Notes to Brentano’s Theory of Judgement

1. Brentano’s students not only transmitted his views, they often took them as an inspiration for going beyond—or rebelling against—what has become called “Brentanian orthodoxy”. This debate is not covered in the present article. But see the works by Hillebrand, Husserl, Marty, Meinong, and Twardowski mentioned in the bibliography, as well as the insightful comparisons of their views with that of Brentano in Betti 2013, Betti & van der Schaar 2004, Cobb-Stevens 1998, Fréchette 2014, Ierna 2008, Janousek 2015 and 2017, Łukasiewicz 2007, Rojszczak & Smith 2003, and Staiti 2015.

2. Rollinger 2020, 106–141 focusses on Brentano’s remarks about judgement in Brentano’s lectures on logic..

3. Brentano also holds that combing ideas is not sufficient for making a judgement. We prefer to translate the German term ‘Merkmal’ that Brentano used literally and uniformly as ‘mark’ and not, as it is done in the published translation of Psychologie, sometimes as ‘attribute’, sometimes as ‘feature’. We have changed the translations accordingly.

4. References in square quotes are to the two currently available German editions cited in the bibliography.

5. Brentano acknowledges that this way of using ‘content’ deviates from the tradition. For it allows negative and positive judgements to have the same content. In his Logic lectures (EL80, 13[140]) Brentano distinguished in the content of a judgement form and matter, where matter corresponds to the marks or combination thereof and quality to the positive or negative force with which these marks are thought. In this terminology positive and negative judgements can have the same matter, but differ in form.

6. That was not Brentano’s last word on this matter however. In VNV he backtracked and argued that Bain’s view is compatible with his own.

7. See Frege 1918, 152ff; Reinach 1911, § 14ff (in the English translation). For discussion see Textor 2013a.

8. The English translation misses this point by translating “anerkennen” as “accepting”. We therefore change the translation and say that for Brentano in a positive judgement one acknowledges an object (and thereby accepts its existence), while in a negative judgement one rejects an object (and thereby denies its existence).

9. Actually, the argument is more complex than this brief summary suggests: The argument assumes that in acknowledging a combination all its parts are acknowledged in the same way. But if one can acknowledge an object only together with others, it becomes redundant to acknowledge it in particular. Predicating existence is therefore no idle move. In the negative case, one might hold that the implicit affirmation of A’s existence is suspended. That observation may be taken to confirm Brentano’s point that in such cases “more needs to be done” than merely separating the ideas of A and the ideas of existence. But it may not refute the view that even in negative existential judgements an act of predication takes place.

10. Crivelli (2004: 103–104) gives a Brentano inspired discussion of this problem for Aristotle.

11. If the following passage has been correctly transmitted by his students, then Brentano backtracked here:

[I]n his theory of judgement Aristotle overlooked […] simple acknowledgments and rejections, which do not have predicates; his definition of true and false is of no use for them. We need a definition which is applicable to all judgements. (FCE 87 [138])

Brentano must have changed his mind about how to read Metaphysics. As Tassone notes, one can find here the roots of Brentano’s reworking of Aristotle’s theory of truth, moving from a substantive to a deflationary account. (see Tassone 2011: 305; and Brandl 2017).

12. The unusual formalism should make plain that “God exists” is not to be formalized according to St. Thomas and Brentano as “F(a)”, where “a” stands for God and “F” for the property to exist. The negations “God does not exist” and “God is not almighty” would accordingly be formalized as “God (+not)” and “God (+not) almighty”, where “(+not)” indicates the negative quality of the judgement, i.e., an act of denial.

13. What Brentano might also find objectionable is the way in which St. Thomas in the passage he quotes characterizes the use of “is”, namely as an “act of essence” that does not mean “the composition of a proposition effected by the mind in joining a predicate to a subject”. In Brentano’s view, “act of affirmation” is the proper way to describe what St. Thomas has in mind.

14. Rosenkoetter (2010: 553ff ) provides further textual evidence that Kant held that there are one-term judgements. See also Martin (2010) who teases out the connection between Kant and Fichte in relation to the notion of positing.

15. Mill also disagrees with Kant when he goes on to say that for him “existence” is still “a real conception [or?] Idea and a real predicate” (Mill 1872 [1972: 1928])

16. According to Martin (2010), one may put this coincidence in a larger historical context by going back to Fichte’s theory of thetic judgements. That does not prove, of course, that there was any direct influence from Fichte on Brentano.

