Notes to Charlie Dunbar Broad

1. Cf. also Broad 1923, pp. 246-7 and 1938, p. 66.

2. The relation of acquaintance is, as Broad says, the converse of the relation of manifestation (1925, p. 634).

3. Even though Broad does not think it is possible to strictly define the notion of prehension he points out a number of key features (1952a, pp. 14-15). The most important of these are the following: (a) prehension is a relation holding between a type of experience and particulars of such kind that adjectives like “red” and “hot” can be predicated of them; (b) it is logically possible that a particular that was prehended as having a certain quality could have had that quality regardless of whether anyone ever prehended it.

4. It might be suggested that prehending is itself a form of knowing. “If we use ‘know’ in such a way that what is known must be a fact, it is certain that prehending would not be a form of knowing. For, if we prehend anything, it is particulars” (1952a, p. 14). On the other hand, he points out that, since there is a usage such that, for example, Broad himself could say ‘I knew McTaggart, but I did not know Sidgwick’ there is “nothing in the usage of the word to rule out the suggestion that prehending might properly be described as a form of ‘knowing’” (ibid).

5. In addition he provides phenomenologically sensitive descriptions of the type of experience we have when we are “feeling an external body”. He carefully notes that apart from the qualitative aspect the experience, i.e. the experience of the body as rough or smooth and warm or cold there is also its dynamical aspect, which is “the experience of actively pushing or pulling it and making it move or stay still in spite of its varying degrees of resistance to one’s efforts” 1952a, p. 6. The terminology is Broad’s.

6. Cf. 1923, p. 255.—Broad gives more persuasive examples in Broad 1959a. Consider such feelings as feeling tired and feeling sick. As he says, it would be “extremely strained and unnatural to express these in terms which imply the ‘act-object’ analysis” (1959, p. 798).

7. See also Broad 1959a pp. 797-801; 1954a, pp. 164, 169; 1942, pp. 10-11.

8. Are sensa mental entities? This question is thoroughly examined in Scientific Thought. Broad points out that the question is ambiguous, distinguishing no less than five different meanings. See Broad 1923, p. 253-66.

9. The reason is that the objective constituents of perception are not per se instances of the concept of physical object, and it is also only by virtue of the concept physical object that we can hold “they are ‘parts of’ or ‘manifestations of’ instances of this concept” 1925, p. 217.

10. It is sometimes assumed that the Growing Block Theory originates with Broad. However, although Broad may be the first to defend the theory it is first articulated by Samuel Alexander in his book of 1920. See Emily Thomas (2019).

11. Broad could be the first who suggested the Rate of Passage Argument. Cf. Ned Markossian, 1993, p. 836.

12. The argument is typically associated with Chisholm (1964). Broad was, of course, earlier than Chisholm; he was, however, not the first to present the argument. As an anonymous referee pointed out, it can be found in Moore’s Ethics (1912) and in Sidgwick’s The Methods of Ethics (1907). And it may be that Schopenhauer somewhere hints at it.

13. This is of course not how Broad phrases the conclusion of the argument. He phrases it, in effect, as: there are situations where S could have done A if she had willed to do A but where A, in spite of that, is not obligable. There is, then, some other sense of ‘could’ and ‘could not’ such that the fact that S could not (in that sense) have done A entails that A is not obligable.

14. Broad mentions the case of Sally Beauchamp.

15. In Broad 1958, he adds: “Here we shall have to extend the phrase ‘analysis of propositions’ to cover the attempt to show that certain kinds of sentences in the indicative, e.g., moral ones such as ‘Lying is wrong’ and ‘People ought to pay their debts’, do not in fact express or convey propositions at all. This extension can easily be made by substituting for the phrase ‘analysis of propositions’ the phrase ‘analysis of what is expressed by sentences in the indicative’ ” (p. 114).

16. It is hard to resist quoting in full the amusing passage from which this is drawn:

[D]id Bacon provide any logical justification for the principles and methods which he elicited and which scientists assume and use? He did not, and he never saw that it was necessary to do so. There is a skeleton in the cupboard of Inductive Logic, which Bacon never suspected and Hume first exposed to view. Kant conducted the most elaborate funeral in history, and called Heaven and Earth and the Noumena under the Earth to witness that the skeleton was finally disposed of. But, when the dust of the funeral procession had subsided and the last strains of the Transcendental Organ had died away, the coffin was found to be empty and the skeleton in its old place. Mill discretely closed the door of the cupboard, and with infinite tact turned the conversation into more cheerful channels. Mr Johnson and Mr Keynes may fairly be said to have reduced the skeleton to the dimensions of a mere skull. But that obstinate caput mortuum still awaits the undertaker who will give it Christian burial. May we venture to hope that when Bacon’s next centenary is celebrated the great work which he set going will be completed; and that Inductive Reasoning, which has long been the glory of Science, will have ceased to be the scandal of Philosophy? (1952b, p. 142–3)

These are the concluding words of his commemorative address on the occasion of The Bacon Tercentenary, 5 October 1926.

17. In his illuminating contribution to the Schilpp volume, Georg Henrik von Wright writes: “as far as I know [Broad] is the first to have given systematic attention to the logic of the various notions of condition” (1959, p. 341). He also claims that Broad ought to be regarded as the founder of confirmation theory by virtue of his mathematical treatment of the probability-relation between a generalization and its confirming instances. Broad did this in his early articles “On The Relation between Induction and Probability,”1918 and 1920.

18. The earlier account is in Scientific Thought, the later in the Second Volume of Examination of McTaggart’s Philosophy.

19. The essay is “Egoism as a Theory of Human Motives”. It is reprinted in Broad (1952b) as well as in the extremely valuable 1971 collection.

20. Broad was not, however, the first philosopher to formulate an analysis along these lines. Brentano had done so in 1889.

21. Kent Greenawalt links Broad to Hart and Rawls in Conflicts of Law and Morality (1987, p. 122). Cf. Rawls who explicitly refers to Broad’s (1916) paper in A Theory of Justice, p. 375n25.

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