Supplement to Aristotle’s Political Theory

Characteristics and Problems of Aristotle’s Politics

The work which has come down to us under the title POLITIKA appears to be less an integrated treatise than a loosely related collection of essays or lectures on various topics in political philosophy, which may have been compiled by a later editor rather than by Aristotle. The following topics are discussed in the eight books:

I Naturalness of the city-state and of the household

II Critique of ostensibly best constitutions

III General theory of constitutions

IV Inferior constitutions

V Preservation and destruction of constitutions

VI Further discussion of democracy and oligarchy

VII–VIII Unfinished outline of the best constitution

This ordering of the books reflects, very roughly, the program for the study of constitutions which concludes the Nicomachean Ethics:

First, then, if any particular point has been treated well by those who have gone before us, we must try to review it; then from the constitutions that have been collected we must try to see what it is that preserves and destroys each of the constitutions, and for what reasons some city-states are well governed and others the reverse. For when these things have been examined, we will perhaps better understand what sort of constitution is best, and how each is structured, and which laws and customs it uses. Let us then begin our discussion. [X.9.1181b15–23]

However, scholars have raised several general problems concerning the Politics and its place in Aristotle’s philosophical system. Four issues are especially noteworthy: How did Aristotle intend for the Politics to be organized? In what order did he write the different books within the Politics? Is the work considered as a whole consistent? How is the Politics related to Aristotle’s ethical treatises?

(1) The intended organization of the Politics Some scholars (including W. L. Newman) have questioned the traditional ordering of the eight books of the Politics, arguing that the discussion of the best constitution (books VII–VIII) should follow directly after book III. Indeed, book III concludes with a transition to a discussion of the best constitution (although this may be due to a later editor). However, cross-references between various passages of the Politics indicate that books IV–V–VI form a connected series, as do books VII–VIII, but these series do not refer to each other. Nonetheless, both series refer back to book III which in turn refers to book I. Moreover, book II refers back to book I and refers forward to both series. With some oversimplification, then, the Politics is comparable to a tree trunk supporting two separate branches: the root system is I, the trunk is II–III, and the branches are IV–V–VI and VII–VIII. (The summary at the end of Nicomachean Ethics X.9 describes only the visible part of the tree.) All modern critical editions and most translations and commentaries follow the traditional ordering of the books. Noteworthy exceptions are Newman’s commentary and Simpson’s translation, which follow the revised ordering: I—II—III—VII—VIII—IV—V—VI.

(2) The order of composition This problem concerns the order in which the books were actually written. If they were composed at very different dates, they might represent discordant stages in the development of Aristotle’s political philosophy. For example, Werner Jaeger argued that books VII–VIII contain a youthful utopianism, motivating Aristotle to emulate his teacher Plato in erecting “an ideal state by logical construction.” In contrast, books IV–VI are based on “sober empirical study.” Other scholars have seen a more pragmatic, even Machiavellian approach to politics in books IV–VI. A difficulty for this interpretation is that in book IV Aristotle regards the business of constructing ideal constitutions as perfectly compatible with that of addressing actual political problems. Although much ink has been spilled since Jaeger attempted to discern different chronological strata in the Politics, it has resulted in no clear scholarly consensus. Because there is no explicit evidence of the dates at which the various books of the Politics were written, argument has turned on alleged discrepancies between different passages.

(3) The internal consistency of the Politics This leads to the question whether there are major inconsistencies of doctrine or method in the Politics. For example, Aristotle’s account of the best constitution assumes his theory of justice, a moral standard which cannot be met by the actual political systems (democracies and oligarchies) of his own day. He does discuss practical political reforms in books IV–VI but more in terms of stability than justice. Some commentators view books IV–VI as a radical departure from the political philosophy of the other books, while others find a great deal of coherence among the books. Resolution of this problem requires careful study of the Politics as a whole.

(4) The relation of the Politics to the ethical works The last problem concerns the complex relationship between Aristotle’s Politics and his two treatises dealing with ethical matters: the Nicomachean Ethics and Eudemian Ethics. Although commentators often treat the ethical works in separation from the Politics, the Nicomachean Ethics represents itself as concerned with politics (hê politikê, EN I.2.1094a27, 1094b10–11; 4.1095a15–16; I.13.1102a12–13), and the Eudemian Ethics suggests circumspectly that it is a philosophical inquiry concerned with “political affairs” (ta politika, EE I.5.1216b37). More explicitly, the Magna Moralia in its opening lines states that the study of ethical affairs belongs to politics (politikê) and denies that there is a separate field of ethics (êthikê) (MM I.1.1181a26–1182a1). But this work was probably written not by Aristotle himself but by an early Peripatetic. The question of how Aristotle’s political views relate to his ethical views is further complicated by various problems concerning the relationship between the Nicomachean Ethics and Eudemian Ethics (see the entry on Aristotle’s ethics).

It is noteworthy that the Politics contains six explicit references to “the ethical discourses” (êthikê logoi), which most scholars view as references either to the Eudemian Ethics or to the book on justice claimed by both the Eudemian Ethics and Nicomachean Ethics (EE IV=EN V). These passage discuss principles concerning themes that are fundamental to the argument of the Politics, and are as follows:

Politics Passage in ethical works Topic
II.2.1261a31 EE IV=EN V.5.1132b31–4 Reciprocal justice preserves the polis
III.9.1280a18 EE IV=EN V.3.1131a15–24 Distributive justice involves equality.
III.12.1282b20 EE IV=EN V.3.1131a24–9 Political justice involves equal merit.
IV.11.1295a36 EE VI=EN VII.13.1153b9–19 Happiness is unimpeded and virtue is a mean.
VII.13.1332a8 EE II.1.1218b31–1219a39 Happiness is the activity and employment of virtue.
VII.13.1332a22 EE VIII.3.1249a10–17 Goods without qualification are good to the virtuous person.

The many parallels and commonalities between the Politics and the ethical works are discussed in a number of recent works (see especially Bibliography E.2 Methodology and Foundations of Aristotle’s Political Theory).

Return to Aristotle’s Politics [Section 1]
Return to Aristotle’s Politics [Section 4]

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