), was a native of Clazomenae, on the west coast of what is now Turkey. According to Diogenes Laertius (see the article on Doxography of Ancient Philosophy) (Diels-Kranz [DK] 59 A1), Anaxagoras came from an aristocratic and landed family, but abandoned his inheritance to study philosophy. (We do not know how he acquired his philosophical learning). He came to Athens (perhaps about the middle of the 5th century, perhaps earlier), and was a friend and protégé of Pericles, the Athenian general and political leader. There is controversy about his time in Athens; Diogenes Laertius says that he came to Athens to study philosophy as a young man. Some scholars claim that his arrival was as early as the Persian invasion of 480 (O’Brien 1968, Woodbury 1981, Graham 2006), others argue for a later date of about 456 (Mansfeld 1979, see also Mansfeld 2011 on Aristotle’s evidence; there is a good discussion of the problems about dating Anaxagoras’ life in Sider 2005). It is clear from their dramas that his work was known to Sophocles, Euripides, and perhaps Aeschylus (Seneca suggests in his Natural Questions 4a.2.17 that they shared Anaxagoras’ view about the source of the Nile); it was certainly familiar to the comic playwright Aristophanes (Curd 2007, Sider 2005; see Mansfeld 1979). He was a resident in the city for at least twenty years; he was said to have been charged with impiety (and perhaps with Medism, political sympathy with the Persians), and banished from the city (437/6?). The charges against Anaxagoras may have been as much political as religious, because of his close association with Pericles. He retreated to Lampsacus (in the eastern Hellespont) where he died; ancient reports say that he was much honored there before and after his death. Democritus, a younger contemporary, dated his own life in relation to Anaxagoras’, saying that he was young in the old age of Anaxagoras (DK59A5); he reportedly accused Anaxagoras of plagiarism. Although Anaxagoras lived in Athens when Socrates was a youth and young adult, there are no reports that Anaxagoras and Socrates ever met. In Plato’s Phaedo, Socrates says that he heard someone reading from Anaxagoras’ book (probably Archelaus, who was, according to Diogenes Laertius, pupil of Anaxagoras and teacher of Socrates). Anaxagoras is included in the ancient lists of those who wrote only one book: in the Apology, Socrates reports that it could be bought for a drachma.

As with all the Presocratics, Anaxagoras’ work survives only in fragments quoted by later philosophers and commentators; we also have testimonia about his views in many ancient sources. The standard collection of Presocratic texts (both fragments and testimonia) is H. Diels and W. Kranz, Die Fragmente der Vorsokratiker, in which Anaxagoras is given the identifying number 59. The Greek text and translations can also be found in Gemelli-Marciano, 2007–2010; Graham, 2010; and Laks and Most, 2016a and 2016b. (For discussion of the sources for the Presocratics, and problems associated with them, see the article on Presocratic Philosophy.) Any discussion of Anaxagoras’ views must be a reconstruction that goes beyond the few details that we have in the verbatim quotations, though informed by the evidence of the fragments and testimonia. It should be kept in mind in reading the following account that scholars disagree and that other interpretations are possible.

According to Simplicius, a 6th century C.E. neo-Platonist commentator on Aristotle, and our main source for the fragments, Anaxagoras began his book by describing an original state of complete (but not entirely uniform) mixture of all the ingredients of the cosmos; that mixture is then set in motion by the action of Mind/Intellect (nous). The ingredients are eternal and always remain in a mixture of all with all, yet the rotary motion produces shifts in the proportions of the ingredients in a given region. The expanding rotation of the original mixture ultimately produces the continuing development of the world as we now perceive it. The foundations of his theory, descriptions of this development, and a discussion of nous form the bulk of what remains to us of Anaxagoras’ book. The testimonia suggest that the book also included detailed accounts of astronomical, meteorological, and geological phenomena as well as more detailed discussions of perception and knowledge, now missing from our collection of fragments, and known only by later reports and criticisms.

2. Metaphysical Principles

Anaxagoras was influenced by two strains in early Greek thought. First, there is the tradition of inquiry into nature founded by the Milesians, and carried on by Xenophanes (Mourelatos 2008b) and by Heraclitus (Graham 2008). The early Milesian scientist-philosophers (Thales, Anaximander, Anaximenes) sought to explain the cosmos and all its phenomena, by appealing to regularities within the cosmic system itself, without reference to extra-natural causes or to the personified gods associated with aspects of nature by traditional Greek religion (Graham 2006, Gregory 2007 and 2013). They based their explanations on the observed regular behavior of the materials that make up the cosmos (see White 2008 on the role of observation and measurement in early Presocratic theories).

Second, there is the influence of Eleatic arguments, due to Parmenides, concerning the metaphysical requirements for a basic explanatory entity within this Milesian framework, and the metaphysically proper way to go about inquiry (Curd, 2004, 2007; Sisko 2003; for different views, see Palmer 2009, Sisko 2013). Parmenides can be seen as arguing that any acceptable cosmological account must be rational, i.e., in conformity with the canons for proper inquiry, and must begin with metaphysically acceptable entities that are wholly and completely what they are; are not subject to generation, destruction, or alteration; and are wholly knowable i.e., graspable by thought and understanding (Parmenides B2, B3, B7, B8; see Mourelatos 2008a). Anaxagoras bases his account of the natural world on three principles of metaphysics, all of which can be seen as grounded in these Eleatic requirements: No Becoming or Passing-Away, Everything is in Everything, and No Smallest or Largest.

