George Boole

First published Wed Apr 21, 2010; substantive revision Wed Dec 29, 2021

George Boole (1815–1864) was an English mathematician and a founder of the algebraic tradition in logic. He worked as a schoolmaster in England and from 1849 until his death as professor of mathematics at Queen’s University, Cork, Ireland. He revolutionized logic by applying methods from the then-emerging field of symbolic algebra to logic. Where traditional (Aristotelian) logic relied on cataloging the valid syllogisms of various simple forms, Boole’s method provided general algorithms in an algebraic language which applied to an infinite variety of arguments of arbitrary complexity. These results appeared in two major works, The Mathematical Analysis of Logic (1847) and The Laws of Thought (1854).

1. Life and Work

George Boole was born November 2, 1815 in Lincoln, Lincolnshire, England, into a family of modest means, with a father who was evidently more of a good companion than a good breadwinner. His father was a shoemaker whose real passion was being a devoted dilettante in the realm of science and technology, one who enjoyed participating in the Lincoln Mechanics’ Institution; this was essentially a community social club promoting reading, discussions, and lectures regarding science. It was founded in 1833, and in 1834 Boole’s father became the curator of its library. This love of learning was clearly inherited by Boole. Without the benefit of an elite schooling, but with a supportive family and access to excellent books, in particular from Sir Edward Bromhead, FRS, who lived only a few miles from Lincoln, Boole was able to essentially teach himself foreign languages and advanced mathematics.

Starting at the age of 16 it was necessary for Boole to find gainful employment, since his father was no longer capable of providing for the family. After 3 years working as a teacher in private schools, Boole decided, at the age of 19, to open his own small school in Lincoln. He would be a schoolmaster for the next 15 years, until 1849 when he became a professor at the newly opened Queen’s University in Cork, Ireland. With heavy responsibilities for his parents and siblings, it is remarkable that he nonetheless found time during the years as a schoolmaster to continue his own education and to start a program of research, primarily on differential equations and the calculus of variations connected with the works of Laplace and Lagrange (which he studied in the original French).

There is a widespread belief that Boole was primarily a logician—in reality he became a recognized mathematician well before he had penned a single word about logic, all the while running his private school to care for his parents and siblings. Boole’s ability to read French, German and Italian put him in a good position to start serious mathematical studies when, at the age of 16, he read Lacroix’s Calcul Différentiel, a gift from his friend Reverend G.S. Dickson of Lincoln. Seven years later, in 1838, he would write his first mathematical paper (although not the first to be published), “On certain theorems in the calculus of variations,” focusing on improving results he had read in Lagrange’s Méchanique Analytique.

In early 1839 Boole travelled to Cambridge to meet with the young mathematician Duncan F. Gregory (1813–1844), the editor of the Cambridge Mathematical Journal (CMJ)—Gregory had co-founded this journal in 1837 and edited it until his health failed in 1843 (he died in early 1844, at the age of 30). Gregory, though only 2 years beyond his degree in 1839, became an important mentor to Boole. With Gregory’s support, which included coaching Boole on how to write a mathematical paper, Boole entered the public arena of mathematical publication in 1841.

Boole’s mathematical publications span the 24 years from 1841 to 1864, the year he died from pneumonia. Breaking these 24 years into three segments, the first 6 years (1841–1846), the second 8 years (1847–1854), and the last 10 years (1855–1864), we find that his published work on logic was entirely in the middle 8 years.

In his first 6 career years, Boole published 15 mathematical papers, all but two in the CMJ and its 1846 successor, The Cambridge and Dublin Mathematical Journal. He wrote on standard mathematical topics, mainly differential equations, integration and the calculus of variations. Boole enjoyed early success in using the new symbolical method in analysis, a method which took a differential equation, say:

\[ d^2 y/dx^2 - dy/dx - 2y = \cos(x), \]

and wrote it in the form Operator\((y) =\) cos\((x)\). This was (formally) achieved by letting:

\[ D = d/dx, D^2 = d^2 /dx^2, \text{etc.} \]

leading to an expression of the differential equation as:

\[ (D^2 - D - 2) y = \cos(x). \]

Now symbolical algebra came into play by simply treating the operator \(D^2 - D - 2\) as though it were an ordinary polynomial in algebra. Boole’s 1841 paper On the integration of linear differential equations with constant coefficients gave a nice improvement to Gregory’s method for solving such differential equations, an improvement based on a standard tool in algebra, partial fractions, which he applied to the reciprocal of differential operators like the above.

In 1841 Boole also published his first paper on invariants, a paper that would strongly influence Eisenstein, Cayley, and Sylvester to develop the subject. Arthur Cayley (1821–1895), the future Sadlerian Professor in Cambridge and one of the most prolific mathematicians in history, wrote his first letter to Boole in 1844, complimenting him on his excellent work on invariants. He became a close personal friend, one who would go to Lincoln to visit and stay with Boole in the years before Boole moved to Cork, Ireland. In 1842 Boole started a correspondence with Augustus De Morgan (1806–1871) that initiated another lifetime friendship.

In 1843 the schoolmaster Boole finished a lengthy paper on differential equations, combining an exponential substitution and variation of parameters with the separation of symbols method. The paper was too long for the CMJ—Gregory, and later De Morgan, encouraged him to submit it to the Royal Society. The first referee rejected Boole’s paper, but the second recommended it for the Gold Medal for the best mathematical paper written in the years 1841–1844, and this recommendation was accepted. In 1844 the Royal Society published Boole’s paper and awarded him the Gold Medal—the first Gold Medal awarded by the Society to a mathematician. The next year Boole read a paper at the annual meeting of the British Association for the Advancement of Science at Cambridge in June 1845. This led to new contacts and friends, in particular William Thomson (1824–1907), the future Lord Kelvin.

Not long after starting to publish papers, Boole was eager to find a way to become affiliated with an institution of higher learning. He considered attending Cambridge University to obtain a degree, but was counselled that fulfilling the various requirements would likely seriously interfere with his research program, not to mention the problems of obtaining financing. Finally, in 1849, he obtained a professorship in a new university opening in Cork, Ireland. In the years he was a professor in Cork (1849–1864) he would occasionally inquire about the possibility of a position back in England.

The 8 year stretch from 1847 to 1854 starts and ends with Boole’s two books on mathematical logic. In addition Boole published 24 more papers on traditional mathematics during this period, while only one paper was written on logic, that being in 1848. He was awarded an honorary LL.D. degree by the University of Dublin in 1851, and this was the title that he used beside his name in his 1854 book on logic.

Boole’s 1847 book, Mathematical Analysis of Logic, will be referred to as MAL; the 1854 book, Laws of Thought, as LT.

During the last 10 years of his career, from 1855 to 1864, Boole published 17 papers on mathematics and two mathematics books, one on differential equations and one on difference equations. Both books were highly regarded, and used for instruction at Cambridge. Also during this time significant honors came in:

1857 Fellowship of the Royal Society
1858 Honorary Member of the Cambridge Philosophical Society
1859 Degree of DCL, honoris causa from Oxford

Unfortunately his keen sense of duty led to his walking through a rainstorm in late 1864, and then lecturing in wet clothes. Not long afterwards, on December 8, 1864 in Ballintemple, County Cork, Ireland, he died of pneumonia, at the age of 49. Another paper on mathematics and a revised book on differential equations, giving considerable attention to singular solutions, were published post mortem.

The reader interested in excellent accounts of Boole’s personal life is referred to Desmond MacHale’s George Boole, His Life and Work, 1985/2014, and the more recent book New Light on George Boole, 2018, by Desmond MacHale and Yvonne Cohen, sources to which this article is greatly indebted.

  • 1815 — Birth in Lincoln, England
  • 1830 — His translation of a Greek poem printed in a local paper
  • 1831 — Reads Lacroix’s Calcul Différentiel
  • Schoolmaster
  • 1834 — Opens his own school
  • 1835 — Gives public address on Newton’s achievements
  • 1838 — Writes first mathematics paper
  • 1839 — Visits Cambridge to meet Duncan Gregory, editor of the Cambridge Mathematical Journal (CMJ)
  • 1841 — First four mathematical publications (all in the CMJ)
  • 1842 — Initiates correspondence with Augustus De Morgan — they become lifelong friends
  • 1844 — Correspondence with Cayley starts (initiated by Cayley) — they become lifelong friends
  • 1844 — Gold Medal from the Royal Society for a paper on differential equations
  • 1845 — Gives talk at the Annual Meeting of the British Association for the Advancement of Science, and meets William Thomson (later Lord Kelvin) — they become lifelong friends
  • 1847 — Publishes Mathematical Analysis of Logic
  • 1848 — Publishes his only paper on the algebra of logic
  • Professor of Mathematics
  • 1849 — Accepts position as (the first) Professor of Mathematics at the new Queen’s University in Cork, Ireland
  • 1851 — Honorary Degree, LL.D., from Trinity College, Dublin
  • 1854 — Publishes Laws of Thought
  • 1855 — Marriage to Mary Everest, niece of George Everest, Surveyor-General of India after whom Mt. Everest is named
  • 1856 — Birth of Mary Ellen Boole
  • 1857 — Elected to the Royal Society
  • 1858 — Birth of Margaret Boole
  • 1859 — Publishes Differential Equations; used as a textbook at Cambridge
  • 1860 — Birth of Alicia Boole, who will coin the word “polytope”
  • 1860 — Publishes Difference Equations ; used as a textbook at Cambridge
  • 1862 — Birth of Lucy Everest Boole
  • 1864 — Birth of daughter Ethel Lilian Boole, who would write The Gadfly, an extraordinarily popular book in Russia after the 1917 revolution
  • 1864 — Death from pneumonia, Cork, Ireland

2. The Context and Background of Boole’s Work In Logic

To understand how Boole developed his algebra of logic, it is useful to review the broad outlines of the work on the foundations of algebra that had been undertaken by mathematicians affiliated with Cambridge University in the 1800s prior to the beginning of Boole’s mathematical publishing career. An excellent reference for further reading connected to this section is the annotated sourcebook From Kant to Hilbert, 1996, by William Ewald, which contains a complete copy of Boole’s Mathematical Analysis of Logic.

