Supplement to Developmental Biology

Model Organisms and Manipulation

Because model organisms in developmental biology are used for experimental intervention, questions of representation (is the mechanism of zebrafish somite formation a good proxy for the mechanism of vertebrate somite formation?) must be juxtaposed with questions of manipulation (how easily and diversely can zebrafish somite formation be experimentally manipulated?). When Slack describes the advantages of the standard animal models of development, manipulation is priority number one:

The six model species have each been selected because they have some particular experimental advantages for developmental biology research. (Slack 2006: 61, my emphasis)

The criterion of manipulation might seem orthogonal to the criterion of representation, but there are potential interactions between the two. For example, if a model organism represents a variety of developmental mechanisms but some of these mechanisms are not easily manipulable, then this can have an impact on its selection and use. The inability to apply many genetic methods to chick embryos has diminished their role as model organisms over the past decade, though they still are used widely and justified in terms of manipulation. Manipulation might even trump representation in some circumstances.

One critical distinction is the difference between how easy it is to initiate an experimental regime with a model organism (“initial set-up”) and how easy it is to prosecute different experimental techniques (“execution”). The establishment of a model organism requires many resources. Some have a long history (chick), whereas others were recently adopted (zebrafish). But in all cases there is a substantial investment of time, energy, and skill to make them usable. We can subdivide the aspect of initial set-up into a category corresponding to “availability and cost” and another category pertaining to “infrastructural prerequisites.” If a model organism does not have regular and frequent breeding, along with short gestational periods, then it will be difficult to harvest the necessary stock of embryos at different stages for developmental investigation. Even if these conditions are met, it will do no good if this cannot be accomplished on a standardized scale of cost that can be budgeted for in a routine fashion. Availability and cost clearly interact with infrastructure; the ability to have animal embryos on hand at a low per unit cost is affected by the infrastructure available (e.g., zebrafish tanks). Relevant infrastructure is constructed piecemeal as a model organism is being selected and used, often as a way to decrease costs or standardize availability (e.g., stock centers). The representational appeal of new model organisms and the ability to adapt existing experimental protocols does not supersede availability/cost and infrastructure considerations (Crotty and Gann 2009; Slack 2009).

A second aspect of the manipulation criterion is execution, which can be subdivided into “assortment” (how many different experimental manipulations are possible?) and “speed” (how quickly can these experimental manipulations be accomplished to procure data?). These subdivisions make it clear that execution is dependent on considerations derived from initial set-up. One will not have the opportunity to discover an assortment of experimental manipulations if availability and cost are prohibitive or infrastructure is limiting, such as insufficient capacity to house enough animals to do targeted breeding or invest in sequencing the genome. However, assortment and speed articulate with the other practical prerequisites (e.g., the ease of obtaining all stages of development and micromanipulation). Without full access, certain kinds of experimental interventions will not be possible (i.e., assortment is reduced). If micromanipulation of one kind or another is difficult, the speed of execution will be diminished. Assortment and speed relate to each another because one intervention technique might be easy to accomplish in a reasonable time frame, whereas another cannot. In general, model organisms are selected and used in such a way as to maximize both assortment and speed, but many trade-offs exist. Microsurgical embryonic manipulations in the chick can be speedy by comparison to Drosophila, but Drosophila can be genetically manipulated much more easily (and speedily).

Although assessments of aspects of the representational criterion appear distinct from assessments of aspects of the manipulation criterion, the two criteria can interact substantively. The ability of a model to represent may not correlate with a model’s manipulability (and vice versa), either for phenomena or mechanisms. One place where the interaction could be significant is when manipulation enhances or diminishes representation. Most discussions have emphasized the diminishing effects of laboratory domestication on variability, where purified genetic lines or standardized environmental regimes reduce naturally occurring variation or modify other normal organismal features (Bolker 1995; Frankino and Raff 2004; Gu et al. 2005; Ankeny 2009). While fully acknowledging that these types of effects are present, the opposite possibility—the degree to which manipulation might enhance representation or generate better models of developmental phenomena and mechanisms—has been largely overlooked. An interesting consequence of paying close attention to the diverse aspects of manipulation and representation is that new model organisms might be countenanced. For example, microbial species are thought to be less representative of developmental phenomena but can be engineered to exhibit those phenomena because they fulfill the manipulation criteria better (Love and Travisano 2013). A more nuanced understanding of the epistemology of model organism selection and use in developmental biology has the potential to suggest novel avenues of empirical research that complement existing model organism practices in developmental biology.

Copyright © 2020 by
Alan Love <>

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