2.1 No Becoming or Passing-Away

A fundamental tenet of Eleatic theory is that what-is-not cannot be (Parmenides DK 28 B2). Parmenides, using this claim (see DK 28 B8.15–16), argued that coming-to-be and passing-away are therefore ruled out, because genuine coming-to-be is change from what-is-not to what-is, while destruction is change from what-is to what-is-not. Thus, says Parmenides, what-is “is without start or stop, since coming to be and passing away have wandered very far away, and true trust drove them out” (DK 28 B8.27–28).[1] Anaxagoras accepts this principle, explaining apparent generation and destruction by replacing them with mixture and separation (or dissociation) of ingredients:

The Greeks do not think correctly about coming-to-be and passing-away; for no thing comes to be or passes away, but is mixed together and dissociated from the things that are. And thus they would be correct to call coming-to-be being mixed together and passing-away being dissociated. (DK 59 B17)

What seems to us, through perception, to be generation of new entities or destruction of old ones is not that at all. Rather, objects that appear to us to be born, to grow, and to die, are merely arrangements and re-arrangements of more metaphysically basic ingredients. The mechanism for the apparent coming-to-be is mixing and separating out from the mixture produced by the vortex motion of the ingredients. Through that mechanism, the real things, the ingredients, can retain their character throughout. When an arrangement breaks apart (or “passes away”) the ingredients are dissociated from one another (through separation) and can be re-mixed to form (or “become”) different arrangements, i.e., other perceptible objects.

One way to think of Anaxagoras’ point in B17 is that animals, plants, human beings, the heavenly bodies, and so on, are natural constructs. They are constructs because they depend for their existence and character on the ingredients of which they are constructed (and the pattern or structure that they acquire in the process). Yet they are natural because their construction occurs as one of the processes of nature. Unlike human-made artifacts (which are similarly constructs of ingredients), they are not teleologically determined to fulfill some purpose. This gives Anaxagoras a two-level metaphysics. Things such as earth, water, fire, hot, bitter, dark, bone, flesh, stone, or wood are metaphysically basic and genuinely real (in the required Eleatic sense): they are things-that-are. The objects constituted by these ingredients are not genuinely real, they are temporary mixtures with no autonomous metaphysical status: they are not things-that-are. (The natures of the ingredients, and the question of what is included as an ingredient, are addressed below; see 3.2 “Ingredients and Seeds”). This view, that the ingredients are more real than the objects that they make up, is common in Presocratic philosophy, especially in the theories of those thinkers who were influenced by Parmenides’ arguments against the possibility of what-is-not and so against genuine coming-to-be and passing-away. It can be found in Empedocles, and in the pre-Platonic atomists, as well as, perhaps, in Plato’s middle period Theory of Forms (Denyer, 1983, Frede 1985, W.-R. Mann 2000, Silverman 2002).

2.2 Everything-in-Everything

“All things were together.” B1 (in part)

“In everything there is a share of everything.” B11 (in part)

As we have seen, Anaxagoras’ commitment to Eleatic principles rules out the possibility of genuine coming-to-be or passing-away. It also rules out real qualitative changes and transformations. When a warm liquid cools (it seems) the hot liquid becomes cold; when a child ingests food (milk and bread, for instance), the milk and bread are (it seems) transformed into flesh, blood, and bone. Yet Anaxagoras objects to these claims because they entail that the hot ceases to be, and the cold comes to be, in the liquid, and that the bread and milk are destroyed while flesh, blood, and bone come to be. His solution is to claim not only that “all things were together” in the original mixture, but that everything is in everything at all times. If there is already blood and bone in the milk and bread, then the growth of the child can be attributed to the accumulation of these ingredients from the bread and milk, and their assimilation into the substance of the child’s body, rather than to the transformation of bread and milk into something else. Further, if there are both hot and cold in the liquid, there is no disappearance into nothing of the hot as the liquid cools, and no generation of the cold from what is not (or even from what is not cold). The clearest statement of this is in Anaxagoras B10, a quotation found in the following passage:

When Anaxagoras discovered the old belief that nothing comes from that which is not in any way whatsoever, he did away with coming-to-be, and introduced dissociation in place of coming-to-be. For he foolishly said that all things are mixed with each other, but that as they grow they are dissociated. For in the same seminal fluid there are hair, nails, veins and arteries, sinew, and bone, and it happens that they are imperceptible because of the smallness of the parts, but when they grow, they gradually are separated off. “For how,” he says, “can hair come from what is not hair, and flesh from what is not flesh?” He maintained this, not only about bodies, but also about colors. For he said that black is in white and white in black. And he laid down the same thing with respect to weights, believing that light is mixed with heavy and vice versa. (DK 59 B10; the passage is from the anonymous scholiast on a 4th c. C.E. work of Gregory of Nazianzus.[2])

Although interpreters both ancient (including this scholiast and Simplicius) and modern (Guthrie 1965 is a good example) have seen the desire to explain nutrition and growth as the primary motivation for adopting the Everything-in-Everything principle, it is more likely that Anaxagoras’ adoption of the general metaphysical principle of No-Becoming leads him to claim that everything is in everything (Schofield 1981, Curd 2007). Nutrition and growth are simply particularly clear instances of the changes that are ruled out as fundamentally real if there is no becoming.

The Everything-in-Everything principle asserts the omnipresence of ingredients. In everything there is a mixture of all the ingredients that there are: every ingredient is everywhere at all times. This principle is a fundamental tenet of Anaxagoras’ theory, and leads to difficulties of interpretation (see, for instance, the debate between Mathews 2002 and 2005 and Sisko 2005). If everything is in everything, there must be interpenetration of ingredients, for it must be possible for there to be many ingredients in the same space. Indeed, the principle requires that all ingredients be in every space at all times (the No Smallest or Largest principle also plays a role here: see sect. 2.3). This will allow any ingredient to emerge from a mixture through accumulation (or, having been unmixed, to become submerged in one) at any point at any time, and thus allow for the appearance of coming-to-be (or passing-away) of things or qualities.

