Supplement to Aristotle’s Psychology

Method in Psychology

These reflections on method in psychology bring into focus Aristotle’s decision to describe psychic phenomena in terms of his broader explanatory framework: he articulates his account of the soul and its faculties as special cases of his general hylomorphism. That is fair enough as far is it goes, because, as we see in the coming sections, Aristotle most definitely does articulate his positive account of the soul in hylomorphic terms, beginning in the second book of De Anima. To some extent, however, this approach runs the risk of skewing our understanding of Aristotle’s positive doctrine. This is because it tends to discount another, complementary approach to Aristotle’s psychology, namely the approach he himself adopts in the first book of De Anima. In De Anima i Aristotle engages his aporetic and endoxic methods, that is, his characteristic methods of approaching a complex issue by laying out the problems (the aporiai) he sees as requiring attention and then surveying the theories already advanced by his predecessors (the reputable opinions, or endoxa.) (For more on Aristotle’s method, see §3 of the main entry on Aristotle). The comparatively neglected first book of De Anima provides a textbook approach of these methods, including especially the endoxic method. The vast majority of it is given over to a critical recounting of the views advanced by Aristotle’s predecessors, many but not all of whom he regards as worthy of investigation in so far as they teach something of value about the soul and its capacities.

When we read De Anima i carefully, two things become clear. First, Aristotle has a specific agenda in psychology, set forth in a series of questions which condition the direction and character of his investigations. Second, his critical remarks reveal what he thinks is lacking in the approaches to the soul adopted by his predecessors, and so also, by implication, what he takes himself to have accomplished by the time he has completed his own preferred account. Reflecting on De Anima i thus permits us to understand Aristotle’s positive doctrine by taking into consideration the ways in which Aristotle himself frames his study—its problems, its central lines of inquiry, and his expectations about what must be accomplished in a successful psychological theory.

Taking up the first point, reflection on the questions Aristotle takes as salient for his inquiry into the soul reveals how he directs and delimits the scope of his inquiry. That is, his selection of questions does more than reflect his local preoccupations. Rather, it reveals what he thinks an adequate account must accomplish. In this respect, Aristotle’s situation with the soul is rather like, for instance, the situation we face today in framing any inquiry into the nature of consciousness. The questions we ask both set our agenda and reveal our implicit success conditions. One researcher might take her task to be the determination of the frequency of synchronic neural oscillation patterns in conscious activity. Having determined that conscious activity correlates strongly with neural oscillation frequencies in the 40 Hz range, she will have met with success in her own terms. Another researcher, by contrast, might take as his dominant task an explication of how the first-person qualitative feel of a subject’s mental states can be accommodated within a fully physicalist account of the mind. Success here would not consist in, for instance, charting correlations in oscillation frequencies. Different questions yield different research programs and so also different success conditions.

Aristotle opens De Anima by setting forth in exceptionally clear terms the questions of concern to him in psychological theory:

It is presumably first of all necessary to determine the genus of the soul and what it is. I mean whether it is some this—that is, a substance—or a quality, or a quantity, or something in some one of the other delineated categories. Further, it is necessary to determine whether it is one of the things which exist in potentiality or whether it is, rather, an actuality. For this makes no small difference. One must also consider whether it has parts or is without parts, and whether or not all souls are uniform in kind, or if not whether they differ in species or in genus. For as things are, those discussing and inquiring into the soul would seem to consider only the human soul.

And one must take care not to overlook the question of whether there is one account of soul, as there is one account of animal, or whether there is a different account for each type of soul, for example, of horse, of dog, of man, of god, while the universal animal is either nothing or is posterior to these; and it would be the same if any other common thing were being predicated.

Further, if there are not many souls but rather the soul has parts, one must determine whether it is necessary to inquire first into the soul as a whole or into its parts. It is also difficult to determine which of the parts differ by nature from one another, as well as whether one ought to inquire into the parts or their functions first, for example, whether one ought to inquire first into reasoning or reason, or into perceiving or the perceptive faculty, and so on for the other parts. And if one ought to inquire first into their functions, someone might raise a puzzle (aporia) as to whether one must inquire into their corresponding objects before these, for example, into the objects of perception before the faculty of perception, and the objects of reason before reason (DA i, 402a23-b16).

One can appreciate Aristotle’s forthrightness in laying out his agenda so clearly, even while asking from a certain remove whether his questions are the right ones to be posing about the soul.

In sum, his questions are these:

  • To what category of being does the soul belong? Is it, for instance, a substance, a basic being, or is it rather a quality belonging to a substance or a quantity of some sort? We may note that, as posed, Aristotle’s first question presupposes that souls do in fact exist. In this respect, his question may be contrasted with the similarly categorial questions he poses elsewhere, as, for instance, about time in Physics iv 10–14, where finding a categorial home for time also serves to reaffirm its existence (he thinks time is a measure of motion, and so in the category of quantity). In the Physics, then, Aristotle takes it as an open question as to whether time exists at all; by contrast, in De Anima, be takes it for granted that the soul exists and wants to know only what kind of thing it is.

