Supplement to Philosophy of Architecture

1. Architecture In Ancient and Early Modern Thought

Just as the history of philosophical aesthetics subsequent to Plato and Aristotle and prior to Baumgarten represents a relatively thin canon, a similar judgment applies to philosophical explorations of the nature and fundamental concepts of architecture. Indeed, as Plato and Aristotle have little to say on the topic, the pre-Baumgarten catalogue of philosophical accounts of architecture is even more slender.

Of Plato’s brief pronouncements on the topic, perhaps best known is his exoneration of architecture as it promotes the social good and as a non-mimetic, hence non-deceptive, artform (as contrasts with sculpture). He further characterizes architecture and allied enterprises (Philebus 56b-c) as progressing through exact measurement—comparing favorably with music, which relies in its development on iterative experience. Plato also locates the kind of knowledge architecture represents in the domain of the praktikê (πρακτική, knowing how), as aligned with technê (τέχνη, the practical arts) and in contrast with gnostikê (γνωστικη, experientially knowing that) or epistêmê (ἐπιστήμη, by way of theory or reason knowing that). Such practical knowledge is delivered not as judgments (as with mathematics) but as instructions or commands, in the manner of managerial knowledge (The Statesman 260a-b). Beyond these fleeting remarks, a Platonist legacy in architectural thought may be located in the influence of idealism. As Mitrovic (2011) suggests, Greek, Roman, and Renaissance interest in optical correction reflects concerns about bringing perceptions of concretely realized structures in line with corresponding ideal architectural “forms”, or about departures from proportions of works described by such forms. In contemporary philosophy of architecture, Platonism is mooted in the question as to whether, per an abstractist thesis, such ideal objects are the uniquely actual, or (more modestly) most real, architectural objects.

Aristotle joins Plato in largely speaking of architecture not as a central topic of interest but in order to make a point. Thus, Aristotle presents the four causes drawing on the example of causal roles in the architecture of a temple (Physics 2.3). For example, the architect’s idea of the temple, as realized through craftsmanship of the workers whom the architect commands, represents the efficient cause of the temple—whereas the architect’s vision of or plan for the temple (not necessarily realized) provides the formal cause. Elsewhere, pursuing a holist picture of biological explorations as the “total form” of animals, Aristotle draws a comparison with “the true object of architecture”, which he notes is “…not bricks, mortar, or timber, but the house” (Parts of Animals, Book I).

In like fashion, there are short, instrumental references to architects or architecture in Plotinus, Augustine, Thomas of Aquinas, Descartes, and others still. One hallmark of most such references is a focus on architecture as craft, trade, or skill, rather in the manner that Plato—or, for that matter, Vitruvius—saw the discipline. Against this background, Francis Bacon offers an early entry in addressing architectural matters in exceptionally non-instrumental fashion. He opens his brief essay “Of Building” (Essays, or Counsels Civil and Moral) with a pronouncement still prized by modern-day architectural functionalists: “Houses are built to live in, and not to look on”. That said, visual aspects are not forgotten and he reminds us of the imperative for order and symmetry: “Therefore let use be preferred before uniformity, except where both may be had” (1625: XLV, 257). Utility, however, remains the focal point of this essay, relative to calculating the site for a princely house, and making accommodations in fine house design to meet weather conditions, circulatory needs, and like parameters.

2. German Enlightenment: Wolff, Kant, Hegel, Schopenhauer

A greater awareness of architecture as an artform—and thus, a greater philosophical focus—commences with Batteux’s inclusion of architecture among the arts (1746). However, even as independent of the birth of modern aesthetics, Wolff offers an account that, like Bacon’s, focuses on architecture more in the manner of a craft or scientific discipline (Buchenau 2013; Guyer 2007/2014). In Baconian fashion, Wolff exalts the craftsman’s maker’s knowledge (“historical knowledge”, for Wolff), where experimentation contributes to a broader understanding of phenomena and method (1746). In this spirit, Wolff counts architecture among the empirical arts of invention (ars inveniendi), along with physics and medicine, wherein we arrive at new truths as based on available truths (1751). Looking at architecture in disciplinary terms, he counts it as a branch of applied mathematics, with systematized rules that govern real-world phenomena. One hallmark of Wolff’s account is seeing architecture fundamentally as an undertaking, and derivatively as a product. Architecture is “…the science of creating a building in such a way that it conforms with the architect’s main intentions” (1750–57).

