Supplement to Aristotle and Mathematics

Aristotle and First Principles in Greek Mathematics

It has long been a tradition to read Aristotle's treatment of first principles as reflected in the first principles of Euclid's Elements I. There are similarities and differences. Euclid divides his principles into Definitions (horoi), Postulates (aitêmata), and Common Notions (koinai ennoiai). The definitions are a grab bag of claims, some of which have the form of stipulations and some of which include several assertions which are not definitions, such as the claim (def. 17) that a diameter divides a circle in half, as well as pairs of definitions, where one can easily be read as a claim (e.g., def. 2: "A line is breadthless length," and def. 3, "The extremities of a line are points" or def. 6, "The extremities of a surface are lines."). Euclid's five postulates include three construction rules. Many have seen these as corresponding to Aristotle's hypotheses of existence. The other two, that right angles are equal and the parallel postulate, are not. This is not an objection to a correlation if existence assumptions in geometry for Aristotle are construction assumptions and if not all hypotheses are existence assumptions. Finally, all but one of the common notions do correspond to some of Aristotle's axioms, with the possible exception of claim (8) that things which coincide are equal. Yet this too could be conceived as applying equally to geometrical figures and to numbers. In any case, it may not have been in the original text. Nonetheless, this correspondence between Aristotle's conception of first principles and Euclid's in Elements I is tenuous at best. Elsewhere in Greek mathematics, and even in the Elements, we find other treatments of first principles, some of which are closer in other ways to Aristotle's conceptions. For example, Archimedes' On the Sphere and Cylinder opens with existence hypotheses (that certain lines exist) and stipulations (that they should be called such-and-such).

A more fundamental distinction between Aristotle's treatment of first principles and those found in Greek mathematics is that Aristotle seems to think that each first principle has both a logical and an explanatory role in a treatise. Yet it is typical, especially in treatises which are introductory to a topic, to have principles which serve a logical and explanatory role, but also to have principles whose only explicit role is pedagogical. For they serve no obvious role in the demonstrations. Such might be the definitions of point and line in Elements I. Hence, if there is a relation between Aristotle's conception of first principles and those of the mathematicians, Aristotle provides an ideal framework based on contemporary mathematical practice and which may or may not have been noticed by authors such as Euclid.

Copyright © 2004 by
Henry Mendell <>

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