Supplement to Tiantai Buddhism

Four Teachings

Let us explore these four positions, and their progression and synonymity, in a bit more detail.

1. Tripitaka Teaching

The Tripitaka teaching is associated with Hinayana, the teachings of the Nikaya and Agama scriptures, closely parallel to what is found in the Pali canon: the doctrine of impermanence of all conditioned dharmas, arising and perishing in every instant, along with the thoroughgoing denial of any sort of permanent or unconditional entity, with the exception of Nirvana itself. Reality is pure flux, arising and perishing a vast number of times within the span of each moment. This means suffering is the real-time coming together of factors to form temporary phenomena, and their real dissolution into their parts to vanish. It also means that samsara (deluded suffering experience as a whole) and Nirvana are mutually exclusive: samsara, suffering, conditionality really ends in real-time, and thereafter there is Nirvana, unconditionality. Suffering really arises (First Noble Truth), produced by a real set of causes which are really distinct from it (Second Noble Truth), and can really cease in Nirvana at some point in time (Third Noble Truth), through the cultivation of certain practices which cause this cessation, but which are themselves really distinct from their effect (Fourth Noble Truth). Both suffering, and its causes, and the cessation of suffering, and its causes, are matters of arising and perishing.

This teaching is seen, in Tiantai as in many Mahayana schools, as implying a fundamental contradiction that ensures it cannot be the ultimate teaching. That contradiction is the idea that the unconditioned, Nirvana, is something that can begin at a particular place or time, that the unconditioned is itself conditioned. This is precisely what is meant to be stressed by the Tiantai characterization of this teaching as “The Four Noble Truths as arising and perishing.” I will call this the Nirvana paradox. This problem is addressed with progressive thoroughness in the following teachings.

2. Shared Teaching

This is the general Mahayana teaching, “shared” in all school of Mahayana thought, and even implicit in the pre-Mahayana teachings. It is the teaching of Emptiness associated with many presentations of Madhyamaka thought and the Prajnaparamita literature. The Nirvana paradox is now addressed by asserting that all conditioned things are already empty, even before impermanence shows them dissolving into their component parts: they are empty in their very essence, they have no self-nature from the beginning. In other words, if seen correctly, all phenomena are already quiescent, have never arisen and do not need to further be extinguished in Nirvana to be extinct. They are in their own nature extinguished and Nirvanic. All that is required is to see this essence of essencelessness correctly. It is here that this teaching tends toward a doctrine of Two Truths, easily merging into a kind of appearance/reality split: in reality all things are unarising and unperishing, having no self-nature and no actual characteristics, but we mistakenly think we see entities and events as arising and perishing in real-time. The latter is in this teaching regarded as conventionally true, the former as ultimately true. Samsara, arising and perishing, a world of temporal separate objects each with its own specific conditional nature, is, if seen correctly, Nirvana itself: unarising, unperishing, producing nothing, in no need of perishing, without any entities, without any self-natures.

This appearance/reality split, however, merely pushes the problem to the next level: the unconditioned is no longer falsely thought to be something operative only sometimes and to some, which is impossible, but the cognition of this unconditioned is now thought to be conditioned. This is not a logical contradiction anymore, but it is still a religious and existential problem: for anything that is conditioned is suffering, and if the attainment of this cognition is conditioned, it is still suffering and not the end of suffering as promised. This “unhappy consciousness” means that the split between the conditioned and the unconditioned has been exacerbated, not alleviated, by this attempt to solve the paradoxical Tripitaka teaching of Nirvana as a unconditioned which is somehow also conditioned. The next teaching addresses this problem.

