Supplement to Causation and Manipulability

An Early Version of an Agency Theory

This supplement discusses the influential early version of an agency theory of causation developed by von Wright (1971). He describes the basic idea as follows:

to think of a relation between events as causal is to think of it under the aspect of (possible) action. It is therefore true, but at the same time a little misleading to say that if \(p\) is a (sufficient) cause of \(q\), then if I could produce \(p\) I could bring about \(q\). For that p is the cause of \(q\), I have endeavored to say here, means that I could bring about \(q\), if I could do (so that) \(p\). (1971: 74)

To the objection that “doing” or “producing” is already a causal notion and hence not something to which we can legitimately appeal to elucidate the notion of causation, von Wright responds as follows:

The connection between an action and its result is intrinsic, logical and not causal (extrinsic). If the result does not materialize, the action simply has not been performed. The result is an essential “part” of the action. It is a bad mistake to think of the act(ion) itself as a cause of its result. (1971: 67–8)

Here we see an attempt to rebut the charge that an account of causation based on agency is circular by contending that the relation between an action (or a human manipulation) and its result is not an ordinary causal relation. Moreover, von Wright readily embraces the further conclusion that seems to follow from this: human action must be a concept which, in our understanding of the world, is just as “basic” as the notion of causality (1971: 74).

Given the logical structure of von Wright’s views, it is also not surprising to find him struggling to make sense of the idea that there can be causal relations involving events that human beings cannot in fact manipulate. He writes:

The eruption of Vesuvius was the cause of the destruction of Pompeii. Man can through his action destroy cities, but he cannot, we think, make volcanoes erupt. Does this not prove that the cause-factor is not distinguished from the effect-factor by being in a certain sense capable of manipulation? The answer is negative. The eruption of a volcano and the destruction of a city are two very complex events. Within each of them a number of events or phases and causal connections between them may be distinguished. For example, that when a stone from high above hits a man on his head, it kills him. Or that the roof of a house will collapse under a given load. Or that a man cannot stand heat above a certain temperature. All these are causal connections with which we are familiar from experience and which are such that the cause-factor typically satisfies the requirement of manipulability. (1971: 70)

von Wright’s view is that to understand a causal claim involving a cause that human beings cannot in fact manipulate (e.g., the eruption of a volcano) we must interpret it in terms of claims about causes that human beings can manipulate (impacts of falling stones on human heads and so on). This general idea is also discussed in connection with the views of Menzies and Price in §2 but it is worth noting an obvious problem that arises for von Wright’s treatment. If we try to explain what it means to say that different galaxies attract one another gravitationally by contending that such interactions are in some relevant respects similar to gravitational interactions with which we are familiar or have experience (people and projectiles falling to earth), we need to explain what “similar” means and it is very hard to see how to do this within the framework of an agency theory. The relevant notion of similarity does not seem to be a notion that can be spelled out in terms of similarities in people’s experiences of agency. Either we explain the relevant notion of similarity in straightforwardly causal terms that seem to have nothing to do with agency (e.g., we say that the similarity consists in the fact that the same gravitational force law is operative in both cases), in which case we have effectively abandoned the agency theory, or else we are led to the conclusion that causal claims involving unmanipulable causes like galaxies involve a conception of causality which is fundamentally different from the conception that is applicable to manipulable causes.

Copyright © 2023 by
James Woodward <>

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