Wolff, rare among philosophers, looks to Vitruvius and the subsequent tradition as a source of architectural principles—which, in particular, identify Greek architecture as a model. While Wolff endorses the full Vitruvian triad as imperatives, he emphasizes a linkage between two principles in particular: structural soundness must be tied to beauty, and visible to the spectator. Also in line with Vitruvian thought, Wolff proposes that, to attain the sort of harmony that yields architectural perfection, architects deploy special disciplinary knowledge developed out of experience with construction. This knowledge comprises rules for promoting “coherence” in design and meeting the structure’s use as intended by the architect (1750–57).

When Batteux (1746) suggests that architecture belongs to the family of artforms, he present this designation with utility still the driving force—proposing that while architecture flourishes out of necessity, it is taste that perfects its art. This epigram hints at a key theme of Kant’s account. Success in architectural design consists in attaining beauty of form in light of functionality or, in Kantian terms, an adherent (non-free) beauty in buildings as defined by realization of their intended goal-state (Critique of the Power of Judgment, 1790). Guyer (2011) sees an echo of the Vitruvian premium on utility and firmity; Wolff’s theory of perfections also seems close to hand. A second theme, as Guyer notes, is Kant’s emphasis—as a piece of his cognitivism—on the expressive capacity of architecture relative to aesthetic, idealized notions of function, structure, and physical forces. Specifically, architecture expresses aesthetic ideas through forms, materials, and use of space; the range of ideas that can be expressed is constrained by the fit of the architectural object to its intended use (1790).

Kant’s legacy in architectural thought is diverse, extending beyond his brief remarks on architecture or even his aesthetics. Guyer suggests that Kant provides a starting point for all expressivist theories of architecture. Mitrovic (2011) proposes that, via his notion of disinterested judgment (not focused on architecture), Kant sets the stage for subsequent formalist claims—like those of Geoffrey Scott (1914/1924)—that (a) aesthetic judgments of form across persons should yield similar judgments and (b) aesthetic judgments are best understood as divorced from associations with a work’s meaning or any connected concepts. Scruton (1979/2013), though not a formalist, proposes a contemplative model of architectural experience that also builds on a Kantian cognitive engagement with the aesthetic that—in disinterested fashion—does not rely on architecture’s practical aspects. More broadly, phenomenological approaches (Heidegger, Gadamer, Harries) suggest that architecture—as analogous with a Kantian conceptual framework—structures our experience of the world around us.

Hegel (1826) happily embraces Kant’s categorization of architecture as art and is especially enthusiastic about its expressive nature. Architecture for Hegel is primary among the arts in expressing cognitive content generally—the Absolute Spirit—as an aspect of organizing the natural environment. At the same time, architecture, along with art as a whole, fails to express the Absolute Spirit as well as religion or philosophy, which feature greater linguistic capacity and are not weighted down with an unavoidable symbolism. This is true even of the Gothic, which Hegel takes as an ultimate (if qualified) success in the history of architecture for its metaphorical communication of spirit. As with history in general, Hegel offers a progressive account of architectural history, wherein successive stages (the “Symbolic”, Classical, and Romantic periods) bring an increasing freedom among architectural objects from symbolism and purpose, and enhanced expression of the Absolute Spirit. This progressive view of history and the vision of a collective historical force strongly influence a common strain of architectural theory, wherein design reflects the spirit of the times. This theme is pervasive in twentieth century architectural advocacy and historiography (Watkin 1984/2001).