The 19th century opened in England with mathematics in the doldrums. The English mathematicians had feuded with the continental mathematicians over the issues of priority in the development of the calculus, resulting in the English following Newton’s notation, and those on the continent following that of Leibniz. One of the obstacles to overcome in updating English mathematics was the fact that the great developments of algebra and analysis had been built on dubious foundations, and there were English mathematicians who were quite vocal about these shortcomings. In ordinary algebra, it was the use of negative numbers and imaginary numbers that caused concern.

The first major attempt among the English to clear up the foundation problems of algebra was the Treatise on Algebra, 1830, by George Peacock (1791–1858). A second edition appeared as two volumes, 1842/1845. He divided the subject into two parts, the first part being arithmetical algebra, the algebra of the positive numbers (which did not permit operations like subtraction in cases where the answer would not be a positive number). The second part was symbolical algebra, which was governed not by a specific interpretation, as was the case for arithmetical algebra, but solely by laws. In symbolical algebra there were no restrictions on using subtraction, etc.

Peacock believed that in order for symbolical algebra to be a useful subject its laws had to be closely related to those of arithmetical algebra. In this connection he introduced his principle of the permanence of equivalent forms, a principle connecting results in arithmetical algebra to those in symbolical algebra. This principle has two parts:

  1. General results in arithmetical algebra belong to the laws of symbolical algebra.
  2. Whenever an interpretation of a result of symbolical algebra made sense in the setting of arithmetical algebra, the result would give a correct result in arithmetic.

A fascinating use of algebra was introduced in 1814 by François-Joseph Servois (1776–1847) when he tackled differential equations by separating the differential operator from the subject, as described in an example given above. This application of algebra captured the interest of Gregory who published a number of papers on the method of the separation of symbols, that is, the separation into operators and objects, in the CMJ. He also wrote on the foundation of algebra, and it was Gregory’s foundation that Boole embraced almost verbatim prior to writing LT. Gregory had abandoned Peacock’s principle of the permanence of equivalent forms in favor of three simple laws, one of which Boole regarded as merely a notation convention. Unfortunately these laws fell far short of what is required to justify even some of the most elementary results in algebra, like those involving subtraction.

In On the foundation of algebra, 1839, the first of four papers on this topic by De Morgan that appeared in the Transactions of the Cambridge Philosophical Society, one finds a tribute to the separation of symbols in algebra, and the claim that modern algebraists usually regard the symbols as denoting operators (e.g., the derivative operation) instead of objects like numbers. The footnote

Professor Peacock is the first, I believe, who distinctly set forth the difference between what I have called the technical and the logical branches of algebra

credits Peacock with being the first to separate what are now called the syntactic [technical] and the semantic [logical] aspects of algebra. In the second foundations paper (in 1841) De Morgan proposed what he considered to be a complete set of eight rules for working with symbolical algebra.

Regarding the origin of the name Boolean algebra, Charles Sanders Peirce (1839–1914) introduced, among several other phrases, the name Boolian algebra for the algebra that resulted from dispensing with the arithmetical scaffolding of Boole’s equational algebra of logic. With the spelling Boolean algebra this was embraced by his close friend the Harvard philosopher Josiah Royce (1855–1916) around 1900, and then by Royce’s students (including Norbert Wiener, Henry M. Sheffer and Clarence I. Lewis) and in due course by other Harvard professors and the world. It essentially referred to the modern version of the algebra of logic introduced in 1864 by William Stanley Jevons (1835–1882), a version that Boole had rejected in their correspondence—see Section 5.1. For this reason the word Boolean will not be used in this article to describe the algebra of logic that Boole actually created; instead the name Boole’s algebra will be used. (See the 2015 article “George Boole and Boolean Algebra” by Burris.)

In MAL, and more so in LT, Boole was interested in the insights that his algebra of logic gave to the inner workings of the mind. This pursuit has met with little favor, and is not discussed in this article.

3. The Mathematical Analysis of Logic (1847)

In New Light on George Boole (2018) by MacHale and Cohen one finds, published for the first time, (an edited version of) the biography by MaryAnn Boole (1818–1887) of her famous brother, and on p. 41 there is the following passage:

He told me that from boyhood he had had the conviction that Logic could be reduced to a mathematical science, and that he had often made himself ill on the attempt to prove it, but it was not until 1847 that the true method flashed upon him.

Boole’s final path to logic fame occurred in a curious way. In early 1847 he was stimulated to renew his investigations into logic by a trivial but very public dispute between De Morgan and the Scottish philosopher Sir William Hamilton (1788–1856)—not to be confused with his contemporary the Irish mathematician Sir William Rowan Hamilton (1805–1865). This dispute revolved around who deserved credit for the idea of quantifying the predicate (e.g., All \(A\) is all \(B\), All \(A\) is some \(B\), etc.). MaryAnn wrote that when the true method flashed upon him in 1847, “he was literally like a man dazzled with excess of light”. Within a few months Boole had written his 82 page monograph, Mathematical Analysis of Logic, first presenting an algebraic approach to Aristotelian logic, then looking briefly at the general theory. (Some say that this monograph and De Morgan’s book Formal Logic appeared on the same day in November 1847.)

We are not told what the true method was that flashed upon Boole. One possibility is the discovery of the Expansion Theorem and the properties of constituents.

3.1 Boole’s Version Of Aristotelian Logic

In pages 15–59, a little more than half of the 82 pages in MAL, Boole focused on a slight generalization of Aristotelian logic, namely augmenting its four types of categorical propositions by permitting the subject and/or predicate to be of the form not-\(X\). In the chapter on conversions, such as Conversion by Limitation—All \(X\) is \(Y\), therefore Some \(Y\) is \(X\)—Boole found the Aristotelian classification defective in that it did not treat contraries, such as not-\(X\), on the same footing as the named classes \(X, Y, Z\), etc. For example, he converted No \(X\) is \(Y\) into All \(Y\) is not-\(X\), and All X is Y into All not-Y is not-X.

For his extended version of Aristotelian logic he stated (MAL, p. 30) a set of three transformation rules which he claimed allowed one to construct all valid two-line categorical arguments. These transformation rules did not appear in LT. It is somewhat curious that when it came to analyzing categorical syllogisms, it was only in the conclusion that he permitted his generalized categorical propositions to appear. Among the vast possibilities for hypothetical syllogisms, the ones that he discussed were standard, with one new example added.

3.2 Class Symbols and Elective Symbols

The Introduction chapter of MAL starts with Boole reviewing the symbolical method:

the validity of the processes of analysis does not depend upon the interpretation of the symbols which are employed, but solely upon the laws of their combination.

The second chapter, First Principles, lets the symbol 1 represent the Universe “comprehending every conceivable class of objects, whether actually existing or not.” Capital letters \(X, Y, Z,\ldots\) denoted classes. Then, no doubt heavily influenced by his very successful work using algebraic techniques on differential operators, and consistent with De Morgan’s 1839 assertion that algebraists preferred interpreting symbols as operators, Boole introduced the elective symbol \(x\) corresponding to the class \(X\), the elective symbol \(y\) corresponding to \(Y\), etc. The elective symbols denoted elective operators—for example the elective operator red when applied to a class would elect (select) the red items in the class.

Then Boole said “When no subject is expressed, we shall suppose 1 (the Universe) to be the subject understood”. He goes on to explain that \(x(1)\) is just \(X\). Evidently this means, aside from defining the elective symbol \(x\), when presented with the term \(x\) without a subject one is actually dealing with \(X\).

3.3 Operations and Laws for Elective Symbols

The first operation that Boole introduced was multiplication \(xy\). The standard juxtaposition notation \(xy\) for multiplication also had a standard meaning for operators (for example, differential operators), namely one applied \(y\) to an object and then \(x\) is applied to the result. As pointed out by Theodore Hailperin (1916–2014) (1981, p. 176; and 1986, pp. 67,68), this established notation convention handed Boole his interpretation of the multiplication \(xy\) of elective symbols as the composition of the two operators. Thus when encountering the expression \(xy\) without a subject one was dealing with the class \(x(y(1))\), “the result being the class whose members are both Xs and Ys”. We call this class the intersection of \(X\) and \(Y\). In LT Boole dropped the (unnecessary) use of elective symbols and simply let \(x\), \(y\) denote classes, with \(xy\) being their intersection.

The first law in MAL (p. 16) was the distributive law

\[ x(u+v) = xu + xv, \]

where Boole said that \(u+v\) corresponded to dividing a class into two parts, evidently meaning \(U\) and \(V\) are disjoint classes. This was the first mention of addition in MAL.

He added (MAL, p. 17) the commutative law \(xy = yx\) and the index law \(x^n = x\)—in LT the latter would be replaced by the law of duality \(x^2 = x\) (called the idempotent law in 1870 by the Harvard mathematician Benjamin Peirce (1809–1880), in another context).

After stating the above distributive and commutative laws, Boole believed he was entitled to fully employ the ordinary algebra of his time, saying (MAL, p. 18) that

all the processes of Common Algebra are applicable to the present system.

Boole went beyond the foundations of symbolical algebra that Gregory had used in 1840—he added De Morgan’s 1841 single rule of inference, that equivalent operations performed upon equivalent subjects produce equivalent results.

3.4 Common Algebra

It is likely more difficult for the modern reader to come to grips with the idea that Boole’s algebra is based on Common Algebra, the algebra of numbers, than would have been the case with Boole’s contemporaries—the modern reader has been exposed to modern Boolean algebra (and perhaps Boolean rings). In the mid 1800s the word algebra meant, for most mathematicians, simply the algebra of numbers.

Boole’s three laws for his algebra of logic are woefully inadequate for what follows in MAL. The reader will, for the most part, be well served by assuming that Boole is doing ordinary polynomial algebra augmented by the assumption that any power \(x^n\) of an elective symbol \(x\) can be replaced by \(x\). One can safely assume that any polynomial equation p = q that holds in Common Algebra is valid in Boole’s algebra as is any equational argument

\[ p_1 = q_1, \ldots, p_k = q_k \therefore p = q \]

that holds in Common Algebra.