3. The Separate Teaching

The Separate Teaching (or “Special” Teaching). This is thought of first and foremost as a special teaching only for bodhisattvas. These are beings who have made a compassionate vow to liberate all beings by remaining in samsara for immeasurably vast eons, to be born again and again, in body after body, so as to interact with innumerable sentient beings, producing innumerable precisely tailored and maximally effective teachings, and bodily forms, in response to the individual vicissitudes of each of those encounters and each of those challenges. These bodhisattvas have understood that all things are empty; but they see that this is not merely the negation of, and therefore the transcendence of, all determinate forms, but also a negation of and transcendence of this negation and transcendence, insofar as the first negation is itself something determinate (namely, the definite exclusion of samsara, of all birth and death, of all arising and perishing). They also see that transcending and negating any specific form, liberation from any form, is done via the creation of a counterbalancing or neutralizing form: 2 is neutralized by −2, not by 0. This means the liberation from all determinate forms, the negation of all determinate forms, is done not through universal blankness or universal destruction, but by limitless creativity of forms, by the production in each case of the precisely countervailing form. Liberative negation of all things requires infinite creativity, and produces infinite forms. Transcending the transcendence (the emptiness of emptiness) does not lead them into some even more unthinkable hypertranscendence, but into a new mode of immanence. They do not straightaway embrace this non-arising and non-perishing once and for all as an exclusion of all arising and perishing, of all determinate existence. Rather they see that this emptiness also means infinite ambiguity, i.e., lack of determinate identity and provisionally posited identity at once. This emptiness is also a matrix of infinite productivity of provisionally posited redescriptions and re-presentations.

For these bodhisattvas have not made the mistake of clinging to “emptiness” as an objective truth about things, as if it were a (true) ontological view about reality. “All phenomena are empty of self-nature” cannot mean that, in reality and apart from the cognitive distortions added by sentient cognizers, they have some specific objective characteristic called “being empty of self-nature.” The characterization of them as “empty” is also no more than a part of certain sentient experiences. It happens to be one that is especially effective for removing attachments to other types of cognitions, i.e., all views that ascribe ontological reality of any kind to independently existing entities, or that think there is actually any entity that is born and dies, any substance that can arise and perish. But that means Emptiness too is a truth for exactly the same reason that any upayic claim might qualify as “conventionally true”: it serves pragmatically as a raft, as conducive to liberation from attachments, and therefore from suffering, although it is not a literally true description of any facts about the mind-independent world. “All things are empty” is not more or less true than “This cup is blue,” or for that matter, “all things are cheese,” and all are true and false for the same reason: they serve in some context as rafts that contribute to liberation by leading beyond themselves. The Emptiness of Emptiness means that Emptiness is a conventional truth, but also that any entity is no more literally “empty” than it is literally, say, “red” or “round” or “bitter” or “sweet.” All Emptiness amounts to is the non-finality of any characterization, including “Emptiness”—which means emptiness amounts to the positing always of alternate determinations and descriptions for any entity, the validity of more descriptions beyond any finite set that might have already been applied. This means that Conventional Truth is not a single set of appearances, but is constantly available for reshaping to meet new conventions and new needs, and that all of these are simply further manifestations of Emptiness, further rereadings of Emptiness itself.

This deepened sense of Emptiness as identical with the production of infinite provisional posits is called the Center. It is neither the definite Emptiness nor any definite set of determinations: it is the non-ultimacy of both of these extremes, and thus something beyond both extremes that at the same time posits both extremes. Both negation of definite characteristics (Emptiness) and affirmation of them (Provisional Positing) are alternate and opposite ways in which the same thing is presented.

To understand the meaning of “Center,” here, we might picture this as a coin with an engraving on one side and left blank on the other side. The engraving is the determinate forms of the world as conventionally understood (from all points of view). The blank side is a further alternate revelation of what all of that determinate reality is: the metal of the coin, here understood not to be any specific substance or characteristic, but literally the lack of all determinate characteristics. On the Shared Teaching model, the unengraved side thus reveals the reality, the “Ultimate Truth,” which is also what the unseen inside of the coin is made of and even what the determinate forms of the engraving are made of. But in the Separate Teaching, the unengraved side is also seen as a side, merely one of two sides, with the same status as the engraved side. Both are merely ways of appearing. Even the unengraved is something seen and cognized, and is in its own way determinate, precisely as the definite negation of all the determinations of the engraved side. What is concealed by and also appearing in these two opposite forms is what lies between them, the unseen metal of the coin between the two surfaces, which is itself neither the engraved appearance (conventional truths) nor the unengraved appearance (emptiness), but in another way is also immanent to both of them as what appears in either form. The Two Truths, the affirmation and the negation, can be said to be both two alternate presentations of the same content, identical in substance but opposed in form, just as the two sides of a coin are opposite and mutually exclusive presentations of the substance of the coin that is between the two sides. No matter which side we are looking at, we are looking at the coin itself: so even if we are looking at the heads side, what we are really seeing is the coin, and that means we are seeing that which is the inner reality of the tails side, which is also the coin (the Center). In this sense, “looking at the coin” is identical to “looking at the heads side” and identical to “looking at the tails side,” and through the mediation of this central term seen variously from different sides, we say that the sides are really identical to one another, meaning by that, however, only that both of them are really identical to the Central term. Thus it is called the Exclusive Center, not because it does not include both sides but because it includes them subordinately, as mere expressions of a deeper truth, i.e., the Center itself conceived as what the two extremes have in common and what produces both and also transcends both.