Some scholars have supposed that Anaxagoras thought of these ingredients as very small particles (Vlastos 1950, Guthrie 1965, Sider 2005, Lewis 2000). But a particle would have to be a smallest amount of some type of ingredient, occupying some space all by itself—with no other type of ingredient in it. Not only does the No Smallest or Largest principle rule this out (see sect. 2.3), but the particulate interpretation seems inconsistent with the Everything-in-Everything principle. It is crucial to Anaxagoras’ theory that there be (in actuality) no such pure bits or volumes of any type of ingredient.

Instead one might conceive of the ingredients as fluid, like pastes or liquids which can be smeared together, with different areas of the mixture characterized by different relative densities of the ingredients, all of which are nevertheless everywhere in it. Each genuinely real ingredient could be mixed with every other, and so would be contained in any area of the mixture, and in principle visibly recoverable from it by accumulation or increased concentration. The differing densities of the ingredients would allow for differences in the phenomenal character of the mixture. To an observer, different areas would appear hotter or colder, sweeter or more bitter, more red than green, and so on, and rightly so. As the relative concentration of ingredients in any area of the mixture altered (through the mixture and separation brought about by the rotation of the original blend of ingredients), the phenomenal character of that region of the mixture would alter. An intriguing account (Marmodoro 2015, 2017) suggests that Anaxagorean ingredients are not material; rather they are primitive physical qualitative powers or dispositions (in the parlance of contemporary metaphysics, they are “gunky”).

2.3 No Smallest or Largest

B1’s claim that “all things were together” before the original rotation occurred does not guarantee the truth of the Everything-in-Everything principle. If separation occurs within an original mixture of everything with everything, as a result of the motion imparted by nous, then it could be that, given enough time, ingredients would be segregated from one another (as they are in Empedocles during the triumph of Strife, when the four roots are completely separated). Anaxagoras needs to block this, so that he can maintain his commitment to the No Becoming principle. In some region that came by separation to contain, say, nothing but bone, there would come to be pure bone (as a new entity), in replacement for and destruction of the mixture that was previously there. He blocks this possibility by claiming that there is no smallest (and no largest). If there is no lower limit on the density of an ingredient, then no ingredient will be completely removed from any region of the mixture through the force of the rotary motion caused by nous. Here are Anaxagoras’ claims:

Nor of the small is there a smallest, but always a smaller (for what-is cannot not be) — but also of the large there is always a larger. And [the large] is equal to the small in extent (plêthos), but in relation to itself each thing is both large and small. (B3[3])

Since the shares of the large and the small are equal in number, in this way too, all things will be in everything; nor is it possible that [anything] be separate, but all things have a share of everything. Since it is not possible that there is a least, it would not be possible that [anything] be separated, nor come to be by itself, but just as in the beginning, now too all things are together. (B6 [in part])

The passage from B6 makes clear that the “no smallest” principle is connected to the principle of Everything-in-Everything, and B3 asserts that the “no smallest” claim depends on the impossibility of what-is-not. Here is one way to interpret what Anaxagoras is saying: if there were a smallest (particle, density, amount) of any ingredient (call it S), we could in principle through separation reduce the amount of S in some area of the mixture to that smallest, and then induce further separation through rotation, which would remove that ingredient from a particular area of the mixture. That would leave some area without “everything in everything.” The area would cease to be S to any degree and so would be not-S. In that area, the explanation of coming-to-be in terms of emergence from a previous mixture would fail. Note that Anaxagoras — like other Greek thinkers, including Plato — assumes that anything that is must be something or other and so slides easily between “what is not f” and “what is not” (Furley 2002).

Anaxagoras’ solution is to deny that there is any lower limit on smallness. Adopting the model of density described above, he can say that there is no lowest degree of density in the mixture. This emphasis on density makes it clear that Anaxagoras’ technical sense of smallness is not one of particle size but of degree of submergence or emergence in the mixture. For an ingredient to be small is for there to be a comparatively low density of that ingredient in a particular area of the mixture in comparison with all the other ingredients (everything else) in that area. The corresponding assertion that there is no upper limit on largeness can then be interpreted as the claim that no matter how emergent from the mixture (standing out from the background mixture) an ingredient is, it can become still more emergent. So, no matter how sweet some water tastes, there is still some salt in it. The salt in the sample is small, i.e., submerged in the mixture of water and other ingredients, but there will never cease to be salt in the sample. Correspondingly, no matter how salty another sample is, it can always become more salty and even “turn to salt” because there is no upper limit to the degree of emergence from the background. As the salt emerges, other ingredients will submerge, but will never disappear, so that the wet itself is deeply submerged in the mix, and we are left with an apparently solid block of salt (though that salt will itself contain all other ingredients, with most of them in such small concentrations that they are completely submerged and not apparent to an observer). This account of large and small is implied in Schofield 1980, and worked out more fully in Inwood 1986 and Furth 1991; it is accepted in Curd 2007; see also Marmodoro 2017.

3. The Physical Principles

The Eleatic metaphysics that Anaxagoras accepts shapes the science that he proposes. Anaxagoras offers an ambitious scientific theory that attempts to explain the workings of the cosmos, even while accepting the Eleatic ban on coming-to-be and passing-away. His goal is scientific knowledge, i.e., understanding, as far as that is possible for human beings.

3.1 Mixture and Rotation

The original state of the cosmos was an unlimited (apeiron) mixture of all the ingredients. The mixture of ingredients, all with all, exists eternally. Up to some point in the past, it was motionless (59 B1, A45), and it was everywhere undifferentiated, or almost so. According to B1, which Simplicius, the source for the fragment, says was near the beginning of Anaxagoras’ book:

All things were together, unlimited both in amount and in smallness, for the small, too, was unlimited. And because all things were together, nothing was evident on account of smallness; for air and aether covered all things, both being unlimited, for these are the greatest among all things both in amount and in largeness.