[A note of caution: the argument “\(x^2 = x \therefore x = 1\) or \(x = 0\)” is valid in Common Algebra, but it is not an equational argument since the conclusion is a disjunction of equations, not a single equation.]

Boole’s algebra was mainly concerned with polynomials with integer coefficients, and with their values when the variables were restricted to taking on only the values 0 and 1. Some of the key polynomials in Boole’s work, along with their values on \(\{0,1\}\), are presented in the following table:

\(x\) \(y\) \(1 - x\) \(x - x^2\) \(xy\) \(x + y\) \(x - y\) \(x+y - xy\) \(x+y - 2xy\)
1 1 0 0 1 2 0 1 0
1 0 0 0 0 1 1 1 1
0 1 1 0 0 1 \(-1\) 1 1
0 0 1 0 0 0 0 0 0

Note that all of the polynomials \(p\)(x,y) in the above table, except for addition and subtraction, take values in \(\{0,1\}\) when the variables take values in \(\{0,1\}\). Such polynomials are called switching functions in computer science and electrical engineering, and as functions on \(\{0,1\}\) they are idempotent, that is, p\(^2 =\) p. The switching functions are exactly the idempotent polynomials in Boole’s algebra.

3.5 Impact of the Index Law

In Boole’s algebra, any polynomial \(p(x)\) in one variable can be reduced to a linear polynomial \(ax + b\) since one has

\[\begin{align} a_n x^n + \cdots + a_1 x + a_0 &= a_n x + \cdots + a_1 x + a_0 \\ &= (a_n + \cdots + a_1)x + a_0. \end{align}\]

Likewise any polynomial \(p(x, y)\) can be expressed as \(axy + bx + cy + d\). Etc.

However Boole was much more interested in the fact that \(ax + b\) can be written as a linear combination of \(x\) and \(1-x\), namely

\[ ax + b = (a + b)x + b(1-x). \]

This gives his Expansion Theorem in one variable:

\[ p(x) = p(1)x + p(0)(1-x). \]

The Expansion Theorem for polynomials in two variables is

\[\begin{align} p(x,y) =& p(1,1)xy + p(1,0)x(1-y)\ + \\ & p(0,1) (1 - x)y + p(0,0) (1 - x)(1 - y). \end{align}\]

For example,

\[\begin{align} x + y &= 2xy + x(1-y) + (1-x)y \\ x - y &= x(1-y) - (1-x)y. \end{align}\]

The expressions \(xy, \ldots, (1 - x)(1 - y)\), were called the constituents of \(p(x,y)\)—it would be better to call them the constituents of the variables \(x, y\)—and the coefficients \(p(1,1), \ldots, p(0,0)\) were the modulii of \(p(x,y)\).

Similar results hold for polynomials in any number of variables (MAL, pp. 62–64), and there are three important facts about the constituents for a given list of variables:

  1. each constituent is idempotent,
  2. the product of two distinct constituents is 0,
  3. the sum of all the constituents is 1.

3.6 Equational Expressions of Categorical Propositions

In the chapter Of Expression and Interpretation, Boole said “the class not-X will be determined by the symbol \(1-x\)”. This is the first appearance of subtraction in MAL. Boole’s initial equational expressions of the Aristotelian categorical propositions (MAL, pp. 21,22) will be called his primary expressions. Then in the next several pages he adds supplementary expressions; of these the main ones will be called the secondary expressions.

Proposition Primary Expression Secondary Expression
All \(X\) is \(Y\) \(x = xy\) \(x = vy\)
No \(X\) is \(Y\) \(xy = 0\) \(x = v(1-y)\)
Some \(X\) is \(Y\) \(v = xy\) \(vx = vy\)
Some \(X\) is not \(Y\) \(v = x(1 - y)\) \(vx = v(1 - y)\)

The first primary expression given was for All \(X\) is \(Y\), an equation which he then converted into \(x(1-y) = 0\). This was the first appearance of 0 in MAL. It was not introduced as the symbol for the empty class—indeed the empty class does not appear in MAL. Evidently “\(= 0\)” performed the role of a predicate in MAL, with an equation \(E = 0\) asserting that the class denoted by \(E\) simply did not exist. (In LT, what we call the empty class was introduced and denoted by 0.)

Syllogistic reasoning is just an exercise in elimination, namely the middle term is eliminated from the premises to give the conclusion. Elimination is a standard topic in the theory of equations, and Boole borrowed a simple elimination result regarding two equations to use in his algebra of logic—if the premises of a syllogism involved the classes \(X, Y\), and \(Z\), and one wanted to eliminate the middle term \(Y\), then Boole put the equations for the two premises in the form

\[\begin{align} ay + b &= 0 \\ cy + d &= 0 \end{align}\]

where \(y\) does not appear in the coefficients a,b,c,d. The result of eliminating \(y\) in ordinary algebra gives the equation

\[ ad - bc = 0, \]

and this is what Boole used in MAL. Unfortunately this is a weak elimination result for Boole’s algebra. One finds, using the improved reduction and elimination theorems of LT, that the best possible result of elimination is

\[ (b^2 + d^2)[(a + b)^2 + (c + d)^2 ] = 0. \]

Applying weak elimination to the primary equational expressions was not sufficient to derive all of the valid syllogisms. For example, in the cases where the premises had primary expressions \(ay = 0\) and \(cy = 0\), this elimination gave \(0 = 0\), even when there was a non-trivial conclusion. Boole introduced the alternative equational expressions (see MAL, p. 32) of categorical propositions to be able to derive all of the valid syllogisms.

Toward the end of the chapter on categorical syllogisms there is a long footnote (MAL, pp. 42–45) claiming (MAL, pp. 42, 43) that secondary expressions alone are sufficient for the analysis of [his generalization of] Aristotelian categorical logic. The footnote loses much of its force because the results it presents depend heavily on the weak elimination theorem being best possible, which is not the case. Regarding the secondary expressions, in the Postscript to MAL he says:

The system of equations there given for the expression of Propositions in Syllogism is always preferable to the one before employed—first, in generality—secondly, in facility of interpretation.

His justification of this claim would appear in LT. Indeed Boole used only the secondary expressions of MAL to express propositions as equations in LT, but there the reader will no longer find a leisurely and detailed treatment of Aristotelian logic—the discussion of this subject is delayed until the last chapter on logic, namely Chapter XV (the only one in LT to analyze particular propositions). In this chapter the application of his algebra of logic to Aristotelian logic is presented in such a compressed form (by omitting all details of the reduction, elimination and solution steps), concluding with such long equations, that the reader is not likely to want to check that Boole’s analysis is correct.

3.7 Hypothetical Syllogisms

On p. 48 of MAL Boole said:

A hypothetical Proposition is defined to be two or more categoricals united by a copula (or conjunction), and the different kinds of hypothetical Propositions are named from their respective conjunctions, viz. conditional (if), disjunctive (either, or), &c.

Boole analyzed the seven hypothetical syllogisms that were standard in Aristotelian logic, from the Constructive and Destructive Conditionals to the Complex Destructive Dilemma. Letting capital letters \(X, Y, \ldots\) represent categorical propositions, the hypothetical propositions traditionally involved in hypothetical syllogisms were in one of the forms \(X\) is true, \(X\) is false, If \(X\) is true then \(Y\) is true, \(X\) is true or \(Y\) is true or …, as well as \(X\) is true and \(Y\) is true and … At the end of the chapter on hypothetical syllogisms he noted that it was easy to create new ones, and one could enrich the collection by using mixed hypothetical propositions such as If \(X\) is true, then either \(Y\) is true, or \(Z\) is true.

Most important in this chapter was Boole’s claim that his algebra of logic for categorical propositions was equally suited to the study of hypothetical syllogisms. This was based on adopting the standard reduction of hypothetical propositions to propositions about classes by letting the hypothetical universe, also denoted by 1, “comprehend all conceivable cases and conjunctures of circumstances”. Evidently his notion of a case was an assignment of truth values to the propositional variables. For \(X\) a categorical proposition Boole let \(x\) denote the elective operator that selects the cases for which \(X\) is true.

Boole said the universe of a categorical proposition has two cases, true and false. To find an equational expression for a hypothetical proposition Boole resorted to a near relative of truth tables (MAL, p. 50). To each case, that is, assignment of truth values to \(X\) and \(Y\), he associated an elective expression as follows:

Cases Elective Expressions
X true, Y true \(xy\)
X true, Y false \(x(1- y)\)
X false, Y true \((1 - x)y\)
X false, Y false \((1 - x)(1 - y)\)

These elective expressions are, of course, the constituents of \(x\), \(y\).

Boole expressed a propositional formula \(\Phi(X,Y, \ldots)\) by an elective equation \(\phi(x,y, \ldots)\) = 1 by ascertaining all the distinct cases (assignments of truth values) for which the formula holds, and summing their corresponding elective expressions to obtain \(\phi\).

For example, the elective expression for \(X\) is true or \(Y\) is true, with or inclusive, is thus \(xy + x(1 - y) + (1 - x)y = 1\), which simplifies to \(x + y - xy = 1\).

Boole did not have the modern view that a propositional formula can be considered as a function on the truth values \(\{\rT, \rF\}\), taking values in \(\{\rT,\rF\}\). The function viewpoint gives us an algorithm to determine which constituents are to be summed to give the desired elective expression, namely those constituents associated with the cases for which the propositional formula has the value \(\rT\).

By not viewing propositional formulas as functions on \(\{\)T, F\(\}\) Boole missed out on being the inventor of truth tables. His algebraic method of analyzing hypothetical syllogisms was to transform each of the hypothetical premises into an elective equation, and then apply his algebra of logic (which was developed for categorical propositions). For example, the premises \(X\) is true or \(Y\) is true, with or inclusive, and \(X\) is false are expressed by the equations \(x + y - xy = 1\) and \(x = 0\). From these it immediately follows that \(y = 1\), giving the conclusion \(Y\) is true.