But we must break away from our static coin metaphor here, for we no longer have only one fixed engraving on the engraved side. Motivated by their infinitely compassionate vow to engage every specific form of delusion, the non-produced Emptiness of all things is now seen as infinitely productive. There are as many forms of arising of suffering and ending of suffering, of causes of both, as there are moments of sentient experience, as long as there are bodhisattvas compassionately willing and skillful enough to create upayas, skillful means, to engage them. So here we have the “unproduced producing,” the “infinite” productivity of sufferings and endings of sufferings, the “Center” which is neither the absence of any arising or perishing entities nor the real presence of any entities, but the infinite productive power to produce temporary non-empty forms, and also to keep them temporary and illusory, to return them to emptiness—the ultimate reality of this compassionate creative activity being thus neither emptiness nor non-emptiness, the Center. This Center is identified with the Buddha-nature described in the Mahaparinirvanasutra, the 14th chapter of which defines Buddha-nature precisely as “the Middle Way.”

However, this “separateness” pertains here on all levels under this form of “creativity” or “production”: still implying a real difference between the phases of not-yet-produced and produced, between the Empty aspect and the Non-empty aspect of the Center. This means also that these bodhisattvas understand the phases of bodhisattva practice as really separate from one another: phases of time are genuinely distinct. This applies also to the relation between a śravāka (Hināyāna practitioner) and a bodhisattva, and between a bodhisattva and a Buddha: these diverse phases of practice and the diverse phases of realization take place in separate moments, to separate practitioners and realizers. This again reproduces the gulf between the absolute and the relative, the unconditioned and the conditioned. More fundamentally, although both “all things are Empty” and “all things are Non-empty,” so that both “this is a cup” and “this is a frog” are now equally true, none of these is as really true as “both are true.” The Center is the collapsing of the two sides, revealing that they are immediately one, that either side in isolation is false. But this means that any deployment of either side in isolation is now viewed as somehow different from their deployment in non-isolation. This is the last level of “separateness” to overcome. This problem is finally resolved in the next step:

4. The Perfect Teaching

Recall that the Emptiness of Phase Two (the Shared Teaching) was presupposed and accepted in Phase Three (the Separate Teaching), but reinterpreted: Emptiness itself was now seen to be infinitely productive, albeit of merely conventional, upayic, liberatively fictional determinations.

Similarly, the infinite productivity of new determinations by Emptiness propounded in Phase Three (the Separate Teaching) is presupposed and accepted in Phase Four (the Perfect Teaching), but reinterpreted.

In the Perfect Teaching, Emptiness is infinitely productive, but everything it produces is now not merely a provisional and temporary fiction, but an eternal and omnipresent truth, both unobtainable and inescapable for all other beings. Each of the fictions of phase Three turns out, in phase Four, to be the eternal omnipresent truth that defines and determines all other things. Every fantasy is a revelation of a new eternal truth that has always already been the foundation of all other things since the infinite past and into the infinite future. We thus have infinite alternate versions, each of which serves as the infinite sole truth of the cosmos—infinite infinities, infinite universes, which are also all the same universe viewed in infinite alternate ways. Each of these alternate universes, in turn, is all the others as this one, reversibly intersubsumptive, so that in this precise sense they are neither one universe nor many universes.

