Notes to Ceteris Paribus Laws

1. Cf. M. Tullii Ciceronis de Officiis Ad Marcum Filium Libri Tres, lib.I, cap.15: “Sed in collocando beneficio, & in referenda gratia, si caetera paria sint, hoc maximè opis indigeat, ita ei potissimùm opitulari: quod contra fit à plerisque; à quo enim plurimum sperant, etiamsi ille his non eget, tamen ei potissimùm inserviunt.”

2. De contractibus (1295) q.8, d.5; cf. Kaufer (1997).

3. Juan de Medina: ‘Si dicas, quod verus campsor aliam causam habet, scilicet quia tenet in diversis locis famulos &factores, seu ministros, idque non sine expensis propriis, ut scilicet multorum indigentiis, in multis locis provideat. Respondetur, quod hoc nihil obstet; quia pono ego similiter campsorem improprie sumptum, in diversis locis tenere ministros, it ut caetera sint paria’. (1581, tom. II, p. 307 (first edition 1544), our emphasis)

4. Luis de Molina: ‘Altero modo potest pecunia aliqua maiorem valorem in uno loco, quam in alio, quia in uno est minor copia illius, quam alio, caeteris enim paribus, quo maior est pecuniae copia in aliquo loco, eo minus in eo valet ad res emendas, & ad comparanda caetera, quae pecunia non sunt.’ (1659, tract. 2, disp. 406, n.2 (first edition 1593)), tract. 2, disp. 406, n.2, our emphasis)

5. Persky (1990), Kaufer (1997), and Whitaker (2008) for helpful surveys on the use of the cp-phrase in the English economic literature.

6. Cf. Mill (1871, book IV, chapter 2, section 2, p.702); Hausman (1992, 133, fn 11).

7. Cf. also Mill (1836/2008, 49f.); Mill (1843, 444f.); Hollander (1985, 117–125).

8. “Economic laws describe inevitable implications. If the data they postulate are given, then the consequences they predict necessarily follow. In this sense they are on the same footing as other scientific laws, and as little capable of suspension. If, in a given situation, the facts are of a certain order, we are warranted in deducing with complete certainty that other facts which it enables us to describe are also present. […] If the ‘given situation’ conforms to a certain pattern, certain other features must also be present, for their presence must also be deducible from the pattern originally postulated.” (Robbins 1935/2008, 2nd edition: 86)

Robbins imposes a constraint on the “situation” in which a law is supposed to hold by using a ceteris paribus qualification:

“Of course, if other things do not remain unchanged, the consequent predicted does not necessarily follow. This elementary platitude, necessarily implicit in any scientific prediction, needs especially to be kept in the foreground of attention when discussing this kind of prognosis. The statesman who said ‘Ceteris paribus be damned!’ has a large and enthusiastic following among the critics of economics! Nobody in his senses would hold that the laws of mechanics were invalidated if an experiment designed to illustrate them were interrupted by an earthquake. Yet a substantial majority of the lay public, and a good many soi-disant economists as well, are continually criticizing well-established propositions on grounds hardly less slender.” (Robbins 1935/2008: 88)

9. Hempel also developed a “hidden structure” approach to laws in the special sciences (cf. Hempel 1942, 1948, 1952, 1961/2). Cf. also Scriven (1959) and Gardiner (1959) objecting to Hempel.

10. More precisely, Woodward defines an intervention (via intervention variables) as follows. According to Woodward (2003: 98), a variable \(I\) is an intervention variable for \(X\) (relative to \(Y)\) iff

  1. \(I\) is a cause of \(X\).
  2. \(X\) depends only on (certain values of) \(I\) and \(X\) depends on no other variables, i.e. \(I\) is the only cause of \(X\).
  3. \(I\) is an indirect cause of \(Y\) via a causal path leading through \(X\) and a – possibly empty – set of intermediate variable \(Z_1 , \ldots ,Z_n\).
  4. \(I\) is probabilistically independent of other causes \(W_1 , \ldots ,W_n\) of \(Y\), which are not on a causal path leading from \(X\) to \(Y\) .

