Supplement to Philosophy of Architecture

Philosophy and the Tradition of Architectural Theory

While philosophy of architecture is relatively new as a growing sub-discipline, we can look to a two-millennia old tradition of theoretical treatises in architecture (in the West; other traditions are older still) as raising key conceptual issues. The architectural theory tradition encompasses critical commentary on or explanations of architectural works or styles or movements; instructions or guidelines for architectural design; musings on the origins of building types or styles; and advocacy for new approaches to the architectural discipline and practice. Works in this multifaceted Western tradition—written by architects, architectural critics, and architectural historians—range historically from Vitruvius (15 BCE) through the present. From a philosophical perspective, this “native” architectural theory tradition introduces questions about how to best explore conceptual foundations or establish imperatives for architectural practice, design thought, or architectural history; how to mine varied theoretical schemes of architects for philosophical insights; and (relatedly) what sort of commerce philosophical aesthetics may have with architectural theory. The centrality of Vitruvian principles in architectural theory prompts further questions—answered at least obliquely in the aesthetics of architecture—as to what sort of principles these are (useful for judgment, guiding practice, etc.) and whether they are essential to defining architecture.

Any overview of the history of architectural theory in this context may only be embarrassingly brief and instrumental. The rich scope, variety, and significance of this two millennia-old tradition are out of reach; see Kruft (1994) or Mallgrave (2005) for thorough histories of these traditions. This coarse categorization of theories is doubtless objectionable but captures at least one signal characteristic. Across the many dimensions of architectural theory, authors in the tradition have been (and are) in the main architects who seek to account for what they and others do, and should do, in architecture. Some architects cast doubt on the value of theory in a world where one can simply express design thought through actual design (Johnson 1994). Yet the history of architecture suggests at least this distinctive value: theory over the ages offers a historical record of what architects have thought important to communicate to other architects (and perhaps to broader audiences), to best understand the practice and governing concepts of the discipline. Architectural theory looks to be a piece with the maker’s knowledge tradition in the Renaissance sciences and as celebrated by Descartes and Bacon: we acquire a sort of knowledge through doing—as in the trial and error of design and construction—which we can then transmit to others for their enlightenment and benefit (Hintikka 1974).

The notion of knowledge through doing is apt for Vitruvius, as for so many who follow. Of the ten books of De Architectura, eight are dedicated to building materials, civic infrastructure, civil engineering and technology (and the underlying science), and building types other than temples. In short, the Vitruvian picture of architecture is rooted in experiential knowledge of making, doing, and crafting. Even the beauty of the orders is communicated through a cataloging of elements of the temple building type.

In addition, Vitruvius’ main contributions to the history of architectural theory include (1) his canonical account of the classical orders (Books III and IV), and (2) identification of three principles of architecture, firmitas, utilitas, venustas, conventionally translated as structural integrity, utility, and beauty; or (per Wotton 1624) firmness, commodity, and delight. Following a train of architectural theorists and architects across the past two millennia, we may variously understand these principles—the “Vitruvian triad”—as fundamental categorial beliefs, imperatives for practice, or guides to architectural value.

Vitruvian influence on subsequent architectural theory cannot be overstated. Architectural theory as a didactic or polemic pursuit (beyond De Architectura, which Vitruvius may have intended as a documentary effort) was launched in the Renaissance with Leon Battista Alberti’s De Re Aedificatoria (1485). Alberti offered a “recovery” of Vitruvius and an outward tribute to the Vitruvian triad as definitive pronouncement of architecture’s aims—hence the measure of architectural success.