How so? Recall that in the Separate Teaching, the bodhisattva had come to see all things as both Empty and Non-empty. The Emptiness allows him to produce infinite virtual or fictive determinations, for the purpose of overcoming attachment to both other fictive determinations and themselves, and leading to the realization of this Emptiness and its infinite Non-empty power to produce such phantasms and fictions. The fictional determinations are rooted in and lead to Emptiness, and they also “embody” Emptiness even while present. Fictive being and Emptiness are completely coextensive, collapsed into one: precisely the fictive being is the Emptiness, precisely the Emptiness is the fictive being, with neither side more true or ultimate than the other. What is true and ultimate is the Center as Neither-Empty-nor-Non-empty, functioning as infinite productivity precisely as Emptiness. It is neither one-sidedly unproductively Empty nor non-fictional substantial being, both of these extremes now being seen as deluded separations of the two indivisible aspects of the undivided Center. Having attained insight into this, the bodhisattva does this creation of infinite fictions deliberately, with clear self-knowledge, as a result of his or her vow, her definite will. This is a “separate” or “special” 別 power only of those who do deliberately take this vow and endeavor to save all beings in this way.

But now, in the Perfect Teaching, this infinite productivity is reinterpreted. The non-separability of any two entities, already discovered in the Emptiness concept of Phase Two, is now applied to the relation between all the phases and levels themselves—above all, to the relation between “the phase before making the vow and becoming a bodhisattva” and “the phase after doing so.” It is no longer something that has to be done deliberately, or something that is done only by certain beings. Following the lead of the Lotus Sutra, where it is shown in what sense one can be a bodhisattva although (or even because) one does not know it, bodhisattvahood is something that all beings are doing, always, everywhere, whether they try to or not, and whether they know it or not.

We have already seen in the Separate teaching that the Emptiness (ontological indeterminability) that produces, on the one hand, and the infinite determinations that are produced, on the other, are not really separate and not really different; they are merely two aspects of a deeper reality, their unity, the Center. But now we must also see that neither one in isolation is ever any different, in essence or in function, from the Center which is both. Now we do not collapse the two into one, but keep all three aspects distinct and ineradicable, indeed as ultimate, while also seeing how each one does what the Separate teaching thought only the Center did: immediately unify the other two:

1. The “being” side of infinite production is itself, just qua production, already the Center: all those infinite virtual or fictional determinations are always already discoverable just as much (i.e., just as little!) in the pre-production state as in the post-production state, and vice versa. For (as we’ve known since the Shared Teaching), if we search for a determinate difference between the prior pre-productive state and the posterior determinations, we find none. So “Provisional Positing,” the world as pure flux and conditional causal process, thought through, is already the Center.

2. Looking only at the “Emptiness” side, we note again the “emptiness of emptiness” not as hyperemptiness, but as the emptiness even of the exclusion of all marks, so that it is equally infinity of marks, of provisional positings (as we’ve known since the Separate Teaching)—emptiness by itself, thought through, is already the Center.

3. Conversely, the Center is never not also some provisional posit and its emptiness. It never appears simply as such, in isolation, simpliciter. Moreover, “Center,” insofar as it says anything at all and is therefore determinate, is a provisional posit. And “Center,” like all determinate posits, is therefore itself empty.

This is the interfusion of the Three Truths (yuanrong sandi 圓融三諦), such that each truth by itself is the Center, each by itself is a provisional posit, each by itself is empty. We now have before us a way of being, in the Tiantai phrase, “the Center precisely as the peripheralness of the periphery” (jibianerzhong即邊而中).

Considering the relation between “Provisional Posits,” i.e., those infinite fictional or virtual presences produced by and identical to formlessness and attributelessness, we now see that the positing of any determinacy per se is a Centering of all, and also an Emptying of all. Each determinacy is found everywhere, and that each does its Centering of all other determinacies in its own distinct way. Each determinacy is a negation of all other things, and thereby also of itself, and each in its own distinctive way. Buddhahood is always already in bodhisattvahood, and bodhisattvahood is never expunged in Buddhahood; they are inherently entailed in each other. Similarly, the causes of suffering and the suffering they produce; similarly, the causes of the end of suffering and the end of suffering itself; similarly, suffering and the end of suffering—in each case, when one realtime effect, or infinite effects, are produced from causes which are distinct from themselves, we now find they are not “separate” at all, but “integrated,” discoverable on both sides of any dividing boundary. Greed, anger and delusion are always discoverable in Buddhahood; Buddhahood is always discoverable in greed, anger and delusion. All things are produced from any one thing—but nothing is produced, because all those things are always discoverable also already within it, in the same way. Suffering is Buddhahood, delusion is enlightenment, but also vice versa. The work to be done is now not to determine whether or not each thing is the center of the universe, but in precisely what way precisely this thing centers the universe, how being this precise being manifests in all other entities.