Like Hegel, Schopenhauer (1818/1844 [WWR]) rates architecture by its expressive capacities; however, he reaches the opposite conclusion, ranking architecture among the lowest of artforms—as against music, his benchmark standard. Architecture reveals ideas of natural and formal qualities found in the work; these are primarily the “dullest visibilities of the Will”, such as the gravity, rigidity, and other properties of stone (World as Will and Representation (WWR) I) but include ideas of light, as well. Like all arts, architecture features “aesthetic material”, or a theme for artistic content; in the case of architecture this theme is the conflict between (a) gravity, the tendency of the building’s mass to pull downward, and (b) rigidity, the capacity of the building’s structure and parts to prevent collapse (WWR I). The central aesthetic challenge of architecture, correspondingly, is artistic communication of these (lowly) forces—also referred to as “load” and “support” (WWR II)—in varied forms of tension. Taking this challenge as the primary driver in structural design, Schopenhauer takes aim at a standard view in architectural theory, the claim—in Vitruvius and elsewhere—that the classical column is proportional to natural forms (the human form, in the Vitruvian instance). The column design has to be load-bearing, Schopenhauer notes. So to look to a natural forms origin of its proportions is to suggest, oddly, that load-bearing is merely a happy coincidence with the accident of proportion fitting to that of the human body (or, alternatively, a tree trunk) (WWR II; Korab-Karpowicz 2012; Schwarzer, 1996). The proposal that architecture communicates its structural features echoes Kant’s expansive expressivism and, as Guyer (2011) notes, anticipates Ruskin and modernist views.

3. The Science of Aesthetics and Einfühlung Traditions

Over the latter half of the nineteenth century, the science of aesthetics (Kunstwissenschaft) movement advanced the proposal that art and its qualities—especially beauty—are subject to scientific analysis on par with the natural or formal sciences. Among putative reasons for this proposal, we find the suggestions that beauty and such qualities are phenomena which, like those of physics or chemistry, may be measured, explained, predicted, and subject to normative characterization. Some talk of science seems to have been façon de parler, as exemplified by Henry Noble Day’s The Science of Aesthetics, or the nature, kinds, laws, and uses of Beauty (1872/1888), which traces aesthetics as a science back to Baumgarten and the origin of the term aesthetics, and enunciates a variety of putative “laws” governing the arts. Science and its laws are taken here more as metaphor than literal practice. For architecture, Day suggested special laws, including a Law of the Idea in Architecture: the idea of shelter is the fundamental architectural idea. On the whole, though, the science of aesthetics movement encouraged an earnest scientific focus on art—independent of traditional aesthetics—in experimental psychology and among the Einfühlung (empathy) theorists.

Helmholtz is primarily responsible for crafting a kunstphysiologie encompassing studies of measured sensation and perception as a physiological approach to aesthetics (Hatfield 1993). His concerns regarding art included cognitive facets of aesthetics—in physiological and psychological studies of sensation as relate to music and painting—and cognitive function in art as compared with science. Other early experimentalists included Wundt’s spatial perception studies, suggesting the importance of active attention (Outlines of Psychology, 1896/1907); and Fechner’s comparative measures of preferences across persons, which he takes to yield universally valid, if modest, claims about aesthetic choice. Fechner’s most famous study of preferences (1876) appears to bolster a long-standing claim of architectural theorists since Vitruvius: given a set of rectangles of various dimensions, he found, respondents tend to find most pleasing those whose proportions conform to the “golden section” (1:1.618), and find most displeasing long and narrow rectangles. (The study has been widely repeated—with mixed results.)

