Supplement to Ancient Theories of Soul

Burnet on the Greek notion of soul

In an influential article on Socrates’ conception of the soul (one that Lovibond 1991, 35-6, for instance, treats as authoritative concerning the Greek notion of soul), Burnet claimed that when Socrates conceived of the soul as the ‘seat’ or bearer of wisdom and excellence of character, this was a dramatic departure from the conception of soul embedded in ordinary Greek thought and language. Burnet hugely overstates the novelty of Socrates’ conception, in part because of his failure to recognize the ordinary-language connection between soul and practical thought and, perhaps more importantly, because of his quite unwarranted, but complete, refusal (Burnet 1916, 245, 252) to take into account the well-documented use of ‘soul’ as bearer of morally significant characteristics, in particular courage or (as the case may be) its absence. He concludes his discussion of the ordinary Greek notion of soul by claiming that apart from a passage in Sophocles’ Philoctetes, there is no place in Greek non-philosophical literature down to the end of the fifth century “where it is even suggested that the ‘soul’ has anything to do with knowledge or ignorance, goodness or badness” (Burnet 1916, 256). The passages quoted in section 1 of the main text show this conclusion to be quite inadequate.

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