Our coin metaphor must be further rethought here. In the Shared Teaching (Phase Two), the blank side of the coin showed the real nature of the coin, while the engraved side mere appearance. In the Special Teaching (Phase Three), both the blank and the engraved sides were mere appearances, both manifesting and concealing the Center between them, which was understood simply to be something with the ability to be seen equally as engraved or unengraved, which both connected and separated them, their inseparability being the ultimate truth behind either side even when expressed one way or the other. This meant that the engraved is not necessarily engraved in only one way. In its identity with the unengraved, it is always a site for more and different engraving, hence for infinite productivity.

In the Perfect Teaching (Phase Four), all this remains the same as in Phase Three, except for one thing: the Center is no longer privileged. We do not collapse the two sides into the Center. The unseen Center which is neither engraved nor unengraved is no longer the “real essence” of the coin. Nor is the totality of the three the real essence of the coin: i.e., it is not a summation of the three, a whole including these three separate and distinct parts, a thing with one engraved side, one unengraved side and in addition the neither-engraved-nor-unengraved metal between them which enables both, both dividing them and holding them inseparably together. Rather, the whole true essence of the whole is found in any of the three aspects, and any of the aspects is the whole true essence. Now everything we said about the Center can also be said about the engraved side, and also about the unengraved side. The engraved side is what both unifies and divides the Center and the unengraved side. The unengraved side is what both unifies and divides the Center and the engraved side. Moreover, it is not only the blank side that negates the other two: the Center also negates the other two, and the engraved side also negates the other two. Moreover, it is not only the engraved side that establishes itself as determinate and differentiated: the Center is also established as determinate and differentiated, the blank side is also established as determinate and differentiated. This means that to understand the coin completely, it is enough to understand the engraved side completely—for “to be engraved” means to also have an unengraved side which is a coequal expression of a neither-engraved-nor-unengraved Center that unites, separates, and expresses itself as the two sides. Equally, it is enough to understand the unengraved side completely—for to be unengraved means to also have an engraved side which is a coequal expression of a neither-engraved-nor-unengraved Center that unites, separates, and expresses itself as the two sides. And equally, it is enough to understand the neutral Center between a two-sided structure of engraved and unengraved sides, both uniting and separating them, for that means to be both engraved and unengraved, neither engraved nor unengraved. So we can say the real unchanging omnipresent essence of the coin is simply “to be engraved”—which is the ultimately reality which is also expressed indirectly in being unengraved and being neither neither-engraved-nor-unengraved. We can also say that the real unchanging omnipresent essence of the coin is simply “to be unengraved”-- which is the ultimately reality which is also expressed indirectly in being unengraved and being neither neither-engraved-nor-unengraved. Put another way, whenever we are seeing any engraving we are also seeing the unengraved, and also the identity-as-contrast between the engraved and unengraved. The engraved is no longer the “other side” of the unengraved, they are no longer merely “two sides of the same coin” such that only one appearance or manifestation or function can be seen at a time. Even as aspects or expressions, they are no longer mutually exclusive; instead they are all three mutually inclusive and mutually identical.