17. Brentano [PES 214 fn [II 57 fn; SVS 1, 237 fn] references Drobisch’s (1863: §53) comments on Herbart’s achievement.

18. For further discussion of the argument see Textor 2007.

19. Brentano’s arguments are directed against Reid and Hamilton.

20. For different ways to spell out Brentano’s suggestion about existence see Kriegel 2015 and Textor 2017. Vallicella 2001 attempts to show that Brentano’s suggestion cannot be made to work.

21. See Mulligan 2013, 126.

22. For a defense of Brentano’s view against Jerusalem’s arguments see Textor 2020.

23. Alonzo Church acknowledges Brentano’s achievement, saying that he

seems to have been the first explicitly to question the validity of those moods of the categorical syllogism which purport to infer a particular conclusion from two universal premises, and to point out that the traditional ‘immediate inferences’ sometimes contradict one another. (Church 1947: 57)

For critical discussions and further elaborations of Brentano’s logic reform see Prior 1962: 166ff., Prior 1976, 111-16, Terrell 1976, and Simons 1987.

24. Brentano denies that categorical propositions express such simple existential judgements (which he now calls “direct” judgements), but he does not deny their existence in perceptual experience. (Unfortunately, the term “direct” has been dropped in the English translation (see PES 295). Marty picks up the distinction between “direct” and “indirect” judgements in his logic lectures of 1894/95 and suggests that disjunctive and conjunctive judgements are indirect (see Marty 2011: 473–474).

25. The actual source of this argument is unclear. It comes from lectures by Franz Hillebrand who may have used material from Brentano’s own lectures.

26. There is no reference here to SVS since all additional material from Brentano’s Nachlass has been omitted in this edition.

27. Linguists find a view in which conjunction of lexical items is prior to the application of functions attractive. See Pietroski 2005, 2.

28. We assume that Brentano is committed to answering “yes”, although we admit that the textual evidence for this commitment is not conclusive (see PES 317f., [II 206f.])

29. Brentano criticizes Mill for having missed the idea that judgements might be only partially separable form each other, and not like a team of horses that one can always separate (see OKRW fn 22 [SVS 3, 66]).

30. Brentano notes that we are so used to these terms that they tend to enter our metaphysical theories. Even Aristotle “who knows very well that a negative cannot become an object … comprises just those negative expressions” (PES 299, [II 169; SVS 1, 417].

31. On this point, see Brandl & Textor 2021.

32. A hint towards this possibility is made by Hillebrand in his elaboration of Brentano’s theory of judgement (see Hillebrand 1891: 99). Hillebrand claims that propositions of the A-form may be taken to be logically equivalent with a conjunction of two judgements: “There are S and there is no S that is not P”. Likewise, one might suggest that proposition of the E-form to be equivalent with a conjunction of two judgements: “There are S and there is no S that is P”. While Hillebrand thinks to have thereby shown that such propositions are capable of expressing double judgements, he does not explain how the two judgements might be psychologically conjoined. Something like the following would be required: “There are S and all of these S are P” and “There are S and none of these S are P”. But that leaves the terms “all” and “none” in these formulas unexplained. It therefore remains unclear that Hillebrand has shown, as he claims, how one can re-introduce with the help of the theory of double judgement the rule of subalternation as a valid principle of syllogistic logic (ibid.)

33. Higher-order judgements are still reducible, if one interprets them as claiming that a subject who judges correctly or incorrectly exists or does not exist. But that makes the negative term “incorrect” part of the subject-matter of these judgements, in violation of Brentano’s restriction against negative properties. In line with that restriction, these higher-order judgements may therefore also turn out to be unreducible to the existential form.

34. Of course, one could try to modify Brentano’s theory in a way that still reaches this goal. Following an idea of Anton Marty, G. Bacigalupo has put forward such a proposal that takes all categorical propositions to express double judgements, combined with a meta-judgement stating that either the whole double-judgement or part of it is incorrect. Bacigalupo concludes that on this version of Brentano’s theory, “the I-form becomes the only primitive form; all other forms may be derived from it by means of the notion of incorrectness” (2018: 256). From Brentano’s point of view, this modification has two shortcomings. It overlooks that simple existential judgements are still more primitive than judgements of the I-form, and one cannot make sense of the notion of “incorrectness” without taking both affirmative and negative judgements as primitive.

Copyright © 2022 by
Johannes L. Brandl <>
Mark Textor <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free