Notes to Bell’s Theorem

1. The terminology of “contextualistic” hidden-variables theories was introduced by Shimony (1971). This was shortened to “contextual” and “noncontextual” in the doctoral dissertation of Stuart J. Freedman (1972), and in Clauser and Shimony (1978).

2. It should be emphasized that their argument does not depend upon counter-factual reasoning, that is, reasoning about what would be observed if a quantity were measured other than the one that was in fact measured. For two papers which argue that EPR did not depend upon counterfactual reasoning but only upon ordinary induction, see d’Espagnat (1984) and Shimony (2001).

3. Clauser, Horne, Shimony, and Holt (1969) assume a deterministic hidden variables theory but use no quantum mechanical information for the purpose of deriving an inequality. Bell (1971) proves an inequality in the framework of a stochastic hidden variables theory and makes no use of quantum mechanical information for this purpose. Clauser and Horne (1974) prove a mathematical lemma in order to simplify the derivation of the CH inequality, and Aspect (appendix of 1983) adapts the lemma for the purpose of simplifying the proof of the CHSH Inequality (12). Aspect’s proof of the inequality remains valid when there are more than two exit channels from each analyzer, as does that of Mermin (1986).

4. Note that we are not assuming that the settings themselves are to be treated as variables to which probabilities can be attached. What is being assumed is that, for each pair of settings \(a, b\), and every \(\lambda\), there is a probability distribution over outcome pairs in \(S_a\times T_b\).

5. Although OD is not being assumed, a theorem of Fine (1982b,c) shows that it would do no harm to assume it. Fine showed that the following are equivalent: (1) There is a deterministic hidden-variables model for the experiment. (2) There is a factorizable, stochastic model. (3) There is one joint distribution for all observables of the experiment, returning the experimental probabilities. (4) There are well-defined, compatible joint distributions for all pairs and triples of commuting and noncommuting observables. (5) The Bell inequalities hold.

6. Whether outcome determinism is being assumed as a premise of the 1964 argument or derived has been a matter of some controversy; see Wiseman (2014), Norsen (2015), Wiseman and Rieffel (2015), Wiseman and Cavalcanti (2017).

7. Shimony (1993, 139), who had previously endorsed Jarrett’s argument, reports that the need for assumption of the controllability of the complete state \(\lambda\) was pointed out to him by David Albert and Sheldon Goldstein. See also Maudlin (1994, 96; 2002, 96; 2011; 88).

8. The independent development of this result by Kochen is reported, as a private communication, by Redhead (Redhead and Brown 1991, 126).

9. Don’t be misled: “absolute randomness” in this sense is compatible with determinism of the underlying physics. Applied to a theory such as the de Broglie-Bohm theory, on which there is determinism and superluminal causation at the fundamental level, the claim is that, if agents are unable to exploit the underlying physics for superluminal signalling, this implies limitations on the information available to them of the underlying physical states of things, in such a way that they cannot predict the results of experiments with a higher degree of certainty than that yielded by the quantum mechanical probabilities for the outcomes of those experiments.

Copyright © 2019 by
Wayne Myrvold <>
Marco Genovese <>
Abner Shimony

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