Notes to Arabic and Islamic Natural Philosophy and Natural Science

1. Among the Islamic speculative theologians the standard locution for ‘atom’ was either the explicit al-juz’ alladhi la yatajazza’u (literally, ‘the indivisible part’) or more frequently simply jawhar (literally ‘substance’), which in the falsafa tradition was also the standard term for an Aristotelian substance. The most detailed discussion to date on medieval Islamic atomism, and from which much of the following is drawn, is Dhanani (1994).

2. Part of the evidence that Pines used to argue that earlier theologians envisioned atoms as points involved a debate between the earlier atomists and later atomists over whether the atom had a measure, or perhaps, ‘magnitude,’ (misaha). The earlier atomists denied that the atom had magnitude, while the later affirmed that it did. Given the earlier atomists’ denial that the atom has any measure, Pines conjectured that unlike their later counterparts the earlier theologians must have conceived of the atom as a point. Dhanani has shown that the debate was more terminological than substantive. Both earlier and later atomists maintained that the atom has no length, breadth or depth, for these dimensions require limits at which they terminate, and it is the atoms themselves that play the role of the required limits, and so ipso facto, they could not possess a length, breadth or depth. Thus the question under discussion was not whether the atom is extended or a point, but whether the term ‘measure’ is applicable or not to something lacking length, breadth and depth.

3. The argument is found in al-Ash‘ari’s al-Luma‘ where he discusses istita‘a (al-Ash‘ari, 1953, 33–44) and again in al-Baqillani’s Kitab at-Tamhid (al-Baqillani, 1957, 286–287); al-Baqillani (1957, 34–35) also offered an additional argument, but now couched in terms of ‘natures’ understood as causal powers.

4. The earlier Arabic-speaking philosophers did not leave commentaries on Aristotle’s Physics and the long commentaries on the Physics by such later philosophers as Averroes still lack critical editions. Given these textual limitations, the present account relies heavily on the physical writings of Avicenna and Ibn Bajja, the Latin Avempace. To the extent possible their thought is further supplemented by the physical thoughts of other thinkers in the falsafa tradition as those thoughts appear either in smaller treatises on special issues in natural philosophy or side comments about natural philosophy in works that do not have natural philosophy as their focus.

5. For a history of the philosophical issues that became associated with the notion of entelekheia in both the Greek- and Arabic-speaking worlds see Part I of Wisnovsky (2003).

6.Ibn Bajja likewise suggests a punctiform analysis of motion in book VI (Ibn Bajja, 1978, 91–92) of his Physics commentary.

7. The argument presented here is not found in Aristotle’s Physics or in any of the extant commentaries on the Physics that would have been available in Arabic, or at least not explicitly or with anything like the clarity with which it is presented among Arabic-speaking philosophers. In fact, I have not been able to find the argument prior to al-Kindi, although considerably more research would be need before ascribing authorship to al-Kindi. What is clear, however, is its prevalence within the falsafa tradition. Al-Kindi employs it in both On First Philosophy and the shorter treatise “On Divine Unity and the Finitude of the World’s Body”; Avicenna wholly endorses it in the Physics of the Shifa’ and then with qualification in the Najat; Ibn Bajja provides a version of it in terms of numbers rather than magnitudes in his Physics commentary; Ibn Tufayl repeats the argument in his philosophical novel Hayy ibn Yaqzan (“Alive Son of Awake”); and as-Sahrawardi offers his own take of the argument in Hikmat al-Ishraq (“The Philosophy of Illumination”).

8. In the edition and translation of Lugal and Sayili, which also includes a facsimile of the manuscript they used, (al-Farabi, 1951, [7] 26), they have misrepresented al-Farabi’s argument, and indeed have made it a non-sequitur, by misreading the manuscript. What they read as … hina’idhin hajm wa jism … should be read as … jasad fa-hajmun jismun …. Thus they mistranslate the text as, “The result is that in this one-third section [i.e., the purportedly void space in the vial], there is a volume and a body possessing length, breadth and depth …,” which not only requires them to transpose what they believe to be a wa, which in the ms precedes hajm, and put it after hajm, but also it makes al-Farabi’s introduction of body as part of the conclusion gratuitous. The translation based on my suggested reading of the ms is “The result is that in this one-third section there is a body, since (fa) a volume is a body possessing length, breadth and depth …,” which is both faithful to the ms and explains the introduction of ‘body’ in the conclusion.

9. Al-Farabi’s argument is picked up by Avicenna and argued in considerable detail and with much force (Avicenna, 1983, II.8, 123–127).

10. The most notable exception is Abu Barakat, who identified time with a measure of being; see Pines (1979a and 1979b).

Copyright © 2018 by
Jon McGinnis <>

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