This undifferentiated mass includes all there is of all the natural ingredients that there are, the ingredients that will eventually form the natural constructs that constitute the cosmos as we know it. Nothing is ever added to or subtracted from this storehouse of stuffs, although the mass of stuffs is not always homogeneous. In fact, there are different densities of ingredients even at this earliest (pre-motion) stage. B1 makes clear that air (dark, moist stuff) and aether (bright fiery stuff) are the most emergent (largest) ingredients, and their dominance means that the original mixture must have been like a dense bright cloud: nothing else would be evident or manifest, even had there been an observer. At some point nous (the time being right) set the mixture in motion and caused it to begin to revolve (first in a small area, and then in an ever-widening area). The rotary motion causes the ingredients in the mass to shift. This shifting produces what Anaxagoras calls “separating off.” Because the mass is a plenum, any separation will be a rearrangement (thus a mixing) of ingredients. The continouous ever-expanding rotation produces more and more separation. The Everything-in-Everything principle continues to hold, so there are all ingredients at all places at all times, but the different densities of ingredients allow for local variations, and so the rotating mass becomes qualitatively differentiated.

3.2 Ingredients and Seeds

Nowhere in the extant fragments does Anaxagoras give a complete list of the ingredients in the mixture, or a clear indication of their scope, so it is up to commentators to figure out what he meant, given the available evidence. There are three alternatives. First, some scholars have held that Anaxagoras limited the basic ingredients to the opposites, such as hot and cold, wet and dry, sweet and bitter, dark and light, and so on. It is the opposites that have explanatory force in the theory, and all other things and properties are reducible to the opposites. Supporters of this view include Tannery 1886, Burnet 1930, Cornford 1930, Vlastos 1950, Schofield 1980 (with reservations), Inwood 1986, Spanu 1987–88, Sedley 2007, and Marmodoro 2015, 2017. On this view all the material stuffs and all the objects in the universe would be natural constructs. At the opposite extreme, a second option accepts that literally everything in the natural world is in the original mixture — opposites, but also natural materials (fire, earth, copper, iron, and the like), animals and plants (and their parts such as flesh, blood, and bone), and so on. This view makes no distinction between ingredients and what have been called natural constructs above. It can be found in Strang 1963, Stokes 1965, Guthrie 1965, Barnes 1982, Furth 1991, Graham 1994 and 2004, Lewis 2000. Finally, there is a middle view, which rejects the opposites-only account, and accepts that some things (plants and animals, heavenly bodies) are natural constructs. The original mix includes opposites, but also natural substances like metals and earth, and the ingredients of animals, such as flesh, blood, and bone, but no whole physical objects such as plants and animals themselves, or their organic parts such as legs and hearts (Curd 2007; this view is suggested in Schofield 1980, 132 ff.).

The “opposites only” view cannot stand (arguments against it are given in Guthrie 1965 and Graham 2004). B15 may provide some evidence for the view:

The dense and the wet and the cold and the dark came together here, where <the> earth is now; but the rare and the hot and the dry <and the bright> moved out to the far reaches of the aether.

But Anaxagoras’ own lists include more than the opposites (see B4a and B4b). Further, the Principle of Predominance (in B12, see sect. 3.4) would seem to require more than opposites, since it does not seem to say that each thing is reducible to opposite characteristics that predominate, but that each thing gets its character from the particular material ingredients that predominate in it. Further evidence against the opposites-only view is found in Aristotle. Aristotle claims that for Anaxagoras, the elements (the basic realities) are what Aristotle calls the homoiomerous parts (On Coming to Be and Passing Away I.1 314a18). These are (for Aristotle) things that are literally “like-parted,” i.e., they are homogeneous all the way through, like a piece of pure gold, rather than being different in their different parts (like a hand), and Aristotle lists flesh, blood, bone, and adds “and the others of which the part is called by the same name [as the whole].” The term homoiomeries is Aristotelian, and has no role to play in Anaxagoras (Graham 1994, Curd 2007; contra: Sisko 2009), but it is clear that for Aristotle, the ingredients in an Anaxagorean mixture are not just the opposites.

If the attempt to reduce the Anaxagorean ingredients to opposites is unsuccessful, so, too, is the interpretation that allows as an ingredient every kind of thing in the phenomenal world. A minor point is that Anaxagoras surely does not think that artifacts made by human beings are part of the mixture, and there are other semi-natural artifacts as well that would not seem to be present: cheese, bronze, whiskey, for example. More importantly, the wide-scope view fails to take seriously B17’s replacement of coming-to-be and passing-away with mixture and dissolution. Further, it is unclear how the view can discriminate between an individual and its parts or ingredients. Are there homunculi of individuals in the original mix? (Lewis 2000 accepts this.) If so, how can the theory explain that the growth of an organism is not simply its enlargement (by adding ingredients) but also its development? (A plant’s leaves may grow larger, but its seed pods develop, and are not just an enlargement of a structure that was already present in the seedling plant.) In B4a Anaxagoras refers to the animals and humans “that have been compounded, as many as have soul,” and this suggests that B17’s implicit model of living things as natural constructs mixed together from the ingredients that are genuinely real must be taken seriously.

It seems, then, best to interpret Anaxagoras as claiming that all the material ingredients of natural living things and the heavenly bodies are present in the original mix, but that these objects themselves are not among the ingredients but are natural constructions, produced by the processes of mixture and separation that we call nutrition and growth, or by the rotations of the heavens and the attendant clumping together and breaking apart of the ingredients of the stars, clouds, comets, planets, and so on.