Against Fechner, Volkelt (1905) complained that the artificial laboratory environment contorts our aesthetic preferences. In particular, we do not exhibit empathy with simple aesthetic stimuli, as we do with complex, whole artworks. Volkelt and fellow einfühlung theorists promoted understanding of empathic experience of perceptual objects as an alternate psychological approach to cognition and appreciation of art and architecture. As concerns architecture in particular, Wölfflin (1886) proposes that we grasp the nature and psychological function of architectural objects and their elements through an empathic relationship—seeing oneself in the form—as undergirded by physiological and formalist features of experience. Formal modes of architecture—horizontality, verticality, proportionality—and the expressive nature of ornament are alike the products of our physical and sensory capacities. Göller (1887; Mallgrave 2005) uses the projective character of einfühlung theory to develop an account of architectural style, starting with the proposal that architecture alone among the arts features “visible pure form”, or form which is constitutive of objects in the medium and which (inclusive of lines, light, and shade) lacks representational or necessarily historical content. Sets of architectural forms collectively constitute styles—which meet common physiological standards and feature temporally and culturally local character—upon which architects draw. The greater the commonality of such forms and our mental images of them, the greater the pleasure we associate with them, until a saturation point (representing overuse) after which our pleasure diminishes greatly. Architects may recoup the ability to arouse pleasure through exploration of new forms. Into the twentieth century, einfühlung theory continued to gain adherents among European and American architects and critics, including Scott, in his Architecture of Humanism (1914/1924); Richard Neutra (Lavin 2004); and the Serbian architect Milutin Borisavljevic (1923, 1954), who in a second career pursued an experimental science of architecture focused on Fechner-style perception studies and empathic reception.

4. Continental Traditions

Continental traditions dominate the history of twentieth century philosophy of architecture, relative to philosophical output and influence on architectural theory. To a limited extent, those traditions have even influenced architectural practice. The primary movement in this regard is phenomenology; hermeneutics and post-structuralism play lesser roles.

Phenomenology. In response to the rise of scientific psychology (of experimental or other variants), early phenomenologists cast doubt on whether we experience the world and its objects in objective fashion. Instead, they proposed that we characterize—in as intersubjectively meaningful fashion as possible—first-person experience. Given the centrality of experience to architectural judgment and the role of architecture in physically shaping people’s experiences, it was perhaps unsurprising that phenomenologists took an interest in architecture.

A first step in that direction was the proposal of Merleau-Ponty (1945) that our existence in the world is best understood through ways it is shaped by bodily experience of our surroundings. That bodily experience is relative to what appears in our visual field, to our tactile and kinesthetic engagement (hence to our position and motion), and to who we are as individuals and group members. Phenomenologists and others (J. Robinson 2012) offer an architectural application: our experience of the built environment shapes our appreciation of, and abilities to negotiate, our surroundings. If so, then merely looking at architectural objects is woefully inadequate to the task of judging their value or utility; physical experience emerges as the defining feature of understanding an architectural object, and that feature shapes (or should shape) architectural creation.

Two principal paths of exploration are open to the architectural phenomenologist. First, an account is sought as to how design of the built environment influences experience, perception, feeling, or behavior. Thus, one’s experience of architecture en gros is analyzed in the manner of a classic phenomenological account of, say, one’s experience of color en gros (Mitias 1999b). The locus classicus for this approach is Heidegger (1951), who proposes that the act of building a structure has the central end of creating “place” by connecting spaces in or around the built structure. Further, and as advanced through such acts of connection, creating “place” also requires development of human relationships to one’s surrounding spaces—what Heidegger refers to as “dwelling”. The proposal that the built environment structures the identity of a given place—hence our experience thereof—enjoys wide appreciation in architectural circles, following its embrace in popular accounts by Rasmussen (1959) and Norberg-Schulz (1980). More recently, Harries (1997) has proposed, as a counterweight to “sense of place”, that the communal responsibilities of architecture demand a phenomenological grasp of a “sense of space” in which we freely move about. The structure of our experience in architecture, in short, is not just of personal but as well public and collective character.

Phenomenological analysis of architecture faces a range of potential problems. For one, there are limits to what our experience of architectural objects can tell us about them. A broader grasp of architectural objects should engage whatever counts as objective facts about those objects. For another, even short of objectivity, the variety of our architectural first-person experiences may not allow enduring, cross-cultural, or even cross-person experiential access to a given object, its context, and or relations—or how the object structures spatial or other experience. This leaves phenomenological analysis overly context-bound. Finally, if we can make significant aesthetic choices regarding architectural objects with no varied effect on a person’s experiences, then phenomenological analysis has limited value for the aesthetics of architecture.

