Supplement to Causal Models

Supplement 1. Briggs’ Axiomatization

Briggs’ (2012) axiomatization of structural counterfactuals includes two inference rules and eleven axiom schemas.


  • Greek letters \(\phi\) , \(\psi\), and \(\theta\) stand for arbitrary propositions
  • Italicized Roman letters A, B and C stand for Boolean propositions
  • Boldface Roman letters \(\bA\), \(\bB\), and \(\bC\) stand for conjunctions of atomic propositions in which no two conjuncts mention the same variable
  • Italicized letter V, with or without a subscript, stands for a variable; and italicized lowercase v, with or without a subscript, stands for the value of a variable
  • \(\bot\) is a propositional constant representing a proposition that is always false

Inference Rules:

  1. If \(\vdash \phi\) and \(\vdash \phi \supset \psi\), then \(\vdash \psi\)
  2. If \(\vdash(\psi_1 \amp \ldots \psi_n) \supset \theta\), then \[\vdash((\phi \boxright \psi_1) \amp \ldots(\phi\boxright \psi_n)) \supset(\phi\boxright \theta)\]


  1. All classical tautologies
  2. \(V_i = v_1 \vee \ldots V_i = v_n\), where \(\{v_1 , \ldots ,v_n\}\) is the range of \(V_i\)
  3. \({\sim}(V_i = v \amp V_i = v')\), if \(v \ne v'\)
  4. \((\bA \boxright \phi) \lor (\bA \boxright {\sim}\phi)\)
  5. \({\sim}(\bA \boxright \bot)\)
  6. \(((\bA \amp V = v) \boxright B) \supset(\bA \boxright (V = v \supset B))\), if none of \(\bA\)’s conjuncts mentions \(V\)
  7. \(A\boxright A\)
  8. \(c_1 \amp\ldots c_{n-1} \supset{\sim}c_n\), where each \(c_i\) is a conjunction of the form \[\begin{aligned} & ((\bA_i \amp V_i = v_i) \boxright V_{i+1} = v_{i+1})\\ & \qquad \amp\,((\bA_i \amp V_i = v_i ') \boxright V_{i+1} \ne v_{i+1}), \end{aligned} \] none of \(\bA_i\)’s conjuncts mentions \(V_i\), and \(V_{n+1} = V_1\).
  9. \(((A \vee B) \boxright \phi) \equiv((A \boxright \phi) \amp(B \boxright \phi) \amp((A \amp B)\boxright \phi)\)
  10. \((A\boxright \phi) \equiv (A' \boxright \phi)\) if \(A\) and \(A'\) are exact equivalents
  11. \(((\bA \amp \bB \amp \bC)\boxright D) \equiv((\bA \amp \bB') \boxright ((\bB \amp \bC) \boxright D))\) if \(\bA\), \(\bB\), and \(\bC\) do not mention any of the same variables, and \(\bB\) and \(\bB'\) mention all of the same variables.

Axioms 1–8 are largely drawn from Halpern (2000). Axioms 2 and 3 guarantee that each variable takes exactly one value in its range. Axioms 4 and 5 are restricted versions of the principles of Conditional Excluded Middle and Conditional Non-Contradiction (respectively). They apply only when the antecedent is a conjunction of atomic propositions. Axiom 6 tells us that if we set \(V\) to a value it would have without the intervention, then this will have no effect on the truth value of propositions that do not include “\(\boxright\)”. Axiom 8 guarantees that the relation of counterfactual dependence among different variables is acyclic. This axiom will not hold in SEMs with cycles. Axiom 9 tells us that counterfactuals with disjunctive antecedents are equivalent to conjunctions of counterfactuals with simpler antecedents. Axiom 10 says that exact equivalents (rather than logical equivalents) can be substituted in the antecedent of a counterfactual without changing the truth value of the proposition. Axiom 11 tells us that certain “right-nested” counterfactuals are equivalent to simpler counterfactuals.

Briggs (2012) proves that this system is sound and complete for the semantics of counterfactuals generated by the treatment of interventions in acyclic SEMs.

Copyright © 2018 by
Christopher Hitchcock <>

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