A problem for any account of the original mixture is Anaxagoras’ mention of seeds. The word for seeds (spermata) occurs twice in the fragments, in lists of ingredients (in B4a and in B4b), but Anaxagoras nowhere explains or makes it clear what it means. There are a number of options: seeds have been taken to be the smallest possible bits of ingredients (but, as argued above, there are no smallest bits in Anaxagoras’ system), or to be extremely small homunculi-like ingredients that some interpretations take to be origins for Anaxagoras of living things which then expand by the addition of other ingredients (Lewis 2000). Furley 1976 and 2002 advocates the simplest interpretation, that Anaxagoras simply means biological seeds (but not homunculi), and this seems the best proposal (see also Barnes 1982, Curd 2007, Sedley 2007, Marmodoro 2015, 2017, 147–153; Marmodoro also sees seeds as biological, containing pre-existing structures). A seed would then be a biological origin point, and might perhaps be the route through which nous (which controls all things that have soul, i.e., anything alive) enters a living thing. If a seed is mixed with the right ingredients in the right circumstances, a living thing will grow.

3.3 Mind/Intellect

According to Diogenes Laertius, Anaxagoras acquired the nickname Mr. Mind (DK 59 A1); his view that the cosmos is controlled by nous, mind or intelligence, first attracted and then disappointed Socrates (Plato, Phaedo 97b8ff.). Plato and Aristotle applauded Anaxagoras for using nous as the first principle of motion, but both criticized him for failing to be consistent in that use, arguing that once he invoked Mind to set the original mixture in motion, Anaxagoras reduced later causes to mindless mechanism.

Anaxagoras is adamant that nous is completely different from the ingredients that constituted the original mixture. It is the only thing to which the Everything-in-Everything principle does not apply. Mind is present to some things, but it is not an ingredient or share as flesh and blood are ingredients in a dog (B11: “In everything there is a share of everything except nous, but there are some things in which nous, too, is present”). In B12 (the longest extant fragment), Anaxagoras claims that if nous were just another ingredient it could neither know nor rule in the way that it does.

The other things have a share of everything, but nous is unlimited and self-ruling and has been mixed with no thing, but is alone itself by itself. For if it were not by itself, but had been mixed with anything else, then it would partake of all things, if it had been mixed with anything (for there is a share of everything in everything just as I have said before); and the things mixed together with it would thwart it, so that it would control none of the things in the way that it in fact does, being alone by itself. For it is the finest of all things and the purest, and indeed it maintains all discernment about everything and has the greatest strength. (59 B12, in part)

Mind/Intellect plays a number of roles in Anaxagoras’ system. First, it inaugurates the rotation of the mass of ingredients; it then controls that rotation, and the local rotations that take place within the large whirl that is the whole cosmos:

Nous controlled the whole revolution, so that it started to revolve in the beginning. First it began to revolve from a small region, but it is revolving yet more, and it will revolve still more… And whatever sorts of things were going to be, and whatever sorts were and now are not, and as many as are now and whatever sorts will be, all these nous set in order. And nous also ordered this revolution, in which the things being separated off now revolve, the stars and the sun and the moon and the air and the aether. This revolution caused them to separate off. (59 B12, in part)

Nous then is not only first cause, it also, one might say, is the preserver of order in the cosmos, as it maintains the rotations that govern all the natural processes. Anaxagoras does not explain how these processes work, or how nous can affect the ingredients. But there is a hint of his reasoning in a comment in Aristotle (Metaphysics I.3.984b15):

When someone said that nous is present — in nature just as it is in animals — as the cause of the cosmos and of all its order, he appeared as a sober man among the random chatterers who preceded him. (We know that Anaxagoras clearly held these views, but Hermotimus of Clazomenae gets the credit for holding them earlier.)

Just as we control our bodies by our thoughts, so the cosmos is controlled by nous; we may be unclear about the details, but the results are obvious to us. One fundamental point about Anaxagoras’ theory of mind is that he nowhere in the extant material identifies mind with a divine principle or god. In fragment 1018 and in Trojan Women (886), Euripides says that mind is god in each of us, and connects the necessity of the universe with Zeus and mind, and these claims are thought to have been influenced by Anaxagoras’ views. Although later testimonial reports in Aëtius and Iamblichus say that Anaxagoras connected nous and god, there are many more reports of his denial of divinity to the heavenly bodies and his alleged atheism.

Nous is the most powerful thing in the cosmos, controlling the rotation and all ensouled things. Part of that power and control lies in its powers of knowledge. Anaxagoras asserts that nous has all judgment and discernment about all things; moreover, this knowledge extends to everything that emerges from the mixtures and dissociations caused by the original rotation:

And nous discerned them all: the things that are being mixed together, the things that are being separated off, and the things that are being dissociated. And whatever sorts of things were going to be, and whatever sorts were and now are not, and as many as are now and whatever sorts will be, all these nous set in order. (B12, in part)

This suggests a beginning of an answer to the objections lodged against Anaxagoras’ use of nous as a cause. While nous is not the teleological and ethical cause for which Socrates was searching in the Phaedo, nous could serve as an ultimate explanation. Anaxagoras nowhere says that nous arranges things in a certain way because it is best for them to be so, or even suggests something like an Aristotelian final cause, (although Sedley 2007 argues that exactly this view is implicit in the fragments, contra: Graham, 2009, Sisko 2010a). Things are the way they are because that is the way things have unfolded since nous first set everything in motion, and as it continued to move them. (One might compare this to the role of the unmoved mover as the ultimate cause in Aristotle’s universe; despite being the first cause the unmoved mover does not create.)

Anaxagoras links mind and soul in B12: “nous has control over all things that have soul, both the larger and the smaller.” This suggests not only that Anaxagoras took the actions of humans and animals as the model for how nous controls the cosmos, but also suggests how nous differs from the other ingredients. He claims that it is the purest and finest of all things. Some scholars argue that it is only in Plato that we meet a genuine notion of the immaterial (Renehan 1980, Sedley 2007), but Anaxagoras’ denial that nous is mixed with or partakes of other ingredients (while still being in some of them) and his insistence on its fineness and purity may suggest that he is thinking of mind as a non-corporeal entity that can pervade and control a body or even the whole cosmos without being a material part of it (Curd 2009). On either interpretation, if nous were simply an ordinary ingredient on a par with the other basic ingredients, then, as Anaxagoras notes in B12, its relative smallness would allow it to be swamped and overcome (“thwarted”) by the other ingredients.