This has large consequences for our understanding not only of what it means “to be engraved” as a general condition, but of the specificity of any engraving as such, of any particular form and characteristic that might appear in experience. In the Special Teaching, we could look at a figure on the engraved side—of a bird, let’s say—and understand that what is here present to us as bird-engraving is also present as metal, the identity of which is equally expressed by what we see on the other side as unengraved blank. We can even look at the bird and deploy a shift of attention to experience a change of aspect, as when we look at a wave as water and then shift to seeing the water as wave. The bird is entirely the metal, the metal is entirely the bird. The Shared Teaching sees the wave as reducible to water; it is really water, only superficially wave (really metal, only superficially bird). The Separate Teaching sees it reversibly as water and as wave, as metal and bird, with neither more ultimate or real than the other. What is more ultimate and real than either, though, is the “both-and/neither-nor” itself, the one hyperblank that can be experienced in two different ways, as blank and nonblank, but never both at the same time. But the Perfect Teaching takes the Separate Teaching point about the unengraved blankness of the blank side more seriously than the Separate Teaching itself does: it is no longer understood as merely blank in the sense that would exclude all engraving: it is now understood as itself one more determinate form, rather than the absence of all form; blankness too is “an engraving” of sorts, a way of shaping the metal, a way of expressing the Center. This means two different engravings are copresent in and as each engraving: the bird (which is an engraving) and the non-bird (the non-engraving, which is also no more than a certain way of engraving). Each determination, precisely insofar as it is a determination, already alternate determinations. For since one of these engravings (the non-bird, the blankness) is also “engravability in alternate ways” as such, and indeed not just “alternate engravability,” but “alternate engravedness, being at the same time otherwise engraved,” “being bird” and “being any other engraving” have converged in the very engraving of the bird. Put another way, the fact that both are themselves really nothing but the Center means that “to be blankness” already means also “to be engraved on its other side.” But not only on its other side: now we see even blankness as a kind of engraving, and given that blankness now means “also being a kind of engraving,” i.e., to be both determined-as-blank and determined-as-nonblank, to be Center, we thus also see engraving as a kind of “blankness” (now understood in this new way, as synonymous with Center). We can thus now see both blank and unblank, bird and non-bird, at once, and to really see what blank is is to be seeing all engravings (as the other side of this blank, its alternate engravedness).

So when we look at the metal composing the bird figure, we do not see it as a blank, as in a matter/form relation in a hylomorphism, but rather as a copresent alternate form, and see this “blank” metal form as itself inseparable from all other forms, all the forms on its engraved flipside. “Metal” here must not be thought of as essentially the uncarved; the characteristic of metal is to be both engraved and unengraved at the same time—to be double-sided. So when I see the “metal” of the “bird,” I should be seeing the doubleness of the bird as well as the blank unengravedness of the other side. To do that, I don’t need to flip mentally between aspects: I just need an enhanced understanding of what a “bird” is, of what any determinate shape is. To see any determinate item, any engraved item (any definite entity), is now to see it as an engraving (=as dependently co-arisen), which is to see it also as what is revealed in the unengraved side, i.e., that the substance of the coin is as much the infinitely-engravable-unengraved (=empty) as it is whatever is engraved on the other side, and the engraving is engraving of just this. And this is now also to see this “also” itself, the identity between the two (the Center). To see one side is now also to see the other side, and to see either is to see the middle between them which is both and neither, but now no longer seeing the two extremes as reducible to the Center but not vice versa, but seeing each of them as mutually reducible to the other two. I look at feather on the bird and I see feather, blankness, and the copresence of feather and blankness, but I see them now as one experience, as all identical to each other, as three synonyms for the same referent. Thus blankness is not merely blankness but all-alternate-engravednesses: I see at once feather, claw, eye, beak, blankness, copresence of all of the above, separation of all of the above. Its definiteness is its engravedness, and engravedness is itself now seen as none other than the infinitely-alternately-engraved-unengraved itself, for to see engravedness is a way of seeing a side of the coin, and seeing a side of the coin is a way of seeing the coin itself, the center manifested in its two alternate ways, which are also its infinite alternate ways. Since the engraved side is now, as established in the Special Teaching, an infinity of alternate engravings, this also means that all possible creative actions are uncreated and unconditional, salvific, Nirvanic, Buddhific, all-pervasive, eternal, effortless in and as their very finitude, suffering, transience, and struggle.

