Supplement to Commentators on Aristotle

Andronicus of Rhodes

Andronicus is traditionally credited with the production of the first reliable edition of Aristotle.

Unfortunately, it is not clear what Andronicus edited and how he did it. His reputation as an editor of Aristotle entirely rests on the testimony of Porphyry, who tells us that “Andronicus divided the works of Aristotle and Theophrastus into treatises, collecting related material into the same place” (Porphyry, Life of Plotinus, chapter 24). What is clear is that Andronicus did not provide an authoritative text of Aristotle. Indirect evidence of the absence of such a text is the discussion of alternative textual readings in the subsequent commentary tradition. This discussion suggests that Aristotle’s text remained fluid at least until the end of the 2nd century CE. (For helpful comments on this point, see Hatzimichali 2016: 81–100, especially 94–99).

Following a recent trend in scholarship, we may want to keep Andronicus’ activities of textual criticism and canon or corpus–organization separate (Hatzimichali 2013: 2–17 and Hatzimichali 2016: 81–100). The most important result of this separation is a shift away from his putative edition of Aristotle with a concentration on his activity as organizer of the Aristotelian corpus. Let us review, briefly, what we know about this activity.

We know that Andronicus wrote a catalogue (pinakes) of Aristotle’s writings. This catalogue was in at least five books and was more than just a list of titles. Among other things, it contained also a biography of Aristotle, a transcription of his will, a collection of letters attributed to Aristotle, and a set of notes where Andronicus presumably explained and defended the organization of his catalogue and discussed various issues, including the authenticity of some of the works ascribed to Aristotle. For instance, we know that Andronicus regarded the work On Interpretation (De interpretatione) as spurious. We can safely assume that he discussed his reasons for this view in the context of his pinakes.

The catalogue produced by Andronicus is not extant, but scholars have traditionally invoked the extant catalogue of Ptolemy al-Gharîb, “the unknown” or “the stranger”, for an idea on its contents. The Greek original of this second catalogue is also lost. However, its contents are transmitted by two indirect witnesses (Ibn al Qiftî and Ibn abî Usaibi‘a) and two Arabic manuscripts. A critical edition of this important document is now available (Rashed 2021). In addition to a critical edition of the Arabic text, Marwan Rashed has also produced a French translation plus an in-depth study of its four parts. They are: (1) a prologue where Ptolemy explains the aims of his work, (2) a biography of Aristotle, (3) Aristotle’s will, and (4) a list of Aristotle’s writings.

From the prologue we learn that Ptolemy’s catalogue was written upon the request of an otherwise unknown Gallus, who had an interest in Aristotle but was not able (or willing) to engage in the study of the pinakes produced by Andronicus. As a result, Ptolemy produced his own shorter catalogue, which is addressed to Gallus (Ad Gallum). While shorter, this catalogue need not be an abridgement of the work produced by Andronicus. Marwan Rashed has argued—convincingly, in my view—that Ptolemy did not follow Andronicus and his pinakes. Rather, he relied on a previous (Hellenistic) tradition, which may be identical with the pinakes produced by Hermippus of Smyrna (3rd century BCE) (Rashed 2021: xx-xxviii combined with ccxcviii-cccii) This has an important (though negative) consequence for us: we cannot (and, indeed, should not) use Ptolemy’s catalogue to try to shed light on what Andronicus may have accomplished. But this also means that we have to accept that we know very little (almost nothing) about Andronicus’ pinakes

Among other things, we do not know when and where Andronicus produced his pinakes. The two most recent contributions on this point (Perkams 2019: 445–468, and Rashed 2021: ccciii–ccclxv) have placed a great deal of confidence on a notice on the life and work of Andronicus that goes back to al-Fârâbî’s On the Appearance of Philosophy (preserved only in Ibn Abî ‘Usaibi‘a). This notice tells us that Andronicus worked in Alexandria, and that he followed Augustus from Alexandria to Rome (after the battle of Atium in 31 BCE), where he also completed his pinakes. The notice also ascribes an active role to Augustus, who interested himself in the Alexandrian library and in Aristotle’s books and teaching.

This notice is part of a highly fictionalized account of the transmission of philosophy from the Greeks through the Romans to the Christians (Syrians) and the Arabs. Scholars have known it for a long time. The question has always been—and still is—whether (and eventually how) we can separate reality from fiction in this notice. Put differently, the notice may preserve some historical information—maybe even information we do not find elsewhere—, but it is also likely to be filled with opportunities for confusion and corruption. For instance, it is hard to resist the thought that the name of Augustus stands for that of Sulla and the story of the transfer of the books from Alexandria to Rome stands the story of the transfer of the books from Athens to Rome after Sulla’s sack of Athens.

In sum, I remain skeptical that we can penetrate the darkness surrounding the activity of Andronicus of Rhodes. There is, however, no doubt that the most significant and lasting influence of Andronicus was as organizer of the Aristotelian corpus. He imposed a certain order on this corpus. For instance, he placed the logical writings at the outset of his catalogue and the Categories at the head of the logical writings. The prominent position given to the Categories in the Andronican corpus may have played a significant role in the post-Hellenistic surge of interest in this work (as suggested by Michael Griffin in Griffin 2015).

Without denying that the Andronican catalogue played a significant role in the Post-Hellenistic return to Aristotle, it remains difficult to trace all the Post-Hellenistic interest in the Categories, and the various readings it generated, back to Andronicus and his decision to place the Categories at the outset of his catalogue. For one thing, there is little but clear evidence of an interest in Categories before Andronicus. Quite tellingly, Andronicus criticized an unknown predecessor who argued that the Categories was written for the sake of the Topics and hence should be entitled Before the Topics. For another, a significant philosopher such as Eudorus of Alexandria, who was active in the middle of the the 1st century BCE, may have developed his interest in the Categories independently of Andronicus and for completely different reasons (See Falcon 2018).

The truth is that the information in our possession is frustratingly scarce. We know too little about Andronicus, Eudorus, and the other philosophers active in the 1st century BCE. In some cases, we have no precise dates for their activity. In the end, we must remain mindful of the limits of what can be confidently said by us on state of philosophy in the 1st century BCE.

Copyright © 2021 by
Andrea Falcon <>

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