3.4 The Principle of Predominance

Fragment B12 ends with a further discussion of mixture and separation, and Anaxagoras’ enunciation of what has come to be called the “Principle of Predominance.” After reasserting that no ingredient is ever fully dissociated or separated from any other (except for nous, which is not an ingredient), Anaxagoras adds that all nous is alike (that is, cosmic nous and mind in us share the same nature), but “Nothing else is like anything else, but each one is and was most manifestly those things of which there are the most in it.” Thus, something is hot, if hot predominates over the cold in it, flesh if flesh predominates over other ingredients, and so on. The principle does not claim that there is any single predominating ingredient at each place in the mixture. Rather, the predominance seems to be along numerous lines of possibility: more flesh than blood, more hot than cold, more red than green, and so on (Furley 2002). This need not mean that there is more humanity than doghood in a human being (indeed it could not mean this, on the account advanced in this article, which rules out dogs and humans as Anaxagorean ingredients). Rather, to be a human being is to have a certain set of predominant characteristics arranged in a certain way (that arrangement may be the work of soul — perhaps nous — in a living thing).

A problem for the Principle of Predominance is to determine what it is to be a predominant ingredient, especially given the Everything-in-Everything and No Smallest principles. A classic example is the following: the gold in this gold ring is that discontinuous part of the total mixture in which gold predominates. But now, as Strang says, “Consider the gold which predominates as an ingredient: does it also, like the original piece of gold, contain within it an admixture of all other substances? If so, it is gold because gold predominates in it as an ingredient; and we can ask the same question about the ingredient of the ingredient, and so on ad infinitum” (Strang 1963, 101; see also Cornford 1930). Because there can be no pure gold (there is no pure anything), it becomes difficult to see what the gold could be that predominates in anything. But if I cannot determine what predominates in it, I cannot determine what anything is.

Strang 1963 proposes a solution to the problem. While acknowledging that there can never be pure instances of any ingredient in actuality, there could be such instances in analysis. I can analyze mixtures and determine predominant ingredients, but I will never be able to produce a pure instance of such an ingredient. The problem here is how this would be worked out, and why I can be certain that there are such natures (as we might call them). Anaxagoras suggests two things. First, in B12 he stresses that nous has the power to know and understand all the ingredients (indeed cosmic nous apparently knew all this before the rotation began; see quotation above). Second, in B21 and B21a he suggests how human nous (nous in us) can come to such an understanding by relying on sense perception but moving beyond it in thought (see sect. 5. Knowledge). Finally, because the ingredients are genuinely basic entities in the sense required to ground a rational cosmology in the Eleatic sense, they must be stable natures in the Parmenidean sense (for a related account, see Marmodoro 2015). Anaxagoras is committed to the arguments that ground Eleatic metaphysics; thus he can claim an a priori reason to think that the ingredients can be knowable in the sense required by the Principle of Predominance. His epistemological view that humans can reach understanding through beginning with sense experience then fits with these metaphysical commitments.

4. Science: The Anaxagorean Cosmos

Anaxagoras gave a complete account of the universe: of the heavens, the earth, and geological and meteorological phenomena. The accounts of the action of nous and the original rotation and its consequences appear in the fragments: B9 describes the force and velocity of the rotation, B12 and 13 explain the beginning of the rotation and the subsequent breaking up and remixing of the mass of ingredients, while B15 and 16 specify the cosmological consequences of the continued rotation (Curd 2007 and 2008, Graham 2006, Gregory 2007). Most of the other information comes from the testimonia, but there is enough in the remaining fragments to make it clear that everything is ultimately explained by the great rotation set in motion by nous. Further, and intriguingly, Anaxagoras claims that the cosmic rotary motion could produce other worlds like our own.

4.1 Cosmology

The rotation of the mixture begins in a small area, and then spreads out through the mass (B12). As the extent of the mixture is unlimited (or infinite, apeiron), the rotation and expansion will continue forever, bringing more and more ingredients into the whirl (a summary of the process is in Gregory 2007). The force and speed of the rotation is (according to B9) much faster at the edges, where the expanding rotation meets the as-yet-unmoved mass of ingredients: what we perceive of the rotation (probably the motions of the heavens) is much slower than the unobserved rotation. The force is enough to pull apart and rearrange the ingredients:

When nous began to move [things], there was separation off from the multitude that was being moved, and whatever nous moved, all this was dissociated; and as things were being moved and dissociated, the revolution made them dissociate much more. (B13)

There are two sorts of dissociation. First, as the rotation enters the as-yet-unmoved mass of ingredients, that mass begins to break up and the ingredients start to shift in their concentrations. This causes the original arrangement of ingredients to break up and begin to be rearranged. Because the mixture is a plenum, any separation is at the same time a rearrangement of ingredients. Then, those new rearrangements are themselves subject to further break-up and further rearrangement. Anaxagoras indicates this in the fragments by using different terms for different stages in the process (although he is not completely consistent in these uses). Normally, he uses the notion of being separated off (forms of the verb apokrinesthai) for the initial breaking apart of the mass. Re-arrangements are referred to as mixing (summisgesthai) or compacting (sumpêgnusthai). He also uses “joining together” (proskrinesthai) as a contrast to the separating off process (apokrinesthai) in B4a and B4b. When, in B17, he claims that passing-away is really dissociation, he uses the word diakrinesthai. This is a later stage than the earliest separations off of B1. The primary terms are compound forms of the verb krinein, to distinguish. The word can also mean “to judge” or “to determine,” and through the use of these compound terms, Anaxagoras reminds his readers that all of the changes are ultimately traceable to the action of nous, or Mind, that sets the mass moving in the first instance.

