Supplement to Causation and Manipulability

The Role of the Manipulability Theory in Clarifying Causal Claims

A further example due to Holland (1986) illustrates how an appeal to a manipulability theory of causation can be used to argue that the following claim is fundamentally unclear.

  • (F) Being female causes one to be discriminated against in hiring and/or salary

In contrast to the previous cases discussed in §12, the problem here is not so much that under all interpretations of the putative cause (“being female”) we lack any clear idea of what it would be like to manipulate it, but rather that there are several rather different things that might be meant by manipulation of “being female” (which from the perspective of a manipulability theory is to say that there several quite different variables we might have in mind when we talk about being female as a cause ) and the consequences for discrimination of manipulating each of these may be quite different. For example, (F) might be interpreted as claiming that a literal manipulation of gender, as in a sex change operation, that leaves an applicant’s qualifications otherwise unchanged, will change expected salary or probability of hiring. Alternatively, and more plausibly, (F) might be interpreted as claiming that manipulation of a potential employer’s beliefs about applicant’s gender will change salary and hiring probability, in which case (F) would be more perspicuously expressed as the claim that employer beliefs about gender cause discrimination. Still another possible interpretation—in fact what Holland claims one ought to mean by (F)—is that differentials in salary and hiring between men and women would disappear (or at least be reduced substantially) under a regime in which various sorts of biased practices were effectively eliminated, presumably as the result of changes in law and custom. While I see no reason to follow Holland in thinking that this is the only legitimate interpretation of (F), it is plainly a legitimate interpretation. Moreover, Holland is also correct to think that this last hypothetical experiment which involves manipulating the legal and cultural framework in which discrimination takes place is a quite different experiment from an experiment involving manipulating gender itself or employee beliefs about gender and that each of these experiments is likely to lead to different outcomes. From the perspective of Holland’s version of a manipulability theory, these different experiments thus correspond to different causal claims. As this example illustrates, part of the heuristic usefulness of an interventionist theory with a possibility constraint is that it encourages us to clarify or disambiguate causal claims by explicitly distinguishing among different possible claims about the outcomes of hypothetical experiments that might be associated with them. That we can clarify the meaning of a causal claim in this way is just what we would expect on a properly formulated version of an interventionist account.

Copyright © 2023 by
James Woodward <>

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