Boole only considered rather simple hypothetical propositions on the grounds these were the only ones encountered in common usage (see LT, p. 172). His algebraic approach to propositional logic is easily extended to all propositional formulas as follows. For \(\Phi\) a propositional formula the associated elective function \(\Phi^*\) is defined recursively as follows:

  • \(0^* = 0\); \(1^* = 1\); \(X^* = x\);
  • \((\text{not-}\Phi)^* = 1 - \Phi^*\);
  • \((\Phi \text{ and } \Psi)^* = \Phi^* \cdot \Psi^*\);
  • \((\Phi \text{ or } \Psi)^* = \Phi^* + \Psi^* - \Phi^* \cdot \Psi^*\),  where “or” is inclusive;
  • \((\Phi \text{ or } \Psi)^* = \Phi^* + \Psi^* - 2\Phi^* \cdot \Psi^*\),  where “or” is exclusive;
  • \((\Phi \text{ implies } \Psi)^* = 1 - \Phi^* + \Phi^* \cdot \Psi^*\);
  • \((\Phi \text{ iff } \Psi)^* = \Phi^* \cdot \Psi^* + (1 - \Phi^*) \cdot(1 - \Psi^*)\).

Then one has:

  1. \(\Phi\) is a tautology iff \(\Phi^* = 1\) is valid in Boole’s algebra.
  2. \(\Phi_1\), ... , \(\Phi_k \therefore \Phi\) is valid in propositional logic iff
    \(\Phi_{1}^* = 1, \ldots , \Phi_{k}^* = 1 \therefore \Phi^* = 1\) is valid in Boole’s algebra.

This looks quite different from modern propositional logic where one takes a few tautologies, such as \(X \rightarrow(Y \rightarrow X)\), as axioms, and inference rules such as modus ponens to form a deductive system.

This translation, from \(\Phi\) to \(\Phi^*\), viewed as mapping expressions from modern Boolean algebra to polynomials, would be presented in the 1933 paper Characteristic functions and the algebra of logic by Hassler Whitney (1907–1989), with the objective of showing that one does not need to learn the algebra of logic [modern Boolean algebra] to verify the equational laws and equational arguments of Boolean algebra—they can be translated into the ordinary algebra with which one is familiar. Howard Aiken (1900–1973), Director of the Harvard Computation Laboratory, would use such translations of logical functions into ordinary algebra in his 1951 book Synthesis of Electronic Computing and Control Circuits, specifically stating that he preferred Boole’s numerical function approach to that of Boolean algebra or propositional logic.

3.8 General Theorems of Boole’s Algebra in MAL

Beginning with the chapter Properties of Elective Functions, Boole developed general theorems for working with elective functions and equations in his algebra of logic—the Expansion (or Development) Theorem (described above in Section 3.5) and the properties of constituents are discussed in this chapter. He used the power series expansion of an elective function in his proof of the one-variable case of the Expansion Theorem (MAL, p. 60), perhaps intending to apply it to rational elective functions.

The operation of division with polynomial functions was introduced in MAL but never successfully developed in his algebra of logic—there are no equational laws for how to deal with division. It was abandoned in LT except for being frequently used as a mnemonic device when solving a polynomial equation. From the Expansion Theorem and the properties of constituents he showed that the modulii of the sum/difference/product of two elective functions are the sums/differences/products of the corresponding modulii of the two functions.

The Expansion Theorem is used (MAL, p. 61) to prove an important result, that p(x) and q(x) are equivalent in Boole’s algebra if and only if corresponding modulii are the same, that is, \(p(1)=q(1)\) and \(p(0)=q(0)\). This result generalizes to functions of several variables. It will not be stated as such in LT, but will be absorbed in the much more general (if somewhat opaquely stated) result that will be called the Rule of 0 and 1.

Using the Expansion Theorem Boole showed (MAL, p. 64) that every elective equation \(p = 0\) is equivalent to the collection of constituent equations \(r = 0\) where the modulus (coefficient) of \(r\) in the expansion of \(p\) is not zero, and thus every elective equation is interpretable. Furthermore this led (MAL, p. 65) to the fact that \(p = 0\) is equivalent to the equation \(q = 0\) where \(q\) is the sum of the constituents in the expansion of \(p\) whose modulus is non-zero.

As examples, consider the equations \(x + y = 0\) and \(x - y = 0\). The following table gives the constituents and modulii of the expansions:

\(x\) \(y\) constituents \(x + y\) \(x - y\)
1 1 \(xy\) 2 0
1 0 \(x(1 - y)\) 1 1
0 1 \((1 - x)y\) 1 \(-1\)
0 0 \((1 - x)(1 - y)\) 0 0

Thus \(x + y = 0\) is equivalent to the collection of constituent equations

\[ xy = 0,\ x(1 - y) = 0,\ (1 - x)y = 0 \]

as well as to the single equation

\[ xy + x(1 - y) + (1 - x)y = 0, \]

and \(x - y = 0\) is equivalent to the collection of constituent equations

\[ x(1 - y) = 0,\ (1 - x)y = 0 \]

as well as to the single equation

\[ x(1 - y) + (1 - x)y = 0. \]

The Solution Theorem described how to solve an elective equation for one of its symbols in terms of the others, often introducing constraint equations on the independent variables. In his algebra of logic he could always solve an elective equation for any one of its elective symbols. For example, the equation \(q(x)y = p(x)\) was solved by using formal division \(y = p(x)/q(x)\) and then using formal expansion to obtain \(y = ax + b(1-x)\) where \(a = p(1)/q(1)\) and \(b = p(0)/q(0)\), and then decoding the fractional coefficients. This theorem will be discussed in more detail in Step 7 of Section 6.2.

Boole’s final example (MAL, p. 78) was solving three equations in three unknowns for one of the unknowns in terms of the other two. This example used a well known technique for handling side conditions in analysis called Lagrange Multipliers—this method (which reduced the three equations in the example to a single equation in five unknowns) reappeared in LT (p. 117), but was only used once. It was superseded by the sum of squares reduction (LT, p. 121) which does not introduce new variables. Using the Reduction and Elimination Theorems in LT one discovers that Boole’s constraint equations (3) (MAL, p. 80) for his three equation example are much too weak—each of the products should be 0, and there are additional constraint equations.

MAL shows more clearly than LT how closely Boole’s algebra of logic is based on Common Algebra plus the idempotent law. The Elimination Theorem that he borrowed from common algebra turned out to be weaker than what his algebra offered, and his method of reducing equations to a single equation was clumsier than the main one used in LT, but the Expansion Theorem and Solution Theorem were the same. One sees that MAL contained not only the basic outline for LT, but also some parts fully developed. Power series were not completely abandoned in LT—they appeared, but only in a footnote (LT, p. 72).

4. The Laws of Thought (1854)

The logic portion of Boole’s second logic book, An Investigation of The Laws of Thought on which are founded the Mathematical Theories of Logic and Probabilities, published in 1854, would be devoted to trying to clarify and correct what was said in MAL, and providing more substantial applications, the main one being his considerable work in probability theory. At the end of Chapter I Boole mentioned the theoretical possibility of using probability theory, enhanced by his algebra of logic, to uncover fundamental laws governing society by analyzing large quantities of social data by large numbers of (human) computers.

Boole used lower case Latin letters at the end of the alphabet, like \(x,y,z\), to represent classes. The universe was a class, denoted by 1; and there was a class described as “Nothing”, denoted by 0, which we call the empty class. The operation of multiplication was defined to be what we call intersection, and this led to his first law, \(xy = yx\), and then to the idempotent law \(x^2 = x\). Addition was introduced as aggregation when the classes were disjoint. He stated the commutative law for addition, \(x + y = y + x\), and the distributive law \(z(x + y) = zx + zy\). Then followed \(x - y = - y + x\) and \(z(x - y) = zx - zy\). The associative laws for addition and multiplication were conspicuously absent.

The idempotent law \(x^2 = x\) was different from Boole’s laws for the common algebra—it only applied to the individual class symbols, not in general to compound terms that one could build from these symbols. For example, one does not have \((x + y)^2 = x + y\) in Boole’s system, otherwise by ordinary algebra with idempotent class symbols, this would imply \(2xy = 0\), and then \(xy = 0\), which would force \(x\) and \(y\) to represent disjoint classes. But it is not the case that every pair of classes is disjoint.

It was this equational argument, that \((x + y)^2 = x + y\) implies \(xy = 0\), that led Boole to view addition \(x + y\) as a partial operation, only defined when \(xy = 0\), that is, when \(x\) and \(y\) are disjoint classes. The only place where he wrote down this argument was in his unpublished notes—see Boole: Selected Manuscripts …, 1997, edited by Ivor Grattan-Guiness and Gérard Bornet, pp. 91,92. A similar equational argument, that \((x - y)^2 = x - y\) implies \(y = xy\), led to \(x - y\) being only defined when \(y = xy\), that is, when \(y = x \cap y\), which is the same as \(y \subseteq x\).

It was not until p. 66 of LT that Boole clearly informed the reader that addition, which had been introduced on p. 33, was a partial operation on classes:

The expression \(x+y\) seems indeed uninterpretable, unless it is assumed that the things represented by \(x\) and the things represented by \(y\) are entirely separate; that they embrace no individuals in common.

A similar statement about subtraction being a partial operation did not appear until p. 93:

The latter function presupposes, as a condition of its interpretation, that the class represented by \(y\) is wholly contained in the class represented by \(x\).

Here the “latter function” means \(x-y\). The dispersion of relevant facts about a topic, such as definitions of the fundamental operations of addition and subtraction, is not helpful to the reader.

Another example of the need for caution when working with partial algebras is how important it was that Boole chose the fundamental operation minus to be binary subtraction, and not the unary operation of additive inverse that is standard in ring theory. Note that the standard operations union, symmetric difference, intersection and complement of the Boolean algebra of classes are definable in Boole’s partial-algebra by totally defined terms—he used these to be able to express propositions about classes by equations:

\[\begin{align} x \cup y &:= x + (1-x)y \\ x \triangle y &:= x(1-y) + (1-x)y \\ x \cap y &:= xy \\ x' &:= 1-x. \end{align}\]

Subtraction was needed to find a totally defined term, namely \(1-x\), that expresses the complement of \(x\). The term \(1+(-x)\), like \(-x\), is only defined for \(x=0\) in Boole’s partial-algebra.