Over time, the rotation throws lighter ingredients towards the edges of the whirl and pushes the heavier ones to the center (B15), thus putting more dark and heavy ingredients like earth in the center and throwing air and aether (fire) away from the center. This gives the traditional Greek picture of our Earth (itself a mixture of all ingredients, with earth and heavy ores and minerals predominating) covered (in many places) by water, with air and the fiery reaches of the heavens.

The sun is a mass of fiery metal, and the moon is an earthy lump (with no light of its own). The same rotation ultimately produces the stars and planets as well. Sometimes the force of the rotation snatches up stones from the surface of the Earth and spins them around the Earth as they gradually rise higher through the force of the rotation. Until these bodies are high enough, they remain unseen between the Earth and the moon and so sometimes intervene to prevent heavenly bodies from being seen by terrestrial observers. The force and shaking of the rotation can cause slippage, and so sometimes a star (a flaming mass of rock and iron) is thrown downwards toward the earth as a meteor (such as the one Anaxagoras is supposed to have predicted at Aegospotami; see Galzerano 2019). The fullest account of Anaxagoras’ view on meteors can be found in Plutarch’s Life of Lysander 12 (59 A12). Anaxagoras is also credited with discovering the causes of eclipses — the interposition of another body between earth and the sun or the moon: sometimes he credits this to the “unseen bodies” mentioned above (see Graham and Hintz, 2007, Graham 2013a and 2013b, Taub 2003). According to the ancient sources (see esp. A1 and A42), Anaxagoras also gave explanations for the light of the Milky Way, the formation of comets, the inclination of the heavens, the solstices, and the composition of the moon and stars.

4.2 Meteorology and Geology

The rotation begun by nous ultimately affects phenomena on the earth and above the surface of the earth. Anaxagoras claims that the earth is flat, rests on air, and remains where it is because of its size (A42; a number of geological and meteorological views attributed to Anaxagoras were also apparently held by Anaximenes; whether this is because Anaxagoras was following Anaximenes or because the commentators conflate the two is unclear). Despite the manner of its formation, the earth is stationary, not spinning. The (relative) flatness of the earth allows water to spread over the earth, with mountains and plains rising above the level of the water. The levels change as water is evaporated or added by rain, and as water that has been trapped in the earth by the rotation makes its way out through rivers to the sea. Because the air under the earth is also moving (pushed along by the cosmic rotation), it sometimes gets caught up in the crevices of the earthy stuff. When this air cannot make its way out, the force of the moving air causes earthquakes. Anaxagoras seems determined to explain everything. The extant sources report views on thunder and lightning, the source of the Nile, the first correct account of the nature of hail, and inquiry into why the sea is salty. He also offered accounts of sense perception and made inquiries into embryology.

4.3 Other Worlds?

One of the more curious aspects of Anaxagoras’ theory is hinted at in B4a:

Since these things are so, it is right to think that there are many different things present in everything that is being combined, and seeds of all things, having all sorts of forms, colors, and flavors, and that humans and also the other animals were compounded, as many as have soul. Also that there are cities that have been constructed by humans and works made, just as with us, and that there are a sun and a moon and other heavenly bodies for them, just as with us, and the earth grows many different things for them, the most valuable of which they gather together into their household and use. I have said this about the separation off, because there would be separation off not only for us but also elsewhere.

Where is the “elsewhere” where there would also be separation off, and where there are sun and moon “for them, just as with us”? Surprisingly, no ancient sources discuss this (although Simplicius, who quotes the fragment, is clearly puzzled by it, and argues for a neo-Platonic metaphysical interpretation). Modern commentators have suggested that the other worlds are on the moon and/or other planets (Jöhrens 1939, Zeller 1923), elsewhere on the face of our Earth (Cornford, 1934), or even contained within ourselves (and all other things) so that there are infinite worlds within worlds (Mansfeld 1980, Schofield 1996, Sisko 2003). There is also the possibility that Anaxagoras has no commitment to the reality of these other worlds, but is simply engaging in a thought experiment to show how the rotation would work (Fränkel 1969, Vlastos 1975, Schofield 1996). There may be another possibility (Curd 2007). The unlimited rotation begins in a small area and expands indefinitely, pulling more and more of the unlimited mass of as-yet-unmixed ingredients into the whirl. Such an action could produce smaller local rotations within the larger whirl (especially at the expanding edges, as in the rotations of hurricane winds) and there, too, separation, mixture, and dissociation would occur. Such processes would result in the formation of systems like our own. This is not a thought-experiment on Anaxagoras’ part, but a commitment to the law-likeness of the rotations controlled by nous, and an awareness that similar processes will produce similar phenomena. Our world-system is not unique in the universe, although there is but one universe (constituted by the entire limitless mass of ingredients).

5. Knowledge

Both ancient and modern critics have complained that Anaxagoras is unclear about the nature of nous (Mind/Intelligence) and its role in his theory (Laks 1993, 2002; Lesher 1995). In B12 Anaxagoras claims that nous has all discernment, and that nous “knew them all: the things that are being mixed together, the things that are being separated off, and the things that are being dissociated.” Further, Anaxagoras remarks that there is nous in many things, and that it is alike in all the things that it is in, both large and small (presumably those with soul, i.e., living things). Aristotle says that Anaxagoras conflates soul and mind, and B12 seems to confirm this, insofar as Anaxagoras there treats nous primarily as a mover, yet also says that it controls all things that have soul. It seems likely that in things other than cosmic nous, those compacted or mixed-together natural constructs that have soul, the powers of nous include both knowing and perceiving. Nowhere do we have an analysis of the process of thinking for Anaxagoras, and although Aristotle and Theophrastus say that earlier thinkers identified thinking and sense perception, there is little evidence for this view in Anaxagoras (Laks 1999, Warren 2007).

