Supplement to Commentators on Aristotle

Andronicus of Rhodes

Andronicus is traditionally credited with the production of the first reliable edition of Aristotle.

Unfortunately, it is not clear what Andronicus edited and how he did it. His reputation as an editor of Aristotle entirely rests on the testimony of Porphyry, who tells us that “Andronicus divided the works of Aristotle and Theophrastus into treatises, collecting related material into the same place” (Porphyry, Life of Plotinus, chapter 24). What is clear is that Andronicus did not provide an authoritative text of Aristotle. Indirect evidence of the absence of such a text is the discussion of alternative textual readings in the subsequent commentary tradition. This discussion suggests that Aristotle’s text remained fluid at least until the end of the 2nd century CE. (For helpful comments on this point, see Hatzimichali 2016: 81–100, especially 94–99).

Following a recent trend in scholarship, we may want to keep Andronicus’ activities of textual criticism and canon or corpus–organization separate (Hatzimichali 2013: 2–17 and 2016: 81–100). The most important result of this separation is a shift away from his putative edition of Aristotle with a concentration on his activity as organizer of the Aristotelian corpus. Let us review, briefly, what we know about this activity.

We know that Andronicus wrote a catalogue (pinakes) of Aristotle’s and Theophrastus’ writings. This catalogue was in at least five books and was more than just a list of titles. Among other things, it contained also a biography of Aristotle, a transcription of his will, a collection of letters attributed to Aristotle, and a set of notes where Andronicus presumably explained and defended the organization of his catalogue and discussed various issues, including the authenticity of some of the works ascribed to Aristotle and Theophrastus. The catalogue is not extant but we have at least an idea of its contents thanks to the catalogue of Ptolemy al-Gharîb, “the unknown” or “the stranger.” The Greek original of this second catalogue is also lost. However, its contents are transmitted by two indirect witnesses (Ibn al Qiftî and Ibn abî Usaibi‘a), as well as in an Arabic manuscript preserved in Istanbul (Ms. Ayasofya 4833, f. 10a-18a).

A critical edition and translation in any modern language of the Istanbul manuscript is arguably the most urgent desideratum of research into the early transmission of Aristotle s philosophy. Awaiting such an edition and translation, we have to rely on what is currently available. In addition to a partial German translation by Christel Hein (Hein 1985: 416–439, we now have a translation (in German and English) of the preface to the catalogue, where Ptolemy discusses the differences between his catalogue and the one produced by Andronicus (Dietze–Mager 2015: 93–123).

Ptolemy explicitly mentioned Andronicus’ pinakes, and we can safely assume that he used these pinakes as his source of information. Moreover, Ptolemy seems to have provided us with an abregé of what Andronicus produced. For instance, his focus was on Aristotle, to the exclusion of Theophrastus.

There is no doubt that the most significant and lasting influence of Andronicus was as organizer of the Aristotelian corpus. In particular, he imposed a certain order on this corpus. For example, he placed the logical writings at the outset of his catalogue and the Categories at the head of the logical writings. It has recently been argued that the prominent position given to the Categories in the Andronican corpus played a decisive role in the 1st century BCE surge of interest in this work (Griffin 2015).

Without denying that the Andronican catalogue played a role in the 1st century BCE return to Aristotle, it remains difficult to trace all the post-Hellenistic interest in the Categories, and the various readings that it generated, back to Andronicus and his decision to place the Categories at the outset of his catalogue. For one thing, there is little but clear evidence of an interest in Categories before Andronicus. It is telling that Andronicus criticized an unknown predecessor who argued that the Categories was written for the sake of the Topics and hence should be entitled Before the Topics. For another, a significant philosopher such as Eudorus of Alexandria, who was active in the middle of the the 1st century BCE, may have developed his interest in the Categories independently of Andronicus and for completely different reasons.

The truth is that the information in our possession is frustratingly scarce. We know too little about Andronicus, Eudorus, and other philosophers active in the 1st century BCE. In some cases, we have no precise dates for their activity. Consider, again, the case of Andronicus. According to one line of reasoning, his activity is to be dated to the 60s (Gottschalk 1987: 1095–1096) or even to the late 70s (Moraux 1973: 5–55). According to another, it should be dated after Cicero’s death (44 BCE), and most likely in the 30s (Düring 1957: 420–425). Obviously, it would make a great difference if we could safely date his activity to the first rather than the second half of the 1st century BCE. Among other things, it would make more plausible the thesis that the 1st century BCE surge of interest in the Categories can be traced back to Andronicus. Unfortunately, here we have reached the limit of what can be said on the basis of the extant evidence.

Copyright © 2017 by
Andrea Falcon <afalcon@alcor.concordia.ca>

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