Notes to Aristotle’s Psychology

Notes to The Active Mind of De Anima iii 5

1. For useful collections of references to a representative sample of the voluminous literature on this chapter, see Wedin (1988, 160–1 nn. 1–4) and Caston (1999, 199 n.1). For a somewhat older but still extremely valuable collection of interpretations, see Hicks (1907).

2. Aquinas develops this approach instructively. See his In de anima 730.

3. This approach finds a powerful advocate in Alexander of Aphrosias, in De An. 88.10–16. Some modern scholars who regard hylomorphism as incompatible with personal immortality: Jaeger (1948), Nuyens (1948), and Dancy (1996).

4. The bracketed text recurs in its entirety at DA iii 7, 431a1–4. It seems likely that they were inserted by a scribe seeking to provide an explanation of the way in which the active is prior to the passive.

5. Hicks (1907, 509–510) provides a succinct summary of the main approaches, before opting for a version of (ii) as his own preference. As he notes, most ancient commentators opted for (iv), because they took Aristotle to be explaining his otherwise obscure remark about memory in the previous line. See, e.g. Themistius In de an. 101.27 and Philoponus In de an. 62.1.

Copyright © 2020 by
Christopher Shields <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free