The same three equations define the Boolean algebra of classes in the standard Boolean ring of classes where addition is symmetric difference, except in this case subtraction is a derived operation, namely \(1-x\) is defined to be \(1 + (-x)\), the unary minus being a fundamental operation in the Boolean ring, indeed in any ring.

One might expect that Boole was building toward claiming an axiomatic foundation for his algebra of logic that, as he had (erroneously) claimed in MAL, justified using all the processes of common algebra. Indeed he did discuss the rules of inference, that adding or subtracting equals from equals gives equals, and multiplying equals by equals gives equals. But then the development of an axiomatic approach came to an abrupt halt. There was no discussion as to whether the stated axioms (which he called laws) and rules of inference (which he called axioms) were sufficient for his algebra of logic. (They were not.) Instead he simply and briefly, with remarkably little fanfare, presented a radically new foundation for his algebra of logic (LT pp. 37,38):

Let us conceive then of an algebra in which the symbols \(x, y, z\), &c. admit indifferently of the values 0 and 1, and of these values alone. The laws, the axioms, and the processes, of such an Algebra will be identical in their whole extent with the laws, the axioms, and the processes of an Algebra of Logic. Difference of interpretation will alone divide them. Upon this principle the method of the following work is established.

Note that this algebra restricted the values of the variables to 0 and 1, but placed no such restriction on the values of terms. There was no assertion that this was to be a two-element algebra. Burris and Sankappanavar (2013) viewed the quote as saying that this algebra was just the ordinary algebra of numbers modified by restricting the variables to the values 0 and 1 to determine the validity of an argument. They called this Boole’s Rule of 0 and 1, and said he used this Rule to justify three of his main theorems (Expansion, Reduction, Elimination). These main theorems along with the Solution Theorem yielded Boole’s General Method for discovering the strongest possible consequences of propositional premises under certain desired constraints (such as eliminating some of the variables). Further comments on this Rule are below in Section 5.2.

In Chapter V he defended the use of uninterpretables in his work; as part of his justification for the use of uninterpretable steps in symbolic algebra he pointed to the well known use of \(\sqrt{-1}\) to obtain trigonometric identities. Unfortunately his Principles of Symbolical Reasoning do not, in general, apply to partial algebras, that is, where some of the operations are only partially defined, such as addition and subtraction in Boole’s algebra. Nonetheless it turns out one can prove that they do apply to his algebra of logic. In succeeding chapters he gave the Expansion Theorem, the new full-strength Elimination Theorem, an improved Reduction Theorem, and the Solution Theorem where formal division and formal expansion were used to solve an equation.

Boole turned to the topic of the interpretability of a logical function in Chapter VI Section 13. He had already stated in MAL that every equation is interpretable (by showing an equation was equivalent to a collection of constituent equations). However algebraic terms need not be interpretable, e.g., \(1+1\) is not interpretable. Some terms are partially interpretable, and equivalent terms can have distinct domains of interpretability. In Chapter VI Section 13, he comes to the conclusion that the condition for a polynomial \(p\) to be equivalent to a (totally) interpretable function is that it satisfy \(p^2 = p\), in which case it is equivalent to a sum of distinct constituents, namely those belonging to the non-vanishing modulii of \(p\). A polynomial is idempotent if and only if all of its modulii are idempotent, that is, they are in \(\{0, 1\}\), in which case the expansion of the polynomial is a sum of distinct constituents (or it is 0).

Boole’s Chapter XI Of Secondary Propositions is parallel to the treatment in MAL except that he changed from using the cases when \(X\) is true to the times when \(X\) is true. In Chapter XIII Boole selected arguments of Clarke and Spinoza, on the nature of an eternal being, to put under the magnifying glass of his algebra of logic, starting with the comment (LT, p. 185):

2. The chief practical difficulty of this inquiry will consist, not in the application of the method to the premises once determined, but in ascertaining what the premises are.

One conclusion was (LT, p. 216):

19. It is not possible, I think, to rise from the perusal of the arguments of Clarke and Spinoza without a deep conviction of the futility of all endeavours to establish, entirely a priori, the existence of an Infinite Being, His attributes, and His relation to the universe.

In the final chapter on logic, Chapter XV, Boole presented his analysis of the conversions and syllogisms of Aristotelian logic. He now considered this ancient logic to be a weak, fragmented attempt at a logical system. This neglected chapter is quite interesting because it is the only chapter where he analyzed particular propositions, making essential use of additional letters like \(v\) to encode some. This is also the chapter where he stated (incompletely) the rules for working with some.

Boole noted in Chapter XV of LT that when a premise about \(X\) and \(Y\) is expressed as an equation involving \(x, y\) and \(v\), the symbol \(v\) expressed some, but only in the context in which it appeared in the premise. For example, All \(X\) is \(Y\) has the expression \(x = vy\), which implies \(vx = vy\). This could be interpreted as Some \(X\) is \(Y\). A consequence of \(vx = vy\) is \(v(1-x) = v(1-y)\). However it was not permitted to read this as Some not-\(X\) is not-\(Y\) since \(v\) did not appear with \(1-x\) or \(1-y\) in the premise.

In Chapter XV Boole gave the reader a brief summary of traditional Aristotelian categorical logic, and analyzed some simple examples using ad hoc techniques with his algebra of logic. Then he launched into proving a comprehensive result by applying his General Method to the pair of equations:

\[\begin{align} vx &= v'y \\ wz &= w'y. \end{align}\]

This was the case of like middle terms. He permitted some of the parameters \(v, v', w, w'\) to be replaced by 1, but not both \(v, v'\) and not both \(w, w'\) can be replaced by 1. One could also replace \(y\) by \(1-y\) in both equations, and independently replace \(x\) by \(1-x\) and \(z\) by \(1-z\). The premises of many categorical syllogisms can be expressed in this form. His goal was to eliminate \(y\) and find expressions for \(x, 1-x\) and \(vx\) in terms of \(z, v, v', w, w'\).

Boole omitted writing out the reduction of the pair of equations to a single equation, as well as the elimination of the middle term \(y\) from this equation and the details of applying the Solution Theorem to obtain the desired expressions for \(x, 1-x\) and \(vx\), three equations involving large algebraic expressions.

His summary of the interpretation of this rather complicated algebraic analysis was simply that in the case of like middle terms with at least one middle term universal, equate the extremes. For example the premises All \(y\) is \(x\) and Some \(z\) is \(y\) are expressed by the pair of equations

\[\begin{align} vx &= y \\ wz &= w'y. \end{align}\]

Thus the conclusion equation is \(vx = wz\), which has the interpretation Some \(x\) is \(z\).

Then he noted that the remaining categorical syllogisms are such that their premises can be put in the form:

\[\begin{align} vx &= v'y \\ wz &= w'(1-y). \end{align}\]

This is the case of unlike middle terms. This led to another triple of large equations, again with details of the derivation omitted, but briefly summarized by Boole in two recipes.

First, in the case of unlike middle terms with at least one universal extreme, change the quantity and quality of that extreme and equate it to the other extreme. For example the premises All \(x\) is not-\(y\) and Some \(z\) is \(y\) gives the pair of equations

\[\begin{align} x &= v'(1-y) \\ wz &= w'y. \end{align}\]

Thus the conclusion equation is \(v(1-x) = wz\), which has the interpretation Some not-\(x\) is \(z\).

Secondly, in the case of unlike middle terms, both of which are universal, change the quantity and quality of one extreme and equate it to the other extreme. For example the premises All not-\(y\) is \(x\) and All \(y\) is \(z\) gives the pair of equations

\[\begin{align} vx &= (1-y) \\ wz &= y. \end{align}\]

Thus one conclusion equation is \(1-x = wz\), which has the interpretation All not-\(x\) is \(z\). The other is \(vx = 1-z\), which has the interpretation All not-\(z\) is \(x\). Each of these two propositions is just the conversion by negation of the other.

Boole noted (LT p. 237) that:

The process of investigation by which they are deduced will probably appear to be of needless complexity; and it is certain that they might have been obtained with greater facility, and without the aid of any symbolical instrument whatever.

5. Later Developments

5.1 Objections to Boole’s Algebra of Logic

Many objections to Boole’s system have been published over the years; four among the most important concern:

  • the dependency on Common Algebra,
  • the use of uninterpretable expressions in derivations,
  • the treatment of particular propositions by equations, and
  • the method of dealing with division.

For example, Boole’s use of \(v\) in the equational expression of propositions has been a long-standing bone of contention. Ernst Schröder (1841–1902) argued in Volume II of his Algebra der Logik (1891, p. 91) that the particular propositions about classes simply could not be expressed by equations in the algebra of logic.

We look at a different objection, namely at the Boole/Jevons dispute over adding \(x + x = x\) as a law.

[The following details are from The development of the theories of mathematical logic and the principles of mathematics, William Stanley Jevons, by Philip Jourdain, 1914.]

In an 1863 letter to Boole regarding a draft of a commentary on Boole’s system that Jevons was considering for his forthcoming book (Pure Logic, 1864), Jevons said:

It is surely obvious, however, that \(x+x\) is equivalent only to \(x,\ldots\);

Professor Boole’s notation [process of subtraction] is inconsistent with a self-evident law.

If my view be right, his system will come to be regarded as a most remarkable combination of truth and error.

Boole replied:

Thus the equation \(x + x = 0\) is equivalent to the equation \(x = 0\); but the expression \(x + x\) is not equivalent to the expression \(x\).

Jevons responded by asking if Boole could deny the truth of \(x + x = x\).

Boole, clearly exasperated, replies:

To be explicit, I now, however, reply that it is not true that in Logic \(x + x = x\), though it is true that \(x + x = 0\) is equivalent to \(x = 0\). If I do not write more it is not from any unwillingness to discuss the subject with you, but simply because if we differ on this fundamental point it is impossible that we should agree in others.

