Notes to Legalism in Chinese Philosophy

1. The “Legalist” label was at times attached to Xunzi 荀子 (ca. 310-230 BCE), who was an avowed Confucian, but also a putative teacher of two major Legalist thinkers, Han Fei and Li Si. A series of the so-called “Yellow Emperor” (Huang Di 黃帝) texts, discovered in 1973 in Tomb 3, Mawangdui 馬王堆, Changsha (Hunan), and which date from the late Warring States period were also identified by some as “Legalist.” Yet notably neither the Xunzi nor the Huang Di texts share the Legalists’ peculiar anti-ministerial and anti-intellectuals’ stance, hence their identification as “Legalist” texts is misleading.

2. This famous political slogan remained significant throughout traditional and modern China’s history. Notably, its earliest occurrence is attested precisely in the Book of Lord Shang and in Han Feizi

3. Han Fei is commonly considered a disciple of the Confucian thinker, Xunzi; and his thought is at times to compared to that of his putative teacher. However, as convincingly argued by Sato (2013) there is no clear proof of relationships between the two thinkers.

Copyright © 2014 by
Yuri Pines <pinesy@mscc.huji.ac.il>

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