Supplement to Causation and Manipulability

Additional Recent Criticisms of the Interventionist Account

This supplement discusses some recent criticisms of the interventionist account due to Woodward 2003 with its reliance on M1–M4 by Reutlinger 2012 and Glynn 2013. One of Reutlinger’s main arguments is that Woodward’s version of interventionism is unnecessary for causal interpretation. According to Reutlinger, whatever interventionism accomplishes in elucidating causal claims can be accomplished just as well or better by adopting a setting conception of intervention (or at least something very like it) and understanding this in terms of the insertion of Lewisian miracles. For example, we might understand “\(X\) causes \(Y\)” in terms of whether, when \(X\) is set to various values via a miracle, the value of \(Y\) changes. No further restrictions are imposed on whether it is “possible” to intervene on \(X\) , thus dispensing with issues regarding how the relevant notion of possibility is to be understood. Whether a change in \(Y\) follows under different settings of the value of \(X\) is similarly understood in terms of whether such changes can be derived or calculated from the changes in \(X\).

One question raised by this suggestion is whether, as Reutlinger seems to claim, the resulting account recovers all of the judgments (or at least all of the defensible judgments) to which the account in Woodward 2003 in terms of M1–M4 leads. We have seen reasons to doubt this—for example, Woodward’s account leads to different judgments in connection with unmanipulable causes of the sort described in §12 and as well as in connection with the physical examples described in §11. Again, whether this is a virtue or a limitation of Reutlinger’s proposal depends on one’s views about the correctness of these causal claims.

Glynn’s proposal is in some respects similar. He wishes to retain the causal modeling/structural equations apparatus for the purposes of capturing notions like actual causation but regards (what he takes to be) the “circularity” of the interventionist account of that apparatus as undesirable. He argues that circularity can be avoided by instead combining the causal modeling apparatus with a

semantics along the lines of that given by David Lewis, on which counterfactuals are to be evaluated with respect to worlds in which their antecedents are realized by miracles. … pace Woodward, causal modeling analyses perform just as well when combined with the Lewisian semantics as when combined with the interventionist semantics. (Glynn 2013: 43)

For reasons described above, it can be argued that this underestimates the differences between the interventionist semantics (at least in versions like M1–M4) for counterfactuals and causal claims and Lewis’, both in terms of the particular judgments they reach and the more general formal constraints they impose. The “circularity” (or non-reductive character) of the interventionist treatment (in contrast to the reductive aspirations of the Lewisian framework) seems to contribute essentially to these differences. For example, it is unclear how to characterize the full causal route structure on which the causal modeling apparatus relies in purely Lewisian terms, or where to insert the appropriate “miracles” without interventionist (or other sorts of causal) information. Other distinctive features of intervention-based counterfactuals discussed above make it seem doubtful that accounts of causation and causal modeling in terms of such counterfactuals can be easily translated with relatively small changes (e.g., by replacing talk of interventions with appropriately inserted Lewis-style miracles) into a Lewisian framework.

Copyright © 2016 by
James Woodward <>

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