Subsequent theoretical developments included Renaissance and early modern explorations of perspective, as launched by Alberti and continued in the work of Desargues (1642) and Bosse (1643). With the Enlightenment focus on human nature and diversity of human experience, theorists such as Laugier (1753/55) presented architectural design as a basic chapter in human development. The birth of art criticism (Winckelmann 1764) and rediscovery of ancient cities like Pompeii energized investigations of and polemics on behalf of classicism (inspired by the earlier treatise and work of Palladio (1570)) as a stylistic framework for new architecture. Nineteenth century theorists such as Pugin (1843) and Ruskin (1849) countered that religiously inspired morality, exposure of “essential” structure, and honest craft favored a revived Gothic style over the dominant neo-classicism. Other theoretical highlights of that century include Viollet-le-Duc’s proposals (1863-1872) that “honest” design reflects construction techniques deployed, and that particular architectural forms call for use of corresponding materials; the similarly-minded Realismus of, among others, Semper (1860) and O. Wagner (1896), promoting necessity and fidelity to materials and construction as guides to architectural expression; and Sitte’s integration (1889) of architecture with urbanism, whereby the proper level for aesthetically gauging architecture is the totality of a given urban space rather than its constituent built structures.

The modernist movement in architecture was broadly announced, beyond the architectural world, in a series of polemical statements by Sullivan (1896) who crafted the functionalist motto in his phrase “form ever follows function”; Loos (1913), who decried ornament as “criminal”; and Le Corbusier (1923), who declared that architecture’s character should be shaped by technological possibilities of the day. Architectural theory of the postwar era looked to ever more abstract intellectual currents for inspiration, in the phenomenological approaches of Rasmussen (1959) and Norberg-Schulz (1965), semiotic explorations of Koenig (1964) and Jencks and Baird (1969), and Marxist analysis of Tafuri (1973).

Recent architectural theory integrates insights from a host of other disciplines, including literary theory (Eisenman 2004; Wigley 1993); Continental philosophy (Pallasmaa 2005; Vesely 2004); Chomskyian linguistics (Alexander et al. 1977); information theory and computer science (Mitchell 1990); sociology (Lefebvre 1970 and 1974); urban studies (Krier 2009; Koolhaas 1978); cultural studies (Rapoport 1969; Oliver 1969); and science studies (Pérez-Gómez 1983). This great breadth leads some to see an interdisciplinary discipline which, more wide-ranging than architectural history, constitutes the “architectural humanities”.

Much of architectural theory, from Alberti to Palladio, and from Perrault to Blondel, observes a straightforward Vitruvian homage to the orders and classicism as a whole. While current practice informs their theories, they are one step removed from a “pure” maker’s knowledge. Their design thinking, while reflective of their own works, also borrows heavily on classic theoretical works and Vitruvius in particular. This combination of reporting on the basis of craft experience and advocacy on behalf of past tradition also characterizes proponents of the gothic alternatives to classics, Pugin and Ruskin, as well as proponents of postmodernism and, for that matter, all other revivalisms. Modernist theorists, too, of various stripes, from Sullivan to Le Corbusier to Neutra, build their theories on an architect’s maker’s knowledge—more purely so, if we take at face value their rejection of all revivalisms.

Central chapters in the history of architectural theory, though not generally linked to philosophical traditions in aesthetics, call our attention to foundational issues in architecture. These issues include explorations of that fundamental conceptual framework, the Vitruvian triad; a developing comprehension of tectonics—that is, structure and its revelation in design; and the waxing and waning promotion of ornament.

Other key figures in the history of architectural theory were not architects, including Laugier, Winckelmann, and Tafuri. One need not be a practitioner to understand architecture at its conceptual core, to recognize its organizing principles, or to have a vision as to what design thinking trumps others. However, per the historical record, theory generally is the product of practitioners’ thinking. This fact shapes the nature of the genre, at a minimum relative to its goals and to reasonable expectations among consumers of the genre, including possible interlocutors in philosophical aesthetics.

Two primary goals of practitioners’ thinking in architectural theory are systemization and explanation on one hand, and prescription on another:

First, architectural theory represents a codification of practical architectural knowledge: what we currently know about how to do or categorize architecture (e.g., Vitruvius), how architecture should be done (e.g., Alexander 1979), or how to explain aspects of architectural practice, such as spatial structuring (e.g., Hillier and Hanson 1984).