  • What is the soul’s modality of being? Does it exist in potentiality or in actuality? Such a question opens up the possibility that the soul might be a mere capacity of a body, like, for instance, someone’s ability to swim: a person able to swim is actually swimming only sometimes, but once she has learnt to swim she has the capacity to swim all the while, even when it is unexercised. Is the soul relevantly like the ability to swim, a capacity belonging to something else which becomes manifest only when exercised?

  • Does the soul have parts? At first glance, this seems to be a question about psychic mereology, asking, for instance, whether the soul is tri-partite, as Plato had maintained in Republic iv. It does indeed have this focus, but upon closer inspection one sees that Aristotle is equally interested in some further issues as well. Is there is a single genus of soul to which all souls belong? Or should we think that different kinds of beings—dogs, humans, gods—have different kinds of souls, which might be related as species falling under the same genus but, then again, might not? One way to understand the way in which his concern about mereology merges into a question about the possibility of there being a single genus of soul turns on the fact that different kinds of souls have different kinds of faculties, or, broadly speaking, different kinds of parts. According to Aristotle, both non-human animals and humans have the capacity to perceive but only humans have reason. The fact that animals have one of these capacities (perception) without the other (reason) might reinforce the idea that perception and reason are parts of the human soul, but that then raises the question of whether these two souls—the one with reason and perception and the one with perception alone—might not be two species of the same genus. On the one hand, one sort of soul seems in some sense to contain the other, which is not the normal situation with two species of a single genus. On the other hand, one might wonder whether there is one kind of soul, the perceptual soul, which is distinct in kind from the other, the rational soul, such that they are two species of the same genus, differentiated precisely by the presence of reason in one of them. In this way, questions of mereology link up with taxonomical questions that need to be pursued.

  • Back on the more narrowly mereological side of the question, assuming that individual souls do have parts, one will need to determine whether these parts differ from one another by nature—for instance, whether perception and imagination are discrete faculties—or are rather ‘parts’ differentiated only as a kind of explanatory convenience, as when a school teacher divides her pupils into ‘the eager and the reluctant’. She may well be tracking something, but it seems hard to credit the suggestion that this sort of division corresponds to a division in nature.

  • Also wrapped up in this question, as Aristotle makes clear, is the issue of whether the soul admits of a univocal definition, that is, a single, non-disjunctive essence-specifying account, like animal, or whether ‘… has a soul’ is rather like ‘…is good’ when predicated of an opera singer, some ice-cream, and a proposal to reform the economy. Perhaps, in this case, as we should not be seeking a single account of goodness, we should not be seeking a single account of soul. (For more on univocity, see §5 of the main entry on Aristotle.)

  • Further on the question of mereology, and still assuming that the soul does have parts, should one first characterize the whole soul and then its parts? Or should one begin with the parts first and then build an account of soul more generally on that basis?

  • Still further along in the same vein, if one should in fact look to the parts before looking to the whole, should one begin with the parts themselves or should one rather examine their activities at the outset? That is, assuming the soul has a part call ‘reason’ (or mind, or intellect, nous), is the right order of business first to discuss reasoning and thereafter the faculty of reason, or should one think first about the nature of reason as a faculty before moving on to an examination of its characteristic activities?

  • Finally, assuming that one should focus first on the activities of the soul’s parts, should one direct one’s attention in the first instance to the objects over which those activities range? That is, should one think first about the differences between, say, the objects of reason and the objects of perception, before moving on to characterize reasoning and perceiving?

  • The final question leads in a characteristic fashion to a puzzle (an aporia): if it is the case that faculties are individuated by their objects—we say that vision is that faculty which detects color, while smelling is that faculty which detects scent—how do we go about identifying these objects without having first identified the capacities with which they are associated? Is scent anything other than an object of smell? If not, then we must already have some notion about how the faculty of smell operates, so that we can individuate scents from other sensible qualities. After all, among the sensible qualities of a rose, damask is a scent and redness is not; only one of these is thus a candidate for detection by the sense of smell.

This puzzle then gives way to a series of additional puzzles, which corporately make any inquiry into the soul especially daunting. In view of these methodological hurdles, one can appreciate why Aristotle registers a genuine conundrum: ‘even if the method [of investigating the soul] should be evident, whether it is demonstration or division or even some other method, the question of where one ought to begin our inquiry already involves many difficulties and quandaries (DA i, 402a19–22).