Practically speaking, this means that one need no longer find a special form of activity which is the perfect coinciding of emptiness and infinite creativity, as in the Separate Teaching. It means that one is always already doing so, no matter what one does. This includes even not discovering the Three Truths and not cultivating meditation in any way—for those times when one is not doing so are always pervaded by other times when you, or someone else, is. In the Separate Teaching, full realization of the Center, doing all deeds in the mode of deep Samadhi and wisdom such that one was completely emptiness and completely active at once, allowed one to see that it was always both infinitely creative of new forms and always formless, always committed to new activities and always quiescent. Now in the Perfect Teaching, the full realization of any activity, or any inactivity, any being or any negation of being, is enough: to fully realize it, to be fully submerged in it to its bottomless bottom, is to reveal that is always both the Center and the other extreme. Hence, as Zhiyi says, paraphrasing the protagonist of the chapter 20 of the Lotus Sutra: “You don’t have to change your present path or get out of your present wheel-rut: what you are practicing now is the bodhisattva way.”

The Shared Teached had already refuted the idea that anything really begins or perishes (wusheng 無生). The Separate Teaching then added a sense of subjective agency of bodhisattvas—and by extension the activity of all sentient beings, which serve as necessary conditions for this agency of bodhisattvas—who provide the appearances of beginnings and endings of finite determinate beings, who “make of” this indeterminate reality one thing or another, who see it in infinite various ways, who produce fictions either wittingly (as with bodhisattvas) or unwittingly (as with everyone else). This sense of beginnings and endings within the subjectivity of sentient beings, as a result of their deliberate agency, is the sense that is denied in Zhiyi’s use of the term “unmade” 無作 for the Perfect Teaching. It is a denial not of beginning and ending, long already established, but a denial of the second order subjective appearance of beginnings and endings as nonnegotiable, once-and-for-all “facts.” Not only is the reality beneath all our fictions and illusions an indeterminate Emptiness that never arises or perishes; our fictions and illusions themselves, in their infinite arisings and perishings, never arise or perish. The nature of this subjectivity is such that there are no facts of the matter about its states: it is its own rewriting and reinterpretation all prior and future facts at every moment. The upshot of this for Zhiyi is that not only do no things arise or perish, but no illusions about things arising or perishing arise or perish either, not because these illusions are not there, but because they are always and irrevocably there: each of those illusions is eternal and omnipresent, interpenetrating with all alternate illusions.

What is important here for Zhiyi is specifically a denial of agency and intentional action. The term wuzuo 無作implies “unbegun” in the sense of not undertaking or beginning to commit a particular deed, not deliberately made or begun. What is “unmade” or “undone” in this sense is explained to be effortless and unintentional. This is “effortless” in the same sense that a thing with what (pre-Buddhistically) is imagined to be a green “essence” requires no extra effort to express or “do” greenness, or a person with an angry “nature” expresses anger when he is making no special effort: they are just being and expressing what they “are.” Of course ideas like “what they are,” and “their essence,” have been systematically demolished in pre-Tiantai Buddhism, for all finite essences. Now they are reinstated in a radical new sense: all things really do behave like an “essence” was believed to behave—effortlessly and uninterruptibly being what it is and doing what it does ineradicably and unconditionally. But now these are understood neither as separate individual essences nor as one undifferentiated essence shared by all things. Rather, precisely qua essence, they are intersubsumptive of one another—for “essence” here means literally unchangeable, not just in a finite range of existence, but omnipresently and omnitemporally. That is, every determinate characteristic is an essence—and hence unconditional, unchangeable--which inheres in its antecedents and consequences, but also inheres in all other determinate individual nature: all individual essences pre-exist in the preconditions of any event, and remain unchanged in all consequences. All Three Thousands inhere in every moment of experience

And it is in this way that precisely as impermanent, all these things are permanent—permanent and impermanent now are seen to be strict synonyms. For all impermanent entities are found to be pervading all other impermanent entities, pervading all times and places, eternal and omnipresent—but precisely insofar as they have no self-nature of their own, and are always also interpretable as identical to any other entity, even as their own putative exclusion. Thus there is no longer need for deliberate intention to accomplish the compassionate deeds of the bodhisattva or a Buddha: whatever he finds himself doing, he finds has always been an ineradicable part of his own nature, which is just acting as it must act, expressing itself without having to add any deliberate augmentation in this form. Hence we speak here of “the unmade”—meaning that even though all things are constantly and eternally creating new karmic results, each new creation is thereby found to be unmade, uncreated, eternal, all-pervasive, unconditional, and thus salvific.

Copyright © 2022 by
Brook Ziporyn <>

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