The notion of an intervention variable is, in turn, used to define the notion of an intervention:

Any value \(i_i\) of an intervention variable \(I\) (for \(X\) relative to \(Y)\) is an intervention on \(X\) relative to \(Y\) iff it is the case that the value of \(X\) counterfactually depends on the fact that \(I\) has the value \(i_i\) (cf. Woodward 2003: 98).

11. Schrenk (2007, 166) advocates a semantic completer account that is formulated in terms of a Lewisian best system theory; see Reutlinger (2009) for a critical comment.

12. Notice that to distinguish two “strategies” and to call them “strategies” is our way to reconstruct Lange’s approach – Lange does not refer to these ideas in this terminology. According to Lange, these “strategies” are for the most part implicit in scientific practice.

13. Notice that Lange writes mistakenly “exponentially” instead of “polynomially”.

14. Lange discusses further examples of counterfactual suppositions that fail to be consistent with the intended interest and application of island biogeography. However, both of these examples involve interfering factors which occur very rarely, and so are also instantiations of strategy (A), while we tried to give an example which solely instantiates strategy (B). In his first example it is counterfactually assumed that the earth lacks a magnetic field.. Although the laws of physics appear to be preserved for this counterfactual supposition, it seems that this is not the case for the area law in island biogeography. Does this result indicate that the laws of island biogeography (and, analogously, the laws of other special sciences) are not stable – and, thus, they are no laws at all? Lange offers a pragmatic answer to this question in favor of the stability of special science laws:

“The area law is not prevented from qualifying as an island-biogeographical law – from belonging to a set that is stable for the purposes of island biogeography – by its failure to be preserved under the […] counterfactual suppositions […]. The supposition concerning Earth’s magnetic field falls outside of island biogeography’s range of interest. It twiddles with a parameter that island biogeography takes no notice of, or at least does not take it as a variable.” (Lange 2002, 418)

The counterfactual supposition above refers to a parameter or variable that lies ‘offstage’, as Lange (2000, 232) formulates the issue.

15. Cf. Woodward (2003, 248); EG1 (2, 7f.), Mackie (1980, 35f.) for a distinction between causes and a causal field of background conditions.

16. “Suppose that we are interested in determining the extent to which the amount of water \((X_1)\) and fertilizer \((X_2)\) received by an individual plant influences its height \(Y\). To this purpose we write down a linear regression equation \(Y = a_1\times X_1 + a_2\times X_2 + U\). Here \(a_1\) and \(a_2\) are fixed coefficients and \(U\) is a so-called error term, which we may take to represent the other causal influences on \(Y\) besides \(X_1\) and \(X_2\). Even if the generalization conveys information about the causal relationships between \(X_1,\) \(X_2\) and \(Y\), it falls short of the standards normally demanded of laws. To begin with, [the generalization] is bound to fail for sufficiently large or extreme values of \(X_1\) and \(X_2\). One can’t make a plant grow arbitrarily high by dumping large amounts of water and fertilizer on it, nor make it arbitrarily small by giving it only minuscule amounts. Even if we confine our attention to values of \(X_1\) and \(X_2\) within a more ordinary range, [the generalization] may fail to hold for certain ways of achieving those values; it will fail for instance, if \(X_1\) has a relatively high value as a result of dumping a large amount of water on the plant at the end of \(a\) of an otherwise dry growing season. In addition, there are many background conditions, not represented in [the generalization], which if changed would disrupt [the generalization]. [It] would fail if we were to spray the plant with weed killer or heat it to a very high temperature.” (EG1, 4f.)

Copyright © 2019 by
Alexander Reutlinger
Gerhard Schurz <>
Andreas Hüttemann <>
Siegfried Jaag <>

Open access to the SEP is made possible by a world-wide funding initiative.
The Encyclopedia Now Needs Your Support
Please Read How You Can Help Keep the Encyclopedia Free