An anomalous but significant work in the phenomenological tradition is Ingarden (1962), in which he extends to architecture his theory of art objects as “purely intentional”, or emerging as the product of consciousness. For Ingarden, architectural objects, like other art objects, require that architect and spectator construct aesthetic qualities of the object to give it its identity as an architectural object, in addition to recognizing the constituent collections of constituent materials and parts. Their “doubly founded” character acknowledges each object’s objective, material base. Architectural objects are also, to a degree, culturally bound and socially determined: we see a building as an architectural object of a particular kind (e.g., church) because we are aware that it is has been dedicated as such by design and in accordance with social and cultural standards and expectations. As architectural objects of that kind, they are partly socially constructed.

Ingarden’s focus on the creative act of consciousness is suggestive of a second principal path for architectural phenomenologists: seeking an account as to how experience, perception, feeling, or behavior may influence design of the built environment. Variants on this path are also available to social and environmental psychologists as well as practicing architects (Holl, Pallasmaa, and Pérez-Gómez 1994).

Hermeneutics. In contrast to Ingarden’s notion that intentions are constitutive of architectural objects, Gadamer (1960) suggests that our appreciation of them relies on access to intentions. Following his general hermeneutics, the key to an architectural object’s meaning is original design intent. The architect as creator shapes a world for us as the structure’s users, and our appreciation of that world requires our entry into, and movement through, it. As typical of his emphasis on value-ladenness, Gadamer takes as central to an architectural object that it has some form of significance for its environment. Shaping the environment is normatively part of a design solution to core architectural problems of function and context. For a building to even count as an architectural object it needs to address its context.

Post-Structuralism. Some architectural theory of the late twentieth century embraced one or another form of post-structuralist Continental thought—one central claim of which is that texts and other cultural artifacts have meanings and references beyond their prima facie content. Moreover, meanings and references are typically taken as fixed not by their creators but according to background contexts and political agendas. In this vein, Foucault (1975) has been taken to suggest two claims about architecture. First, architecture can be an instrument of power and suppression—as in the design of prisons, a premier example being Bentham’s Panopticon (1787). Second, while architecture represents a means of exercising social control, architects themselves are not, qua individuals, capable of exercising such control alone and are instead part of a larger network and infrastructure dedicated to the maintenance and exercise of power.

5. The Analytic Tradition: Goodman, Scruton, and Beyond

There is perhaps no precise birth moment of analytic aesthetics’ engagement with architecture. There are early starts. Langer (1953) weaves architecture into her broader theory of symbolic form; to accommodate architecture as an expressive, abstract art, despite its representational moments, she highlights its capacity to shape space in virtue of relations among constituent forms and so (abstractly) express motion or feeling. Beardsley (1958/1981) offers a brief attempt to account for architecture in his ontology of artifacts and productions—plans representing the former, built structures the latter.

Two entries from Goodman signal more dedicated attention. The first, perhaps more significant, is his Languages of Art (1968) account of architecture’s ontological classification by dint of the nature of its notational systems (see chapter 4). In a second look at language-like phenomena (1985), Goodman proposes that architectural objects function symbolically in three ways: (1) denotation, or picking out a relevantly similar feature—generally, a shape—to which the spectator will be likely to have a present notion; (2) exemplification, or (literal) highlighting in design of a broader feature of the built structure; and (3) expression, or metaphorical exemplification of a feature which, while perhaps broadly characteristic of the built structure, is not literally so. The first mode is a standard sort of denotation; the latter two aren’t clearly denotation at all, except in Goodman’s broad symbolic functioning sense. So we may ask if there are specifically language-like phenomena going on in such cases. A further question, from an empirical standpoint, is whether we could test for Goodmanian denotation as might characterize, among architectural objects, successful symbolic functioning across persons.

