Notes to Metaphysics in Chinese Philosophy

1. For discussions of this issue, see Burik 2018; Zheng 2017; Perkins 2016a; Li and Perkins, 2015b; Weber 2013; Tan 2012; Banka 2011; JeeLoo Liu 2011; Wen 2011; Yu 2011; Yu and Xu 2009; Zhao 2006; Hansen 2001; Cheng 1990.

2. Translations are my own unless otherwise noted.

3. Most accounts of the philosophy of the Warring States Period include some discussion of metaphysics. For sources in which that interest is particularly central, see Ziporyn 2013; Ames 2011; Lai 2008; JeeLoo Liu 2006; Graham 1989.

4. Other texts that have been recently discovered include the “Great One Generates Water” (Taiyi sheng shui 太一生水), “Constancy First” (Heng xian 恆先), and “Things Flow into Form” (Fanwu liuxing 凡物流行). For an overview of this “cosmogonic turn,” see Wang 2015 and Perkins 2016b. For broader discussions of early Daoism with a focus on metaphysics, see Chai 2019; Coutinho 2013; Michael 2005; Ames and Hall 2003; and the essays collected in Liu Xiaogan 2015.

5. For the translation of taiji as “Supreme Polarity,” see Adler 1999.

6. The Lüshi chunqiu is cited by book/section and page number in Chen Qiyou 1984. The book and section numbers correspond to those in the English translation by Knoblock and Reigel 2000.

7. For a thorough discussion of the various uses of qi, taking into account recently excavated texts, see Csikszentmihalyi 2004: 144–60. For philosophical attempts to explain a coherent philosophy of qi, see Behuniak 2004: 1–21; Kim 2015; JeeLoo Liu 2015.

8. For helpful studies related to correlative cosmology, see Jia 2016; Brindley 2012; Wang 2012; Major 1993; Graham 1986; LeBlanc 1985; Henderson 1984. See also the discussion of harmony in Li 2013 and the examination of the relationship between naming and reality in Makeham 1994.

9. For studies of Xuanxue philosophy, see Ziporyn 2014: 137–184; Chai 2010; Ziporyn 2003; Wagner 2003; Chan 1999; and the essays in Liu Xiaogan 2015.

10. For discussions of Chinese Buddhist metaphysics, see Ziporyn 2016; Ziporyn 2000; JeeLoo Liu 2006; Swanson 1989; Odin 1982; Cook 1977.

11. For discussions of Neo-Confucian thought with a significant discussion of metaphysics, see Angle and Tiwald 2017; JeeLoo Liu 2017; Angle 2012; Angle 2009; Graham 1992; and the essays collected in Makeham (ed.) 2008.

12. The most thorough study of li is Ziporyn 2014. Ziporyn argues for understanding li as coherence. For other views, see Angle 2009: 31–50; Ivanhoe 2010; Peterson 1986; Chan 1964.

13. The works of twentieth century Chinese philosophers are still largely unavailable in English, but for a translation of one of the more significant metaphysical texts, see Xiong 2015. For studies with particular attention to metaphysical issues, see Makeham (ed.) 2014 (on the revival of Yogacara); Billioud 2012 (on Mou Zongsan); Zinda 2012 (on Jin Yuelin); Chen 2011 (on Feng Youlan). A good starting point for twentieth century Chinese philosophy is Cheng and Bunnin (eds.) 2002. For a more recent example of Chinese metaphysical thinking, see Yang 2011.

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Franklin Perkins <>

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