Supplement to Aristotle’s Metaphysics

Nonsubstantial Particulars

The precise nature of particulars in nonsubstance categories has been, and remains, a matter of considerable controversy. According to the traditional account (cf. Ackrill 1963), by “the particular white” (or “a certain white”, to ti leukon) Aristotle means a trope, something that is unique to the individual substance in which it inheres and is not repeatable elsewhere. If a particular white is in Socrates, then it is not in anything else. Indeed, even if Callias is of exactly the same shade of color as Socrates, the particular white in Callias is an entity distinct from the particular white in Socrates — they are two numerically distinct but qualitatively identical tropes. An alternative account (initially championed by Owen 1965a) takes “the particular white” to denote a repeatable entity: a fully determinate universal that is capable of being shared by distinct substances. It is only a particular in the sense that it is not essentially predicated (‘said of’) anything else in its own category. That is, a particular white is a fully determinate shade of color, rather than a determinable such as white, which is a generic classification of various determinate shades of white.

At the center of the controversy is the interpretation of Aristotle’s definition of ‘in’. At Cat. 1a25 he says “by ‘in a subject’ I mean what is in something, not as a part, and cannot exist separately from what it is in.” The definition is clearly ambiguous. On the one hand, it might mean that what is ‘in’ a particular subject is incapable of existing separately from that subject. This is Ackrill’s understanding:

x is in y =df
(a) x belongs to y, and
(b) x is not a part of y, and
(c) x cannot exist separately from y.

On this understanding, the only thing that can, strictly speaking, be ‘in’ a particular subject (e.g., Socrates) is something that cannot exist separately from that subject. The color ‘in’ Socrates, in this sense, could not exist ‘in’ anything else. Indeed, the only thing that can be ‘in’ a particular substance, in this sense, is something that cannot exist separately from that substance.

The problem for this reading of Aristotle’s definition is that specific or generic universals (such as white and color) could not be ‘in’ a particular substance; color could not be ‘in’ Socrates because color can surely exist separately from Socrates. Yet Aristotle says (2b2) that “color is in body, and therefore in an individual body (for if it were not in any individual, it would not be in body at all).” Unless Aristotle is speaking carelessly here (as Ackrill supposes), his claim cannot be consistent with the definition of ‘in’, as Ackrill interprets it.

A second reading of Aristotle’s definition is Owen’s:

x is in y =df
(a) x belongs to y, and
(b) x is not a part of y, and
(c) x cannot exist on its own (i.e., x cannot exist unless there is something z such that x belongs to z)

On this understanding, it is possible for a generic quality, such as white or color, to be ‘in’ a particular substance. The reason that white can be ‘in’ Socrates (as well as in other individuals) is that white belongs to (i.e., is a property of) Socrates, not a part of him, and is incapable of existing unless it belongs to some substance or other.

A third reading of Aristotle’s definition is that of Frede 1987:

x is in something as its subject =df
There is a subject, y, such that
    (a) x is not a part of y, and
    (b) x cannot exist independently of y.

Frede’s reading is different from the other two in some ways, yet shares features of each. One difference is that Frede takes ‘part’ to mean conceptual part, i.e., part of the definition. Since clause (a) thus tells us that x is not part of the definition of y, clauses (a) and (b) together guarantee that x belongs accidentally to y. A more important difference for present purposes is that on Frede’s reading Aristotle is defining the one-place predicate ‘x is in a subject’, not the two-place predicate ‘x is in y’. That is, he is defining what it is to be an accident, the sort of thing that is ‘in’ a subject, rather than what it is for x to be ‘in’ y. This reading, like Owen’s, allows a generic quality, such as white or color, to be ‘in’ a particular substance. White can be ‘in’ Socrates because it is an accident (i.e., it is an ‘in a subject’ sort of thing) and belongs to (i.e., is an accident of) Socrates. Yet, like Ackrill’s, it has a specific “inseparability” requirement. That is, in order for x to be an accident, there must be some sort of thing that x is incapable of existing separately from. In the case of color, that thing is body.

There is a vast literature on this dispute. See, in addition to Ackrill 1963, Owen 1965a, and Frede 1987: Matthews and Cohen 1968, Allen 1969, Duerlinger 1970, Jones 1972, Annas 1974, Hartman 1977, Granger 1980, Heinaman 1981a, Matthews 1989, Devereux 1992, Wedin 1993, and Aranyosi 2004.

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