The most significant entry in philosophy of architecture—certainly within the analytic tradition but conceivably as a whole—is Scruton’s sprawling, fecund Aesthetics of Architecture (1979/2013). As in his broader aesthetics, Scruton highlights the central role of the imagination in perception and, as joined with our reasoning, in aesthetic judgment. In loosely Kantian fashion, he proposes that our capacity to create and see architectural beauty through aesthetic judgment is integral to the practical reasoning employed in architecture and in related applied or decorative arts. Architectural beauty, following Alberti (1485), consists in harmony (concinnitas) in composition of parts (which Alberti defines formally relative to number, position, and “outline”). An architectural object succeeds aesthetically, then, when its parts form a harmonious whole—and we gauge such success through imaginatively perceiving as much.

As informed by the imagination, architectural judgment issues in the exercise of taste—a critical discrimination to which we attach aspirations of objectivity—deployed to identify the “appropriate” in style, scale, or arrangement. Appropriateness—another notion borrowed from Alberti—consists in the ways an architectural objects’ constituent parts present, visually, a kind of mutually supportive warrant. This, for Scruton, is what it means for parts to be proportional (compare Suppes 1991; De Clercq 2009; Matravers 1999).

If the exercise of taste indicates values embedded in or pertinent to our experience of architecture, an extension into the moral sphere demands that we cherish and seek to promote beauty and other aesthetic values not merely for ourselves but as well for others. Thus (following Kant further), our embrace of aesthetic values is bound up with our enriching relations with others; in an architectural context this means that our aesthetic sensibilities should be oriented towards creating inviting built environments. Here and in a subsequent polemic (1994) Scruton, on behalf of classical architecture and in opposition to modern architecture (and successor movements and styles), challenges stylistic or critical commitments that do not embrace as central the production of beauty, harmony, and “appropriateness”.

Recent Developments. Newer work in philosophy of architecture reflects greater awareness of, and interaction with, contributions of architects and architectural theorists. It also reflects the emergence of architecture as a discrete focus of aesthetics and other art-centered investigations, with connections to yet other areas in philosophy. Development as a subdomain is marked by keen interest in defining bounds of architectural practice and creation.

For Graham (2012), the central problem of architectural aesthetics is to account for architectural meaning and value while embracing a synthesis of artistic value and utility (“engineering”) value. This integration is characteristic of the way architects see their task and the way we engage with architectural objects. Graham proposes that our optimal engagement with architecture consists in “appropriation” rather than simple appreciation; we imagine our use of the built structure given its aesthetic and other merits.

Beyond the core foci of aesthetics, contemporary philosophy of architecture touches on issues raised by aesthetics of the everyday (see discussion of functional beauty, Philosophy of Architecture: §5.2) and philosophy of the environment. In this last regard, environmental aesthetics (Carlson 1999, 2000; Parsons 2008; Berleant 2007) offers a range of insights into architecture, together with the urban context, considered as the built environment. For one, we may take aesthetic appreciation to be at least partially consistent across kinds of environments, whether built or otherwise. Then a corresponding aesthetic criterion for what counts as architecture—not hitched to high art—licenses an inclusivist or expansive picture of what objects are architectural. For another, environmental aesthetics recognizes the possibility of engaged and disinterested experience and appreciation. By contrast, in architectural aesthetics, the default mode of experience and appreciation is an engaged stance, as a consequence of the premium on functionality in architecture. Yet there also may be a disinterested mode of appreciation, augmented with distance (personal, cultural, or otherwise) from functionality of the architectural object. Similarly, our appreciation of the built environment is, like that of environments more generally, informed by considerations of both cognitive and non-cognitive dimensions. In keeping with the intentional character of the built environment, the base case may well be that our appreciation of built structures is advanced by knowledge of, for example, what purpose they serve. However, we also appreciate built structures further through immersive and tactile experience of them.

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Copyright © 2015 by
Saul Fisher <>

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