Notes to Metaphysics in Chinese Philosophy

1. Translations are my own unless otherwise noted.

2. Most accounts of the philosophy of the Warring States Period include some discussion of metaphysics. For sources in which that interest is particularly central, see Ziporyn 2013; Ames 2011; Lai 2008; Michael 2005; Graham 1989.

3. Other texts that have been recently discovered include the “Great One Generates Water” (Taiyi sheng shui 太一生水), “Constancy First” (Heng xian 恆先), and “Things Flow into Form” (Fanwu liuxing 凡物流行).

4. For the translation of taiji as “Supreme Polarity,” see Adler 1999.

5. The Lüshi chunqiu is cited by book/section and page number in Chen Qiyou 1984. The book and section numbers correspond to those in the English translation by Knoblock and Reigel 2000.

6. For a thorough discussion of the various uses of qi, taking into account recently excavated texts, see Csikszentmihalyi 2004: 144–60. For philosophical attempts to explain a coherent philosophy of qi, see Behuniak 2004: 1–21, and Liu forthcoming.

7. For helpful studies related to correlative cosmology, see Brindley 2012; Wang 2012; Major 1993; Graham 1986; Henderson 1984. See also the discussion of harmony in Li 2013 and the examination of the relationship between naming and reality in Makeham 1994.

8. Any study of Neo-Confucian thought will include at least some discussion of metaphysics, but Graham 1992 is particularly thorough. The explanation of key terms in Angle 2009: 31–74, is exceptionally clear and helpful. See also the essays collected in Makeham (ed.) 2010.

9. The most thorough study of li is Ziporyn 2014. Ziporyn argues for understanding li as coherence. For other views, see Angle 2009: 31–50; Ivanhoe 2010; Peterson 1986; Chan 1964.

10. On the creation of philosophy as a discipline, see Makeham (ed.) 2012.

11. Many of these works are only recently becoming accessible in English. For a translation of one of the most significant of these works, see Xiong (forthcoming). For studies with particular concern for metaphysical issues, see Makeham (ed.) 2014 (on the revival of Yogacara); Billioud 2012 (on Mou Zongsan); Zinda 2012 (on Jin Yuelin); Chen 2011 (on Feng Youlan). A good starting point for twentieth century Chinese philosophy is Cheng and Bunnin (eds.) 2002. For a more recent example of Chinese metaphysical thinking, see Yang 2008 and 2011.

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Franklin Perkins <>

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