#### Supplement to Chance versus Randomness

## D. Chance and Initial Conditions

Toward the end of §5.2, we canvassed the possibility that the initial conditions obtained by chance, and noted that the chances involved seem like very strange creatures indeed. Not being dynamic or process based chances, we were at a loss to understand what they might be.

However, some thoughts about what they could be are found in some
recent work of Albert and of Loewer. Albert’s particular concern
is with explaining thermodynamic asymmetries—that entropy, or
disorder, increases towards the future but not the past—while the
laws of classical mechanics underlying thermodynamics are time-reversal
invariant. Given the standard Lebesgue measure over all possible
states, the world is therefore just as likely to end up in a
entropy-decreasing world as an entropy-increasing one. But it is a
truth about our world that entropy increases; if it cannot be explained
by the laws of classical mechanics alone, then classical mechanics will
be incomplete as a description of our world, and must needs be
supplemented by a further postulate. His preferred additional claim is
the *past hypothesis*, that ‘the world first came into
being in whatever low-entropy highly condensed big-bang sort of
macrocondition it is that the normal inferential procedures of
cosmology will eventually present to us’ (Albert 2000: 96). In
conjunction with Newton’s laws, the past hypothesis constrains
the probability distribution over initial conditions to be one that
assigns high probability to low-entropy states, and low probability to
other states. This package of assumptions provides a strong and concise
description of worlds much like ours. A more accurate description might
be provided by a perfect specification of the *actual* initial
condition, but that would be much more complex than the past
hypothesis. So the package of Newton’s laws plus the assumption
that the right measure over initial conditions is one that is uniform
over those possible perfectly precise states compatible with the past
hypothesis is the best trade off between simplicity and strength as
a description of our world, which is a world in which thermodynamics is
a powerful explanatory physical theory. As Loewer (2007:
§1) argues (see also his 2001), the past hypothesis and the
probabilistic postulate about initial conditions consistent with it
therefore deserve to be called laws, as they are part of the a Lewisian
*best system* that describes our world (see Lewis 1994 and also
Supplement
A.3).
Finally, then, they
maintain that objective probabilities given by laws of nature deserve
to be called chances—so in worlds where thermodynamics is (almost
always) correct, there are chances over initial conditions.

If all this works, we have a rationale, at least sometimes, for
taking there to be chances of initial conditions. But, firstly, there
is room for quite a lot of scepticism about whether it works—see
for example the entry on thermodynamic asymmetry in time
Callender (2009),
as well as Schaffer (2007: §6). And
more importantly, if this is the model of explanation, (RCT) is not
going to look very plausible. The past hypothesis package is introduced
in just those cases where the simple assumption of the uniform measure
over all possible initial conditions does not explain the observed
facts. It introduces an additional probabilistic claim as a fundamental
law, which is what allows it to generate genuine chances. But this
probabilistic claim is that the chance of a non-random initial
condition—one that is highly orderly—is very high! The
outcomes that happen by chance in this theory would yield exactly the
kinds of orderly thermodynamic asymmetry we in fact see, and not random
sequences at all. To generate random sequences by initial condition
chances would involve elevating the ordinary Lebesgue measure to the
status of fundamental law. But—and this is the key
point—there seems to be no need to take the uniform measure to be
a law. The past hypothesis explains something surprising about the
regularities we observe; by contrast, a world with random sequences of
outcomes is exactly what we should expect *a priori* if all we
knew was which states were possible states. Almost all of them give
rise to random sequences, so a world in which such a sequence occurs
seems not to need special explanation—we are happy rest content
with the initial conditions as a brute fact.