Notes to Causation and Manipulability

1. As Pearl readily acknowledges, his work draws on a long tradition in econometrics of interpreting equations that express causal claims as claims about the outcomes of hypothetical experiments—see, e.g., Haavelmo 1944.

2. A simple illustration is the use of the Dirac delta function to describe a point impulse communicated to a physical system. This “function” presumably does not describe any real physical possibility but it is mathematically well-behaved when described by the theory of distributions and one can use it to formulate sensible counterfactual claims about what would happen to a system if such an impulsive force were applied—indeed this is a common practice in physics.

3. More accurately, the interventionist account of type causation diverges from what seems to be the natural way of extending Lewis’ theory to such causes. Consider a simple example discussed in Woodward, 2003. \(C\) is a deterministic direct (type) cause of \(E\) but also deterministically causes \(E\) indirectly by means of \(n\) causal routes that go through \(C_1 ,\ldots ,C_n\). Consider the counterfactual

  • (a) “If \(C_1 ,\ldots ,C_n\) had not occurred, \(E\) would not have occurred”.

As explained above, any counterfactual theory will need to employ such counterfactuals to capture the notion of direct cause or causation along a route. On the interventionist account of the relationship between causal claims and counterfactuals, (a) is false, since under the assumption of the antecedent of (a), \(C\) will still occur and will cause \(E\). Intuitively, this the correct assessment of (a). Under Lewis’ theory, we have a choice between two different possible worlds that realize the antecedent of (a). In the first \(C\) occurs and each of the \(n\) links between \(C\) and \(C_1 ,\ldots ,C_n\) are broken. This requires \(n\) distinct miracles. In the second world, \(C\) fails to occur and hence \(C_1 ,\ldots ,C_n\) also fail to occur. This second world has less perfect match with the actual world than the first world, but involves only one miracle. At least for large \(n\), Lewis’ similarity ordering tells us that this second world is closer to the actual world. Thus (a) comes out true.

4. I owe to Chris Hitchcock the observation that this may be too generous to advocates of the setting conception. Of course if we write the equation \(E\) linking the behavior \(B\) of the tides to the gravitational force \(M\) exerted by the moon in such a way that the \(M\) is the independent variable and \(B\) the dependent variable and then calculate how \(B\) would change under various settings of \(M\), it looks as though we can capture the causal claim (G). But what entitles us to think that this is the “correct” way to write \(E\)? After all we could equally well have written the governing equation in such a way that \(B\) is one of the independent variables (among others), and \(M\) the dependent variable. We could then calculate how \(M\) would be different under different “settings” of values for \(B\). But it would not be correct to conclude from this that \(B\) causes \(M\). If we impose a possibility constraint on interventions, we can use it to conclude that the ordering in which \(M\) is the independent variable and \(B\) the dependent variable is the causally correct representation of the situation and that the reverse ordering is causally incorrect—this follows from the fact that there are possible interventions on \(M\) that will change \(B\), but any possible intervention on \(B\) will not change \(M\). (This asymmetry is in a sense built into conditions like (M1)–(M4).) By contrast it is not clear how to get this conclusion out of pure setting conception of interventions that is not possibility constrained, at least if “setting” just involves imagining the value of some variable to be different and calculating what follows from this.

5. Again, though, Hitchcock’s observation applies. If “intervention” is just a matter of mathematically plugging in values and calculating what follows from this, we could just as easily run the calculation backwards to determine how the universe would have been different at some earlier time \(t-d\). Presumably this would not show that \(S_t\) “causes” \(S_{t-d}\). So again the setting conception does not seem to capture all that is involved in causal relationships.

6. Yet another possible position would be to hold that causal claims play a central role in fundamental physics but that for the reasons described above, interventionist accounts fail to capture this role. However interventionist accounts are successful at elucidating causal claims in the special sciences. On this view, causal claims in fundamental physics would need to be given some other, non-interventionist elucidation.

7. The most promising current attempt to characterize laws of nature in non-modal or non-counterfactual terms is the Mill-Ramsey-Lewis theory (Lewis 1973). For criticisms see Woodward 2003, 2014 and Maudlin 2007. It is also worth emphasizing that even if it is not possible to provide reductivist truth conditions for (5), it might still be argued that an account in terms of underlying laws and mechanisms provides a better treatment of the content of causal claims like “\(G\) causes recovery from disease \(D\)” then an account that appeals to interventionist counterfactuals like (5). This raises general issues about the adequacy of law-based and mechanism based account of causation that are beyond the scope of this entry.

Copyright © 2023 by
James Woodward <>

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