Jevons’s final effort to get Boole to understand the issue was:

I do not doubt that it is open to you to hold …[that \(x + x = x\) is not true] according to the laws of your system, and with this explanation your system probably is perfectly consistent with itself … But the question then becomes a wider one—does your system correspond to the Logic of common thought?

Jevons’s new law, \(x + x = x\), resulted from his conviction that + should denote what we now call union, where the membership of \(x + y\) is given by an inclusive or. Boole simply did not see any way to define \(x + y\) as a class unless \(x\) and \(y\) were disjoint, as already noted.

Various explanations have been given as to why Boole could not comprehend the possibility of Jevons’s suggestion. Boole clearly had the semantic concept of union—he expressed the union of \(x\) and \(y\) as \(x + (1-x)y\), a sum of two disjoint classes, and pointed out that the elements of this class are the ones that belong to either \(x\) or \(y\) or both. So how could he so completely fail to see the possibility of taking union for his fundamental operation + instead of his curious partial union operation?

The answer is simple: the law \(x + x = x\) would have destroyed his ability to use ordinary algebra: from \(x + x = x\) one has, by ordinary algebra, \(x = 0\). This would force every class symbol to denote the empty class. Jevons’s proposed law \(x + x = x\) was simply not true if one was committed to constructing the algebra of logic on top of the laws and inference rules of ordinary algebra. (Boolean rings satisfy all the laws of ordinary algebra, but not all of the inferences, for example, \(2x = 0\) implies \(x = 0\) does not hold in Boolean rings.) It seems quite possible that Boole found the simplest way to construct a model—whose domain was classes contained in the universe of discourse—for an algebra of logic that allowed one to use all the equations and equational arguments that were valid for numbers.

5.2 Modern Reconstruction of Boole’s System

A popular misconception is that Boole’s algebra of logic is the Boolean algebra of classes with the usual operations of union, intersection and complement. This error was forcefully pointed out by Hailperin in his 1981 paper “Boole’s algebra isn’t Boolean algebra,” a theme repeated in his path-breaking book Boole’s Logic and Probability (1986). Nonetheless the goal of the two algebras, Boole’s algebra and Boolean algebra, is the same, to provide an equational logic for the calculus of classes and for propositional logic. Thanks to Hailperin’s writings, for the first time there was clarity as to why Boole’s algebra gave correct results.

In his 1959 JSL review article Michael Dummett said:

anyone unacquainted with Boole’s works will receive an unpleasant surprise when he discovers how ill constructed his theory actually was and how confused his explanations of it.

For example, one does not find a clear statement of what Boole meant by equivalent or interpretable. For those familiar with partial algebras the latter word can easily be taken to mean is defined—the domain of definition of an algebraic term has a recursive definition, just as algebraic term has a recursive definition. After verifying examples like those in LT that show Boole’s algebraic methods give correct results for propositions about classes, the challenge for those who want to make sense of Boole’s algebra of logic is to make enough of the foundations of Boole’s algebra sufficiently precise so as to be able to justify the algebraic procedures he used.

In LT Boole gave detailed instructions on how to use his algebra to obtain valid propositional conclusions from propositional premises about classes when the propositions were universal. (He avoided particular propositions until Chapter XV, the last chapter of LT on logic.) He showed how to express English language propositions as equations, the steps needed to obtain desired conclusion equations, and how they are to be interpreted as conclusion propositions to the premises. The algebraic steps can be lengthy and he gave some shortcuts in Chapter IX, but we now know that any method to carry out such deductions will confront a complexity of computation that grows rapidly with the number of propositional variables.

As stated in Dummett’s comment above, Boole was anything but clear as to why his algebra worked as claimed, to give best possible conclusions to premises. This has inspired considerable commentary on what Boole meant to say, or should have said, and to what extent his justifications are valid.

Jevons (1864) gave sharp criticisms on the shortcomings of Boole’s algebra of logic and abandoned it to create the first version of modern Boolean algebra. (He did not have the unary complement operation that is now standard, but instead used De Morgan’s convention that the complement of a class \(A\) is \(a\).) The title of Jevon’s 1864 book started out with the words Pure Logic, referring to the fact that his version of the algebra of logic had been cleansed from connections to the algebra of numbers. The same point would be made in the introduction to Whitehead and Russell’s Principia Mathematica, that they had adopted the notation of Peano in part to free their work from such connections.

According to Hailperin(1986), the proof-theoretic side of Boole’s algebra is simply that of non-trivial commutative rings with unit and distinguished idempotent elements, but without non-zero additively or multiplicatively nilpotent elements. His favorite models were rings of signed multi-sets and he used them to explain why Boole’s theorems are correct for the algebra of logic of universal propositions. (Hailperin’s analysis did not apply to particular propositions.)

Frank W. Brown’s paper George Boole’s deductive system (2009) claims that one can avoid Hailperin’s signed multi-sets by working with the ring of polynomials Z[X] modulo a certain ideal.

Burris and Sankappanavar (2013) use the fact that Boole’s model, a partial-algebra, is isomorphic to the restriction of the operations of addition, multiplication and subtraction in the ring \(Z^U\) to the idempotent elements of the ring. Here \(Z\) is the ring of integers, and \(U\) is the universe of discourse. From this one can deduce that any Horn sentence which holds in \(Z\) when the variables are restricted to 0 and 1 will hold in \(Z^U\) when the variables are restricted to idempotent elements, and thus will hold in Boole’s partial-algebra. This gives an expanded version of Boole’s Rule of 0 and 1, and since his main results (Expansion, Reduction, Elimination and Solution) can be expressed by such Horn sentences, one has a quick proof that they are indeed valid.

6. Boole’s Methods

While reading through this section, on the technical details of Boole’s methods, the reader may find it useful to consult the

supplement of examples from Boole’s two books.

These examples have been augmented with comments explaining, in each step of a derivation by Boole, which aspect of his methods is being employed.

6.1 The Three Methods of Argument Analysis Used by Boole in LT

Boole used three methods to analyze arguments in LT:

  1. The first was the purely ad hoc algebraic manipulations that were used (in conjunction with a weak version of the Elimination Theorem) on the Aristotelian arguments in MAL.
  2. Secondly, in section 15 of Chapter II of LT, one finds the method that, in this article, is called the Rule of 0 and 1.

The theorems of LT combine to yield the master result,

  1. Boole’s General Method (in this article it will always be referred to using capitalized first letters—Boole just called it “a method”).

When applying the ad hoc method, he used ordinary algebra along with the idempotent law \(x^2 = x\) to manipulate equations. There was no pre-established procedure to follow—success with this method depended on intuitive skills developed through experience.

The second method, the Rule of 0 and 1, is very powerful, but it depends on being given a collection of premise equations and a conclusion equation. It is a truth-table like method (but Boole never drew a table when applying the method) to determine if the argument is correct. He only used this method to establish the theorems that justified his General Method, even though it is an excellent tool for verifying simple arguments like syllogisms. Boole was mainly interested in finding the most general conclusion from given premises, modulo certain conditions, and aside from his general theorems, showed no interest in simply verifying logical arguments. The Rule of 0 and 1 is a somewhat shadowy figure in LT—it has no name, and is reformulated in Section 6 of Chapter V as a procedure to use when carrying out a derivation and encountering uninterpretable terms.

The third method to analyze arguments was the highlight of Boole’s work in logic, his General Method (discussed immediately after this). This is the one he used for all but the simplest examples in LT; for the simplest examples he resorted to the first method of ad hoc algebraic techniques because, for one skilled in algebraic manipulations, using them is usually far more efficient than going through the General Method.

The final version (from LT) of his General Method for analyzing arguments is, briefly stated, to:

  1. express the premise propositions as equations,
  2. apply a prescribed sequence of algebraic processes to the equations, processes which yield desired conclusion equations, and then
  3. interpret the equational conclusions as propositional conclusions, yielding the desired consequences of the original collection of propositions.

With this method Boole had replaced the art of reasoning from premise propositions to conclusion propositions by a routine mechanical algebraic procedure. On p. 240 of LT he said that it was always theoretically possible to carry out elimination by piecing together syllogisms, but there was no method (i.e., algorithm) given for doing this.

In LT Boole divided propositions into two kinds, primary and secondary. These correspond to, but are not exactly the same as, the Aristotelian division into categorical and hypothetical propositions. First we discuss his General Method applied to primary propositions.

6.2. Boole’s General Method for Primary Propositions

Boole recognized three “great leading types” of primary propositions (LT, p. 64):

  • All \(X\) is \(Y\)
  • All \(X\) is all \(Y\)
  • Some \(X\) is \(Y\)

These were his version of the Aristotelian categorical propositions, where \(X\) is the subject term and \(Y\) the predicate term. The terms \(X\) and \(Y\) could be complex, for example, \(X\) could be “Either \(u\) and not-\(v\), or else \(w\)”. For Boole such terms were not very complicated, at most a disjunction of conjunctions of simple terms and their contraries, no doubt a reflection of the fact that natural language terms are not very complex.

STEP 1: Propositional terms were expressed by algebraic terms as in the following; one can substitute more complex terms for \(x\), \(y\). Boole did not give a recursive definition, only some simple examples:

Terms MAL LT
universe 1 p.15 1 p.48
empty class ––– 0 p.47
not \(x\) \(1 - x\) p.20 \(1 - x\) p.48
\(x\) and \(y\) \(xy\) p.16 \(xy\) p.28
\(x\) or \(y\) (inclusive) ––– \(x + y(1 - x)\)
\(xy + x(1 - y) + y(1- x)\)
\(x\) or \(y\) (exclusive) ––– \(x(1 - y) + y(1 - x)\) p.56

STEP 2: Having expressed the propositional terms as algebraic terms, one then expressed the propositions as equations using the following; again one can substitute more complex terms for \(x\), \(y\), but not for \(v\):

MAL (1847) LT (1854)
All \(x\) is \(y\) \(x(1-y) = 0\) p.26 \(x = vy\) pp.64,152
No \(x\) is \(y\) \(xy = 0\) (not primary) –––
All \(x\) is all \(y\) (not primary) ––– \(x = y\)
Some \(x\) is \(y\) \(v = xy\) \(vx = vy\)
Some \(x\) is not \(y\) \(v = x(1-y)\) (not primary) –––

In LT, prior to chapter XV, the one on Aristotelian logic, Boole’s examples only used universal propositions. (One can speculate that he had encountered difficulties with particular propositions and avoided them.) Those of the form All x is y were first expressed as \(x = vy\), and then \(v\) was promptly eliminated, giving \(x = xy\). (Similarly if \(x\) was replaced by not-\(x\), etc.) Boole said the elimination of \(v\) was a convenient but unnecessary step. For the examples of All x is y in the first fourteen chapters he could simply have used the expression \(x = xy\), skipping the use of the parameter \(v\).