Aristotle’s characteristic way forward when confronting such puzzles and impediments, whether substantive or methodological, is to engage in his endoxic method. This he does very clearly in De Anima i—which brings us to our second reason for reflecting first on that book before turning to the more often discussed material of the following two books, where we encounter Aristotle’s positive theory of the soul and its capacities. If it seems anodyne to recommend that we read the first book before the second, it is perhaps worth remembering that even otherwise excellent translations sometimes omit some or all of De Anima i, as being merely doxographical. Still, when we do read it, we discover in that doxography Aristotle’s investigations into a broad spectrum of views, beginning with those of Thales and ranging right up to Plato, whose account of reason (nous) in the Timaeus commands his special interest. He initially endorses two principal commitments which he represents his predecessors as being virtually unanimous in accepting:

What is ensouled seems to differ from what is not ensouled chiefly in two respects: motion and perception. These are also very nearly the two features of the soul which we have taken over from our predecessors (DA i 2, 403b25–27).

So much seems more or less unexciting, until it emerges that Aristotle argues repeatedly that his predecessors had made a common mistake when thinking about motion, namely that only what is already in motion can initiate motion. This mistake, he implies, inclines them to think of the soul in crudely materialistic terms, since they are looking to explain motion by positing something which is itself in motion, which we would expect to be some manner of material body. So, for instance, he chastises the atomist Democritus for making this sort of error:

Some say that as the soul is in motion; it moves the body in which it is, e.g. Democritus, speaking in a manner much like the comic playwright Philippus. For Philippus claims that Daedalus made his wooden Aphrodite move by pouring liquid silver into it. What Democritus says is similar. He claims that since the indivisible spheres are in motion, because it is their nature never to remain still, they draw the whole body along with them and set it in motion (DA i 3, 406b15–21).

Notably, in rejecting the claim that the soul must be in motion to initiate motion, Aristotle incurs a large debt. He must now explain how the soul can manage to initiate motion without being itself in motion. In the course of De Anima i he offers only the observation that ‘the soul does not appear to initiate motion in animals in this way, but rather through some sort of decision and reasoning’ (DA i 3, 406b24–25). This is fair enough where the first book is concerned, since it is primarily aporetic and endoxic. Still, a question arises as to how—and how well—Aristotle means to account for the soul’s ability to cause motion. Needless to say, this account must supersede the criticisms he lays at the doorsteps of his various predecessors.

Of special note in this connection is Aristotle’s reaction to the doctrine that the soul is an attunement (or harmony, harmonia), which he takes up in detail in De Anima i 4. As Aristotle notes, this is a view that had already occasioned a good deal of discussion (DA i 4, 407b27–29), and we find one such discussion presented in Plato’s Phaedo. Although the doctrine of attunement admits of various formulations, its basic contours are clear enough: in its terms, the soul is to be identified with neither the material components of the body, as the Presocratic materialists had thought, nor as an incorporeal entity capable of existing without the body, as Plato had urged in the Phaedo. Instead, it is something in-between: as the attunement of a viola is neither the parts of the viola nor even the viola taken as a whole but rather a condition of the viola, so the soul is neither the material elements making up the body nor the body taken as a whole but rather a condition or structure of the body. In neither case should we suppose that being non-identical with the body or its parts suffices for a something to exist apart from the body. As the attunement of a viola ends when the viola goes out of existence, so too does the soul cease when the body ceases. The soul, suggests Aristotle, exists when and only when the body whose soul it is exists.

Given his aim of finding a middle way between the reductive tendencies of the Presocratic materialists and Platonic dualism, the attunement theory ought to appear attractive to Aristotle. Indeed, as was noticed already in antiquity, it bears a striking resemblance to his own preferred hylomorphism. The Aristotelian commentator Themistius (317–390 C.E.) fairly observes in this connection: ‘It is clear…that those calling the soul an attunement would seem to land neither excessively near nor very far off from the truth’ (in DA 25, 23–24). Especially apposite here is the contention that proponents of the attunement do not land ‘excessively near…the truth’, which truth is, presumably, encapsulated in Aristotle’s hylomorphism. The question thus arises: how does it fall short of hylomorphism? Looked at from the opposite direction, why is Aristotle’s preferred hylomorphism itself not just a notational variant of the attunement theory made to seem distinct only by being articulated in Aristotle’s preferred technical terminology? Here too Aristotle incurs a debt which must be repaid when advancing his preferred account of soul. How, precisely, does Aristotle’s hylomorphism improve upon—if indeed it does improve upon—the attunement theory of soul?

Aristotle does have answers to these questions, but they are not always on the surface of his positive account. We see, then, that to understand how he conceives of the soul and its relation to the body, we should attend closely to Aristotle’s criticisms of his predecessors. These tell us both what in his view a successful theory of soul must accomplish and also what pitfalls it must avoid.

Copyright © 2020 by
Christopher Shields <>

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