It seems clear that if nous is to have all discernment and to order the cosmos, it must have some knowledge of the contents of the original mixture (Lesher 1995, Curd 2004). Further, if the ingredients are fundamentally real things they must have stable and knowable natures. (This follows from Parmenides’ arguments about the connection between what-is and what is knowable.) Thus, there is a match between the natures of the ingredients and the cognitive power of cosmic nous, but Anaxagoras leaves the mechanism unexplained. It seems likely that cosmic nous just has a direct intellectual grasp of these nature and acts in accordance with that knowledge.

5.1 Mind in Us

Only a few fragments and testimonia discuss Anaxagoras’ views on perception and knowledge in living things. Aristotle and Theophrastus give us some account of his theory of perception, saying, most surprisingly, that for Anaxagoras all sensation is accompanied by discomfort or pain (A92). Theophrastus links this to Anaxagoras’ belief that like is perceived by unlike; on Theophrastus’ view, perception is via touch, and unlike things produce some irritation when touched. Theophrastus adduces loud noises and very bright light as producers of pain in perceivers, and suggests that the mechanism is the same in all cases of sensation. Some irritation will be below the level of awareness for most perceivers, which is why humans do not normally feel pain when perceiving (see Warren 2007 for a good discussion of Anaxagoras on perception).

What is the relation between perception and knowledge? Anaxagoras does not claim that perception alone is sufficient for knowing; nor does he seem to embrace skepticism. Sextus Empiricus, always on the lookout for arguments for and against any dogmatic position, gives us most of the evidence for Anaxagoras’ views. Says Sextus, of the skeptic’s methodology, “We set what is thought in opposition to what appears, as Anaxagoras set the appearance that snow is white in opposition to the claim that snow is frozen water, water is black, and therefore snow is black” (A97; but see the passage from Cicero in the same testimonium). Here Anaxagoras accepts that snow seems to us to be white, but claims that the reality must be that snow is black. The evidence of the senses must be corrected by what we know through thought. In B21, Anaxagoras recognizes the weakness of the senses (“Owing to feebleness [of the senses], we are not able to determine the truth”), but in B21a he accepts that sense perception can be a step towards understanding: “appearances are a sight of the unseen.” This follows from his own theory, for the evidence of our own control of our bodies by our minds, the facts of nutrition and growth, and the local revolutions of the heavens are evidence for the workings of cosmic nous, the No-Becoming principle, and the great cosmic revolution. Like other Presocratics, Anaxagoras leaves us with no detailed account of how knowledge derives from perception through the refinements of thought: Anaxagoras’ account can be compared with that of Democritus, where the relation of sense-perception and thought is similar and similarly unexplained.

6. Anaxagoras’ Influence

Reportedly the first of the Presocratic philosophers to settle in Athens, Anaxagoras was a significant figure, not only for later philosophical thinkers, but also for the wider civic culture of his time. He was clearly an important influence on Pericles. Plutarch reports:

But Anaxagoras of Clazomenae was the one who most associated with Pericles and who most bestowed on him that dignity and wisdom more weighty than demagoguery, and on the whole raised up and exalted the worthiness of his character …These are not the only advantages that Pericles enjoyed because of his connection with Anaxagoras. It seems that Pericles rose above superstition, that attitude of astonishment about celestial occurrences which is produced in those who are ignorant about the causes of things and who are crazed by divinity and divine interventions because of their inexperience in these areas. Natural philosophy substitutes for festering superstition that unshaken piety that is attended by good hopes. (A15, A16)

That naturalism appears in the dramas of Euripides, who is often described as a pupil of Anaxagoras, and in the comedies of Aristophanes, who satirizes the views of Anaxagoras as well as the figure of Socrates in Clouds. Anaxagoras’ theory of the floods of the Nile was known to Herodotus (and may be referred to in Aeschylus). Despite stories that they did not get along, there are signs of influence of Anaxagoras on Democritus (in his accounts of perception and knowledge) and Anaxagoras’ scientific claims and discoveries affected all the thinkers of his time. Once his views about meteors, hail, and eclipses became known, such topics were always included in scientific accounts of astronomical and meteorological phenomena. In the testimonia, Anaxagoras’ even temperament was taken as a model of good behavior, and he was famous as a prognosticator of everything from meteor falls to rain showers.

Anaxagoras’ views appear among Socrates’ survey of previous naturalistic theories of explanation (Phaedo 96a6 ff.). More ominously, Meletus seems to have attributed Anaxagoras’ claims about the earthy nature of the moon and stars to Socrates at his trial (see Plato’s Apology 26e7ff., 59 A35). Although Anaxagoras’ alleged indictment for impiety was probably as much political as a sign of his danger to public religion (attacking Anaxagoras was an indirect attack on Pericles), he was seen as important and influential enough to qualify to some as an enemy of the polis.

Philosophically, Anaxagoras’ theories were also widely known and influential. Some scholars have thought that the author of the Derveni Papyrus (found in Northern Greece) was familiar with Anaxagoras’ theories (Betegh 2004; Kouremenos et al. 2006), and once he introduced Mind as a cause, other thinkers followed him. Diogenes of Apollonia claimed that air (as mind and god) directs all things. Zeno of Elea (perhaps) and Melissus (certainly) criticize his theory. Anaxagoras’ view that “each one is and was most manifestly those things of which there are the most in it” (the principle of Predominance) is echoed in Plato’s claims that sensible things acquire their characters and names from the Forms in which they participate (Phaedo 102a10 ff.). Plato even adopts Anaxagoras’ language of sharing or participating in (see Furley 2002), and like Anaxagoras’ nous, Platonic forms are “themselves by themselves” in being self-explanatory (see Herrmann, 2007). Aristotle, although impatient with the gaps in Anaxagoras’ account of nous, expresses admiration for his recognition that mind has a role to play in guiding the cosmos, and he treats Anaxagoras’ explanation of eclipses as a model of scientific explanation.


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