To simplify the notation he used the same letter, say \(v\), for some when there were several universal premises, an incorrect step if one accepts Boole’s claim that it is not necessary to eliminate the \(v\)’s immediately. Distinct universal propositions require different \(v\)’s in their translation; else one can run into the following situation. Consider the two premises All \(x\) is \(z\) and All \(y\) is \(z\). Using the same \(v\) for their equational expressions gives \(x = vz\) and \(y = vz\), leading to the equation \(x = y\), and then to the false conclusion \(x\) equals \(y\). In chapter XV he was careful to use distinct \(v\)’s for the expressions of distinct premises.

Boole used the four categorical propositions as his primary forms in 1847, but in 1854 he eliminated the negative propositional forms, noting that one could change not \(y\) to not-\(y\). Thus in 1854 he would express No \(x\) is \(y\) by All \(x\) is not-\(y\), with the translation \(x = v(1-y)\), and then eliminating \(v\) to obtain

\[ x(1 - (1 - y)) = 0, \]

which simplifies to \(xy = 0\).

STEP 3: After expressing the premises in algebraic form one has a collection of equations, say

\[ p_1 = q_1, \quad p_2 = q_2, \quad \ldots, \quad p_n = q_n. \]

Write these as equations with 0 on the right side, that is, as

\[ r_1 = 0, \quad r_2 = 0, \quad \ldots, \quad r_n = 0, \]


\[ r_1 := p_1 - q_1, \quad r_2 := p_2 - q_2, \quad \dots, \quad r_n := p_n - q_n. \]

An alternative way of forming the \(r_i\) to preserve the idempotent property, in case the \(p_i\) and \(q_i\) have this property, is given in Section 3 of Chapter X.

STEP 4: (REDUCTION) [LT (p. 121) ]

Reduce the system of equations

\[ r_1 = 0, \quad r_2 = 0, \quad \ldots, \quad r_n = 0, \]

to a single equation \(r = 0\). Boole had three different methods for doing this—one of them was only for the case that the \(r_i\) were idempotent. He had a strong preference for summing the squares:

\[ r := r_1^2 + \cdots + r_n^2 = 0. \]

An alternative way of forming \(r\) to preserve the idempotent property, in case the \(r_i\) have this property, is also given in Section 3 of Chapter X.

Steps 1 through 4 are mandatory in Boole’s General Method. After executing these steps there are various options for continuing, depending on the goal.

STEP 5: (ELIMINATION) [LT (p. 101)]

Suppose one wants the most general equational conclusion derived from \(r = 0\) that involves some, but not all, of the class symbols in \(r\). Then one wants to eliminate certain symbols. Suppose \(r\) involves the class symbols

\[ x_1, \ldots, x_j \text{ and } y_1, \ldots, y_k. \]

Then one can write \(r\) as \(r(x_1, \ldots, x_j, y_1, \ldots ,y_k)\).

Boole’s procedure to eliminate the symbols \(x_1, \ldots ,x_j\) from

\[ r(x_1, \ldots, x_j, y_1, \ldots, y_k) = 0 \]

to obtain

\[ s(y_1, \ldots, y_k) = 0 \]

was as follows:

  1. form all possible expressions \(r(a_1, \ldots, a_j, y_1, \ldots, y_k)\) where \(a_1, \ldots, a_j\) are each either 0 or 1, then
  2. multiply all of these expressions together to obtain \(s(y_1, \ldots, y_k)\).

For example, eliminating \(x_1, x_2\) from

\[ r(x_1, x_2, y) = 0 \]


\[ s(y) = 0 \]


\[ s(y) := r(0, 0, y) \cdot r(0, 1, y) \cdot r(1, 0, y) \cdot r(1, 1, y). \]

STEP 6: (DEVELOPMENT, or EXPANSION) [MAL (p. 60), LT (pp. 72, 73)].

Given a term, say \(r(x_1, \ldots, x_j, y_1, \ldots, y_k)\), one can expand the term with respect to a subset of the class symbols. To expand with respect to \(x_1, \ldots, x_j\) gives

\[ r = \text{ sum of the terms } r(a_1, \ldots, a_j, y_1 ,\ldots, y_k) \cdot C(a_1, x_1) \cdots C(a_j, x_j), \]

where \(a_1 , \ldots ,a_j\) range over all sequences of 0s and 1s of length \(j\), and where the \(C(a_i, x_i)\) are defined by:

\[ C(1, x_i) := x_i, \text{ and } C(0, x_i) := 1- x_i. \]

The products

\[ C(a_1, x_1) \cdots C(a_j, x_j) \]

are the constituents of \(x_1 , \ldots ,x_j\). There are \(2^j\) different constituents for \(j\) symbols—the regions of a Venn diagram give a popular way to visualize constituents. It will be convenient to say an equation of the form

\[ C(a_1, x_1) \cdots C(a_j, x_j) = 0 \]

is a constituent equation.


Given an equation \(r = 0\), suppose one wants to solve this equation for one of the class symbols, say \(x\), in terms of the other class symbols, say they are \(y_1 , \ldots ,y_k\). To solve:

\[ r(x, y_1 , \ldots ,y_k) = 0 \]

for \(x\), first let:

\[\begin{align} N(y_1 , \ldots ,y_k) &= r(0, y_1 , \ldots ,y_k) \\ D(y_1 , \ldots ,y_k) &= r(0, y_1 , \ldots ,y_k) - r(1, y_1 , \ldots ,y_k). \end{align}\]


\[\tag{*} x = s(y_1 ,\ldots ,y_k) \]

where \(s(y_1 ,\ldots ,y_k)\) is:

  1. the sum of all constituents \(C(a_1, y_1) \cdots C(a_k, y_k)\) where \(a_1 , \ldots ,a_k\) range over all sequences of 0s and 1s for which:

    \[ N(a_1 , \ldots ,a_k) = D(a_1 , \ldots ,a_k) \ne 0, \]


  1. the sum of all the terms of the form \(v_{a_1 \ldots a_k} \cdot C(a_1, y_1) \cdots C(a_k, y_k)\) for which:

    \[ N(a_1 , \ldots ,a_k) = D(a_1 , \ldots ,a_k) = 0. \]

The \(v_{a_1 \ldots a_k}\) are parameters, denoting arbitrary classes (the appearance of parameters is similar to what one sees in the solution of linear differential equations, a subject in which Boole was an expert).

To the equation (*) for \(x\) adjoin the constraint conditions (these are constituent equations that Boole called “independent relations”)

\[ C(a_1, y_1) \cdots C(a_k, y_k) = 0 \]


\[ D(a_1 , \ldots ,a_k) \ne N(a_1 , \ldots ,a_k) \ne 0. \]

Note that one is to evaluate the terms:

\[ D(a_1 , \ldots ,a_k) \text{ and } N(a_1 , \ldots ,a_k) \]

using ordinary arithmetic. Thus solving an equation \(r = 0\) for a class symbol \(x\) gives an equation

\[ x = s(y_1 ,\ldots ,y_k), \]

perhaps with constraint constituent equations. On p. 92 Boole noted that the solution plus constraint equations could be written simply as

\[\begin{align} x &= A + vB\\ C &= 0, \end{align}\]

where A, B and C are each sums of distinct constituents.

This presentation gives exactly the same solution as that of Boole, but without the mysterious use of fractions like \(0/0\) and \(1/0\). Boole used formal division to express \(x\) as \(N\) divided by \(D\), and then a formal expansion where the coefficient of the constituent \(C(a_1, y_1) \cdots C(a_k, y_k)\) is the fraction

\[ N(a_1 , \ldots ,a_k) / D(a_1 , \ldots ,a_k) . \]

He had the following rules for how to decode the effect of the coefficients on their constituents: (1) for the coefficient \(m/m\) with \(m \neq 0\) the constituent is kept in the solution; (2) for \(0/m\) with \(m \neq 0\) the constituent is deleted; (3) the coefficient \(0/0\) is changed into an arbitrary parameter; and (4) any other coefficient indicated that the constituent was to be removed and set equal to 0. This use of formal division and formal expansion is best regarded as a clever mnemonic device.

STEP 8: (INTERPRETATION) [MAL pp. 64–65, LT (Chap. VI, esp. pp. 82–83)]

Any polynomial equation \(p(y_1 , \ldots ,y_k) = 0\) is equivalent to the collection of constituent equations

\[ C(a_1, y_1) \cdots C(a_k, y_k) = 0 \]

for which \(p(a_1 , \ldots ,a_k)\) is not 0. A constituent equation merely asserts that a certain intersection of the original classes and their complements is empty. For example,

\[ y_1 (1-y_2)(1-y_3) = 0 \]

expresses the proposition All \(y_1\) is \(y_2\) or \(y_3\), or equivalently, All \(y_1\) and not \(y_2\) is \(y_3\). It is routine to interpret constituent equations as propositions.

6.3. Boole’s General Method for Secondary Propositions

Secondary propositions were Boole’s version of the propositions that one encounters in the study of hypothetical syllogisms in Aristotelian logic, statements like If \(X\) is true or \(Y\) is true then \(Z\) is true. The symbols \(X, Y, Z\), etc. referred to primary propositions. In keeping with the incomplete nature of the Aristotelian treatment of hypothetical propositions, Boole did not give a precise description of possible forms for his secondary propositions.

