Supplement to Aristotle's Political Theory

Political Naturalism

Aristotle lays the foundations for his political theory in Politics book I by arguing that the city-state and political rule are “natural.” The argument begins with a schematic, quasi-historical account of the development of the city-state out of simpler communities. First, individual human beings combined in pairs because they could not exist apart. The male and female joined in order to reproduce, and the master and slave came together for self-preservation. The natural master used his intellect to rule, and the natural slave employed his body to labor. Second, the household arose naturally from these primitive communities in order to serve everyday needs. Third, when several households combined for further needs a village emerged also according to nature. Finally, “the complete community, formed from several villages, is a city-state, which at once attains the limit of self-sufficiency, roughly speaking. It comes to be for the sake of life, and exists for the sake of the good life” (I.2.1252b27–30).

Aristotle defends three claims about nature and the city-state: First, the city-state exists by nature, because it comes to be out of the more primitive natural associations and it serves as their end, because it alone attains self-sufficiency (1252b30-1253a1). Second, human beings are by nature political animals, because nature, which does nothing in vain, has equipped them with speech, which enables them to communicate moral concepts such as justice which are formative of the household and city-state (1253a1-18). Third, the city-state is naturally prior to the individuals, because individuals cannot perform their natural functions apart from the city-state, since they are not self-sufficient (1253a18-29). These three claims are conjoined, however, with a fourth: the city-state is a creation of human intelligence. “Therefore, everyone naturally has the impulse for such a [political] community, but the person who first established [it] is the cause of very great benefits.” This great benefactor is evidently the lawgiver (nomothetês), for the legal system of the city-state makes human beings just and virtuous and lifts them from the savagery and bestiality in which they would otherwise languish (1253a29–39).

Aristotle's political naturalism presents the difficulty that he does not explain how he is using the term “nature” (phusis). In the Physics nature is understood as an internal principle of motion or rest (see III.1.192b8–15). (For discussion of nature see Aristotle's Physics.) If the city-state were natural in this sense, it would resemble a plant or an animal which grows naturally to maturity out of a seed. However, this seemingly cannot be reconciled with the important role which Aristotle also assigns to the lawgiver as the one who established the city-state. For on Aristotle's theory a thing either exists by nature or by craft; it cannot do both. (This difficulty is posed by David Keyt.) One way to escape this dilemma is to suppose that he speaks of the city-state as “natural” in special sense of the term. For example, he might mean that it is “natural” in the extended sense that it arises from human natural inclinations (to live in communities) for the sake of human natural ends, but that it remains unfinished until a lawgiver provides it with a constitution. (This solution was proposed by Ernest Barker and defended subsequently by Fred Miller and Trevor Saunders.) Another way of solving the dilemma is to understand legislation as an “internal movement” of the city-state rather than the activity of an external agent. (This approach is defended recently by Adriel Trott.)

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