Second, architectural theory comprises prescriptive, even didactic, expression—the intent of which is to (a) promote given or new ways in which to do architecture and (b) ground architectural practice in moral, social, psychological, or theoretical bases. (The didactic tendency issues in a tradition of treatises and manifestos.) In this prescriptive sense, theory frequently suggests a best understanding of architecture, as it may be related to other cultural forms or general cultural contexts (Pallasmaa 2012) or to objectives of other domains, such as ecological sustainability (Yeang 2006). Yet other prescriptive elements of theory promote particular visions of design method, such as design after organic forms (Portoghesi 2000), mathematical forms (Burry and Burry 2012), or adoption of design algorithms (Mitchell 1990). This tradition in theory is broadly Vitruvian, as the more fundamental reasons adduced for pursuing any given design method are invariably some combination of structural effectiveness, usefulness, and attractiveness.

The two modalities are not mutually exclusive; explanation of current practice is a natural background for prescriptive theory. This may be desirable in some respects. Thus, Korydon Smith (2012) sees a role for architectural theory in providing conceptual frameworks for evaluation of a work, whether in the context of juried reviews or “crits” or any other form of commerce of architectural ideas. That is a common enough conception of how theories are conceived and used. This approach, however common, prompts objection from those who would uphold a non-normative, value-free understanding of what architecture is and does. Let the vision of what should be emerge separately.

That, however, is not the thrust of native architectural theory. Instead, there is a studied, core rejection of objective, non-normative notions of the nature of architectural practices, the roles of architectural creator and spectator, or even what architectural works count as objects of the form. For example, the role of the architect is defined very differently by, say, Sitte (architect as urban planner) or Frampton (architect as articulator of structure)—and architects generally accept that there is no value-free, non-normative fact of the matter. This is not a theory pluralism so much as the view that which theory of the architect’s role (or other aspects of architecture) is viewed as correct depends on one’s context and interests.

A second perspectivalist feature of native architectural theories is that they connect explanatory frameworks with stylistic commitments that bear attendant baggage. Part of this conflation is the tendency to run together the descriptive and the normative, such that if there is a compelling defense of a style (say, postmodernism), then one should build in that style, and vice-versa. Yet we wouldn’t perpetuate all and only styles in favor by critics, and we wouldn’t award contracts to architects with the best critiquing skills in lieu of the best designs. The underlying suggestion is that guidelines for designing built structures are the same guidelines for judging their merits. This view rests on the improbable notion that guidelines for design and judgment are one and the same, related though they may be in connecting style and critical frameworks.

One way to assess the history of native architectural theories is as the progressive effort to better accommodate differing notions of architectural practice and objects. By dint of their varying perspectives, each theory brings a possible piece of a viable account to the table. While it may not be palatable methodologically to accept the integration of analysis and norms for design and evaluation, it is instructive to locate where architectural theories are “situated” by their plainly stated values. Here native theory and its value aspects offer a contrast with conceptual focus in philosophical aesthetics where, at some remove from the practitioner’s role, practical consequences typically do not arise. They must arise, however, for architectural theories more intimately connected to the lives of practicing architects.

This may well be what we want in native architectural theories, given the social and personal utility in the design and realization of architectural objects. We want architects, and architectural critics and historians, to reflect on driving concepts and abstractions that shape our built environment in forward-thinking, planning-oriented fashion. Getting the right prescriptions in architectural thought amounts to a social good, perhaps as a moral imperative.

Rare is the theorist who does not at least make a passing reference to utilitas—socially defined or otherwise. (And, on one reading, firmitas (firmness) just is another brand of Vitruvian utility.) Native architectural theory frequently weds utility to style—hence to our evaluative notions of, for example, beauty. This, too, is a central Vitruvian point, followed by many, if not most, through the present day.

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Copyright © 2015 by
Saul Fisher <>

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