The key (but not original) observation that Boole used was simply that one can convert secondary propositions into primary propositions. In MAL he adopted the convention found in Whately (1826), that given a propositional symbol \(X\), the symbol \(x\) will denote the cases in which \(X\) is true, whereas in LT Boole let \(x\) denote the times for which \(X\) is true. With this the secondary proposition If \(X\) is true or \(Y\) is true then \(Z\) is true is expressed by All \(x\) or \(y\) is \(z\). The equation \(x = 1\) is the equational translation of \(X\) is true (in all cases, or for all times), and \(x = 0\) says \(X\) is false (in all cases, or for all times). The concepts of all cases and all times depend on the choice of the universe of discourse.

With this translation scheme it is clear that Boole’s treatment of secondary propositions can be analyzed by the methods he had developed for primary propositions. This was Boole’s propositional logic.

Boole worked mainly with Aristotelian propositions in MAL, using the traditional division into categoricals and hypotheticals. In LT this division was replaced by the similar but more general primary versus secondary classification, where the subject and predicate were allowed to become complex names, and the number of propositions in an argument became unrestricted. With this the parallels between the logic of primary propositions and that of secondary propositions became clear, with one notable difference, namely it seems that the secondary propositions that Boole considered always translated into universal primary propositions.

MAL (1847) LT (1854)
\(X\) is true \(x = 1\) p.51 \(x = 1\) p.172
\(X\) is false \(x = 0\) p.51 \(x = 0\) p.172
\(X\) is true and \(Y\) is true \(xy = 1\) p.51 \(xy = 1\) p.172
\(X\) is true or \(Y\) is true (inclusive) \(x + y -xy = 1\) p.52 –––
\(X\) is true or \(Y\) is true (exclusive) \(x -2xy+ y = 1\) p.53 \(x(1 - y) + y(1 - x) = 1\) p.173
If \(X\) is true then \(Y\) is true \(x(1-y) = 0\) p.54 \(x = vy\) p.173


Primary Literature

  • Boole, G., 1841, “On the Integration of Linear Differential Equations with Constant Coefficients,” The Cambridge Mathematical Journal, 2: 114–119.
  • –––, 1841, “Researches on the Theory of Analytical Transformations, with a special application to the Reduction of the General Equation of the Second Order,” The Cambridge Mathematical Journal, 2: 64–73.
  • –––, 1841, “On Certain Theorems in the Calculus of Variations,” The Cambridge Mathematical Journal, 2: 97–102.
  • –––, 1847, The Mathematical Analysis of Logic, Being an Essay Towards a Calculus of Deductive Reasoning, Cambridge: Macmillan, Barclay, & Macmillan, and London: George Bell; reprinted, Oxford: Blackwell, 1951.
  • –––, 1848, “The Calculus of Logic,” The Cambridge and Dublin Mathematical Journal, 3: 183–198.
  • –––, 1854, An Investigation of The Laws of Thought on Which are Founded the Mathematical Theories of Logic and Probabilities, London: Walton and Maberly, Cambridge: Macmillan and Co.; reprinted, New York: Dover, 1958.
  • –––, 1859, A Treatise on Differential Equations, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, and London: Macmillan.
  • –––, 1860, A Treatise on the Calculus of Finite Differences, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, and London: Macmillan.
  • –––, 1997, Selected Manuscripts on Logic and its Philosophy (Science Networks Historical Studies: Volume 20), edited by Ivor Grattan-Guinness and Gérard Bornet. Basel, Boston, and Berlin: Birkhäuser Verlag.
  • De Morgan, A., 1839, “On the Foundation of Algebra,” Transactions of the Cambridge Philosophical Society, VII, 174–187.
  • –––, 1841, “On the Foundation of Algebra, No. II,” Transactions of the Cambridge Philosophical Society VII, 287–300.
  • –––, 1847, Formal Logic: or, the Calculus of Inference, Necessary and Probable, Originally published in London by Taylor and Walton. Reprinted in London by The Open Court Company, 1926.
  • –––, On the Syllogism, and Other Logical Writings, P. Heath (ed.), New Haven: Yale University Press, 1966. (A posthumous collection of De Morgan’s papers on logic.)
  • Gregory, D.F., 1839, “Demonstrations in the Differential Calculus and the Calculus of Finite Differences,” The Cambridge Mathematical Journal, I: 212–222.
  • –––, 1839, “I.–On the Elementary Principles of the Application of Algebraical Symbols to Geometry,” The Cambridge Mathematical Journal, II (No. VII): 1–9.
  • –––, 1840, “On the Real Nature of Symbolical Algebra.” Transactions of the Royal Society of Edinburgh, 14: 208–216. Also in [Gregory 1865, pp. 1–13].
  • –––, 1865, The Mathematical Writings of Duncan Farquharson Gregory, M.A., W. Walton (ed.), Cambridge: Deighton, Bell.
  • Jevons, W.S., 1864, Pure Logic, or the Logic of Quality apart from Quantity: with Remarks on Boole’s System and on the Relation of Logic and Mathematics, London: Edward Stanford. Reprinted 1971 in Pure Logic and Other Minor Works, R. Adamson and H.A. Jevons (eds.), New York: Lennox Hill Pub. & Dist. Co.
  • Lacroix, S.F, 1797/1798, Traité du Calcul Différentiel et du Calcul Integral, Paris: Chez Courcier.
  • Lagrange, J.L., 1788, Méchanique Analytique, Paris: Desaint.
  • –––, 1797, Théorie des Fonctions Analytique, Paris: Imprimerie de la Republique.
  • Peacock, G., 1830, Treatise on Algebra, 2nd ed., 2 vols., Cambridge: J.&J.J. Deighton, 1842/1845.
  • –––, 1833, “Report on the Recent Progress and Present State of certain Branches of Analysis”, in Report of the Third Meeting of the British Association for the Advancement of Science (held at Cambridge in 1833), London: John Murray, pp. 185–352.
  • Schröder, E., 1890–1910, Algebra der Logik (Volumes I–III), Leipzig: B.G. Teubner; reprinted Chelsea 1966.
  • Whately, R., 1826, Elements of Logic, London: J. Mawman.

Secondary Literature

Cited Works

  • Aiken, H.A., 1951, Synthesis of Electronic Computing and Control Circuits, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.
  • Brown, F.W, 2009, “ George Boole’s Deductive System”, Notre Dame Journal of Logic, 50: 303–330.
  • Burris, S. and Sankappanavar, H.P., 2013, “The Horn Theory of Boole’s Partial Algebras”, The Bulletin of Symbolic Logic, 19: 97–105.
  • Burris, S.N., 2015, “George Boole and Boolean Algebra”, European Mathematical Society Newsletter, 98: 27–31.
  • Dummett, M., 1959, “Review of Studies in Logic and Probability, by George Boole”, Watts & Co., London, 1952, edited by R. Rhees, The Journal of Symbolic Logic, 24: 203–209.
  • Ewald, W. (ed.), 1996, From Kant to Hilbert. A Source Book in the History of Mathematics, 2 volumes, Oxford: Oxford University Press.
  • Grattan-Guiness, I., 2001, The Search for Mathematical Roots, Princeton, NJ: Princeton University Press.
  • Hailperin, T., 1976, Boole’s Logic and Probability, (Series: Studies in Logic and the Foundations of Mathematics, 85), Amsterdam, New York, Oxford: Elsevier North-Holland. 2nd edition, Revised and enlarged, 1986.
  • –––, 1981, “Boole’s algebra isn’t Boolean algebra”, Mathematics Magazine, 54: 172–184.
  • Jourdain, P.E.B., 1914, “The Development of the Theories of Mathematical Logic and the Principles of Mathematics. William Stanley Jevons”, Quarterly Journal of Pure and Applied Mathematics, 44: 113–128.
  • MacHale, D., 1985, George Boole, His Life and Work, Dublin: Boole Press; 2nd edition, 2014, Cork University Press.
  • MacHale, D. and Cohen, Y., 2018, New Light on George Boole, Cork University Press.
  • Schröder, E., 1890–1910, Algebra der Logik (Volumes I–III), Leipzig: B.G. Teubner; reprinted Chelsea 1966.
  • Whitney, H., 1933, “Characteristic Functions and the Algebra of Logic”, Annals of Mathematics (Second Series), 34: 405–414.

Other Important Literature

  • Couturat, L., 1905, L’algèbre de la Logique, 2d edition, Librairie Scientifique et Technique Albert Blanchard, Paris; English translation by Lydia G. Robinson: Open Court Publishing Co., Chicago & London, 1914; reprinted by Mineola: Dover Publications, 2006.
  • Frege, G., 1880, “Boole’s Logical Calculus and the Concept-Script”, in Gottlob Frege: Posthumous Writings, Basil Blackwell, Oxford, 1979. English translation of Nachgelassene Schriften, vol. 1, edited by H. Hermes, F. Kambartel, and F. Kaulbach, Felix Meiner, Hamburg, 1969.
  • Kneale, W., and M. Kneale, 1962, The Development of Logic, Oxford: The Clarendon Press.
  • Lewis, C. I., 1918, A Survey of Symbolic Logic, University of California Press, Berkeley; reprinted New York: Dover Publications, 1960. (See Chap. II, “The Classic, or Boole-Schröder Algebra of Logic.”)
  • Peirce, C. S., 1880, “On the Algebra of Logic”, American Journal of Mathematics, 3: 15–57.
  • Smith, G. C., 1983, “Boole’s Annotations on The Mathematical Analysis of Logic”, History and Philosophy of Logic, 4: 27–39.
  • Styazhkin, N. I., 1969, Concise History of Mathematical Logic from Leibniz to Peano, Cambridge, MA: The MIT Press.
  • van Evra, J. W., 1977, “A Reassessment of George Boole’s Theory of Logic”, Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic, 18: 363–77.
  • Venn, J., 1894, Symbolic Logic, 2nd edition (revised), London: Macmillan; reprinted Bronx: Chelsea Publishing Co., 1971.

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